Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Singular Propositions

Evans on Frege

Gareth Evans (Evans 1981; 1982, chapter 1) and John McDowell (McDowell 1984; 2005) argue that Frege's considered view is that singular terms without reference lack sense. He points to a perplexing passage from Frege's unpublished ‘Logic’ (Frege 1897/1979), where he speaks of “mock thoughts.” Evans takes Frege to be claiming that all sentences with empty singular terms express “mock thoughts” which are not thoughts at all. However, it is clear, even in these passages that provide the strongest case for Evans's interpretation, that Frege assigns senses to empty singular terms. Frege writes:

Thus if the sense of an assertoric sentence is not true, it is either false or fictitious, and it will generally be the latter if it contains a mock proper name. [Attached footnote] We have an exception where a mock proper name occurs within a clause in indirect speech. (Frege 1897, 130)

“Mock thoughts” are claimed to be false, but only complete thoughts have truth value. Furthermore, the attached footnote seems to claim that some sentences with “mock proper names” (i.e., an empty singular term) are true, when the name is governed by an attitudinal verb. For example, consider the sentence ‘Joey believes that William Tell shot an apple off his son's head’. Frege seems to be saying that such a sentence may well be true. But this is puzzling indeed if, as Evans claims, Frege thinks that ‘William Tell’ lacks a sense, as in that case the embedded sentence ‘William Tell shot an apple off his son's head’ would not express a thought for Joey to believe. Furthermore, Frege goes on to clearly say that empty names can have a sense. He writes in the very passage Evans discusses: “Although the tale of William Tell is a legend and not history and the name ‘William Tell’ is a mock proper name, we cannot deny it a sense” (130).