# Proof-Theoretic Semantics

*First published Wed Dec 5, 2012*

Proof-theoretic semantics is an alternative to truth-condition
semantics. It is based on the fundamental assumption that the central
notion in terms of which meanings are assigned to certain expressions
of our language, in particular to logical constants, is that of
*proof* rather than *truth*. In this sense
proof-theoretic semantics is *semantics in terms of proof* .
Proof-theoretic semantics also means the *semantics of proofs*,
i.e., the semantics of entities which describe how we arrive at certain
assertions given certain assumptions. Both aspects of proof-theoretic
semantics can be intertwined, i.e. the semantics of proofs is itself
often given in terms of proofs.

Proof-theoretic semantics has several roots, the most specific one
being Gentzen's remarks that the introduction rules in his
calculus of natural deduction define the meanings of logical constants,
while the elimination rules can be obtained as a consequence of this
definition (see section
2.2.1).
More
broadly, it belongs to what Prawitz called *general proof
theory* (see section
1.1).
Even more
broadly, it is part of the tradition according to which the meaning of
a term should be explained by reference to the way it is *used*
in our language.

Within philosophy, proof-theoretic semantics has mostly figured under the heading “theory of meaning”. This terminology follows Dummett, who claimed that the theory of meaning is the basis of theoretical philosophy, a view which he attributed to Frege. The term “proof-theoretic semantics” was proposed by Schroeder-Heister (1991; used already in 1987 lectures in Stockholm) in order not to leave the term “semantics” to denotationalism alone—after all, “semantics” is the standard term for investigations dealing with the meaning of linguistic expressions. Furthermore, unlike “theory of meaning”, the term “proof-theoretic semantics” covers philosophical and technical aspects likewise. In 1999, the first conference with this title took place in Tübingen.

- 1. Background
- 2. Some versions of proof-theoretic semantics
- 3. Extensions and alternatives to standard proof-theoretic semantics
- 4. Conclusion and outlook
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Background

### 1.1 General proof theory: consequence vs. proofs

The term “general proof theory” was coined by Prawitz. In general proof theory, “proofs are studied in their own right in the hope of understanding their nature”, in contradistinction to Hilbert-style “reductive proof theory”, which is the “attempt to analyze the proofs of mathematical theories with the intention of reducing them to some more elementary part of mathematics such as finitistic or constructive mathematics” (Prawitz, 1972, p. 123). In a similar way, Kreisel (1971) asks for a re-orientation of proof theory. He wants to explain “recent work in proof theory from a neglected point of view. Proofs and their representations by formal derivations are treated as principal objects of study, not as mere tools for analyzing the consequence relation.” (Kreisel, 1971, p. 109) Whereas Kreisel focuses on the dichotomy between a theory of proofs and a theory of provability, Prawitz concentrates on the different goals proof theory may pursue. However, both stress the necessity of studying proofs as fundamental entities by means of which we acquire demonstrative (especially mathematical) knowledge. This means in particular that proofs are epistemic entities which should not be conflated with formal proofs or derivations. They are rather what derivations denote when they are considered to be representations of arguments. (However, in the following we often use “proof” synonymously with “derivation”, leaving it to the reader to determine whether formal proofs or proofs as epistemic entities are meant.) In discussing Prawitz's (1971) survey, Kreisel (1971, p. 111) explicitly speaks of a “mapping” between derivations and mental acts and considers it as a task of proof theory to elucidate this mapping, including the investigation of the identity of proofs, a topic that Prawitz and Martin-Löf had put on the agenda.

This means that in general proof theory we are not solely interested
in whether *B* follows from *A*, but in the way by means
of which we arrive at *B* starting from *A*. In this
sense general proof theory is intensional and epistemological in
character, whereas model theory, which is interested in the consequence
relation and not in the way of establishing it, is extensional and
metaphysical.

### 1.2 Inferentialism, intuitionism, anti-realism

Proof-theoretic semantics is inherently inferential, as it is
inferential activity which manifests itself in proofs. It thus belongs
to *inferentialism* (see Brandom, 2000) according to which
inferences and the rules of inference establish the meaning of
expressions, in contradistinction to *denotationalism*,
according to which denotations are the primary sort of meaning.
Inferentialism and the ‘meaning-as-use’ view of semantics
is the broad philosophical framework of proof-theoretic semantics. This
general philosophical and semantical perspective merged with
constructive views which originated in the philosophy of mathematics,
especially in mathematical intuitionism. Most forms of proof-theoretic
semantics are intuitionistic in spirit, which means in particular that
principles of classical logic such as the law of excluded middle or the
double negation law are rejected or at least considered problematic.
This is partly due to the fact that the main tool of proof-theoretic
semantics, the calculus of natural deduction, is biased towards
intuitionistic logic, in the sense that the straightforward formulation
of its elimination rules is the intuitionistic one. There classical
logic is only available by means of some rule of indirect proof, which,
at least to some extent, destroys the symmetry of the reasoning
principles (see section
3.5).
If one adopts
the standpoint of natural deduction, then intuitionistic logic is a
natural logical system. Also the BHK (Brouwer-Heyting-Kolmogorov)
interpretation of the logical signs plays a significant role. This
interpretation is not a unique approach to semantics, but comprises
various ideas which are often more informally than formally described.
Of particular importance is its functional view of implication,
according to which a proof of *A* → *B* is a
constructive function which, when applied to a proof of *A*
yields a proof of *B*. This functional perspective underlies
many conceptions of proof-theoretic semantics, in particular those of
Lorenzen, Prawitz and Martin Löf (see sections
2.1.1,
2.2.2,
2.2.3).

According to Dummett, the logical position of intuitionism corresponds to the philosophical position of anti-realism. The realist view of a recognition independent reality is the metaphysical counterpart of the view that all sentences are either true or false independent of our means of recognizing it. Following Dummett, major parts of proof-theoretic semantics are associated with anti-realism.

### 1.3 Gentzen-style proof theory: Reduction, normalization, cut elimination

Gentzen's calculus of natural deduction and its rendering by Prawitz is the background to most approaches to proof-theoretic semantics. Natural deduction is based on at least three major ideas:

*Discharge of assumptions*: Assumptions can be “discharged” or “eliminated” in the course of a derivation, so the central notion of natural deduction is that of a derivation*depending on assumptions*.*Separation*: Each primitive rule schema contains only a single logical constant.*Introductions and eliminations*: The rules for logical constants come in pairs. The introduction rule(s) allow(s) one to infer a formula with the constant in question as its main operator, the elimination rule(s) permit(s) to draw consequences from such a formula.

In Gentzen's natural deduction system for first-order logic derivations are written in tree form and based on the well-known rules. For example, implication has the following introduction and elimination rules

[ A]B→I A→B

A→BA→E B

where the brackets indicate the possibility to discharge occurrences
of the assumption *A*. The *open assumptions* of a
derivation are those assumptions on which the end-formula depends. A
derivation is called *closed*, if it has no open assumption,
otherwise it is called *open*. If we deal with quantifiers, we
have to consider open individual variables (sometimes called
“parameters”), too. Metalogical features crucial for
proof-theoretic semantics and for the first time systematically
investigated and published by Prawitz (1965) include:

*Reduction*: For every detour consisting of an introduction
immediately followed by an elimination there is a reduction step
removing this detour.

*Normalization*: By successive applications of reductions,
derivations can be transformed into normal forms which contain no
detours.

For implication the standard reduction step removing detours is the following:

[ A]⋮ B| A→BABreduces to

| A

⋮B

A simple, but very important corollary of normalization is the
following: *Every closed derivation in intuitionistic logic can be
reduced to a derivation using an introduction rule in the last
step.* We also say that intuitionistic natural deduction satisfies
the “*introduction form property*”. In
proof-theoretic semantics this result figures prominently under the
heading “fundamental assumption” (Dummett, 1991,
p. 254). The “fundamental assumption” is a typical
example of a philosophical re-interpretation of a technical
proof-theoretic result.

*Further Reading:*

*For the general orientation of proof-theoretic semantics*
the special issue of *Synthese* (Kahle and Schroeder-Heister,
2006), Schroeder-Heister (2008b), and Wansing (2000).

*For the philosophical position and development of proof
theory* the entries on
Hilbert's program
and the
development of proof theory
as well as Prawitz (1971).

*For intuitionism* the entries on
intuitionistic logic,
intuitionism in the philosophy of mathematics
and the
development of intuitionistic logic.

*For anti-realism* the entry on
challenges to metaphysical realism
as well as Tennant (1987); Tennant (1997), Tranchini (2011b);
Tranchini (2012a).

*For Gentzen-style proof-theory and the theory of natural
deduction*: besides Gentzen's (1934/35) original presentation and
Prawitz's (1965) classic monograph, Tennant (1978), Troelstra and
Schwichtenberg (2000), and Negri and von Plato (2001).

## 2. Some versions of proof-theoretic semantics

### 2.1 The semantics of implications: Admissibility, derivability, rules

The semantics of implication lies at the heart of proof-theoretic
semantics. In contradistinction to classical truth-condition semantics,
implication is a logical constant in its own right. It has also the
characteristic feature that it is tied to the concept of consequence.
It can be viewed as expressing consequence at the sentential level due
to modus ponens and to what in Hilbert-style systems is called the
deduction theorem, i.e. the equivalence of Γ*,A* ⊢
*B* and Γ ⊢ *A* → *B*.

A very natural understanding of an implication *A* →
*B* is reading it as expressing the inference rule which allows
one to pass over from *A* to *B*. Licensing the step from
*A* to *B* on the basis of *A* → *B*
is exactly, what modus ponens says. And the deduction theorem can be
viewed as the means of establishing a rule: Having shown that
*B* can be deduced from *A* justifies the rule that from
*A* we may pass over to *B*. A rule-based semantics of
implication along such lines underlies several conceptions of
proof-theoretic semantics, notably those by Lorenzen, von Kutschera and
Schroeder-Heister.

#### 2.1.1 Operative logic

Lorenzen, in his *Introduction to Operative Logics and
Mathematics* (1955) starts with logic-free (atomic) calculi, which
correspond to production systems or grammars. He calls a rule
*admissible* in such a system if it can be added to it without
enlarging the set of its derivable atoms. The implication arrow →
is interpreted as expressing admissibility. An implication *A*
→ *B* is considered to be valid, if, when read as a rule,
it is admissible (with respect to the underlying calculus). For
iterated implications (= rules) Lorenzen develops a theory of
admissibility statements of higher levels. Certain statements such as
*A* →*A* or ((*A* →*B*)*,*
(*B* →*C*)) → (*A* →*C*)
hold independently of the underlying calculus. They are called
*universally admissible*
[“allgemeinzulässig”]), and constitute a system of
positive implicational logic. In a related way, laws for universal
quantification ∀ are justified using admissibility
statements for rules with schematic variables.

For the justification of the laws for the logical constants ∧,
∨, ∃ and ⊥, Lorenzen uses an *inversion
principle* (a term he coined). In a very simplified form, without
taking variables in rules into account, the inversion principle says
that everything that can be obtained from every defining condition of
*A* can be obtained from *A* itself. For example, in the
case of *disjunction*, let *A* and *B* each be a
defining condition of *A*∨*B* as expressed by the
primitive rules *A* → *A*∨*B* and
*B* → *A*∨*B*. Then the inversion
principle says that *A*∨*B* →*C* is
admissible assuming *A* →*C* and *B*
→*C*, which justifies the elimination rule for disjunction.
The remaining connectives are dealt with in a similar way. In the case
of ⊥, the absurdity rule ⊥→ *A* is obtained from
the fact that there is no defining condition for ⊥.

#### 2.1.2 Gentzen semantics

In what he calls “Gentzen semantics”, von Kutschera
(1968) gives, as Lorenzen, a semantics of logically complex
implication-like statements
*A*_{1}*,…,**A*_{n}
→ *B* with respect to calculi *K* which govern the
reasoning with atomic sentences. The fundamental difference to Lorenzen
is the fact that
*A*_{1}*,**…**,A*_{n}
→ *B* now expresses a *derivability* rather than an
*admissibility* statement.

In order to turn this into a semantics of the logical constants of
propositional logic, von Kutschera argues as follows: When giving up
bivalence, we can no longer use classical truth-value assignments to
atomic formulas. Instead we can use calculi which prove or refute
atomic sentences. Moreover, since calculi not only generate proofs or
refutations but arbitrary derivability relations, the idea is to start
directly with derivability in an atomic system and extend it with rules
that characterize the logical connectives. For that von Kutschera gives
a sequent calculus with rules for the introduction of *n*-ary
propositional connectives in the succedent and antecedent, yielding a
sequent system for generalized propositional connectives. Von Kutschera
then goes on to show that the generalized connectives so defined can
all be expressed by the standard connectives of intuitionistic logic
(conjunction, disjunction, implication, absurdity).

#### 2.1.3 Natural deduction with higher-level rules

Within a programme of developing a general schema for rules for
arbitrary logical constants, Schroeder-Heister (1984) proposed that a
logically complex formula should express the content or *common
content* of *systems of rules*. This means that not the
introduction rules are considered basic but the consequences of
defining conditions. A rule *R* is either a formula *A*
or has the form
*R*_{1}*,**…**,R*_{n}
⇒ *A*, where
*R*_{1}*,**…**,R*_{n}
are themselves rules. These so-called “higher-level rules”
generalize the idea that rules may discharge assumptions to the case
where these assumptions can themselves be rules. For the standard
logical constants this means that *A*∧*B* expresses
the content of the pair (*A,B*); *A* → *B*
expresses the content of the rule *A* ⇒ *B*;
*A*∨*B* expresses the common content of *A* and
*B*; and absurdity ⊥ expresses the common content of the
empty family of rule systems. In the case of arbitrary *n*-ary
propositional connectives this leads to a natural deduction system with
generalized introduction and elimination rules. These general
connectives are shown to be definable in terms of the standard ones,
establishing the expressive completeness of the standard intuitionistic
connectives.

*Further Reading:*

For Lorenzen's approach in relation to Prawitz-style proof-theoretic semantics: Schroeder-Heister (2008a). For extensions of expressive completeness in the style of von Kutschera: Wansing (1993a).

### 2.2 The Semantics of derivations as based on introduction rules

#### 2.2.1 Inversion principles and harmony

In his *Investigations into Natural Deduction*, Gentzen makes
some, nowadays very frequently quoted, programmatic remarks on the
semantic relationship between introduction and elimination inferences
in natural deduction.

The introductions represent, as it were, the ‘definitions’ of the symbols concerned, and the eliminations are no more, in the final analysis, than the consequences of these definitions. This fact may be expressed as follows: In eliminating a symbol, we may use the formula with whose terminal symbol we are dealing only ‘in the sense afforded it by the introduction of that symbol’. (Gentzen, 1934/35, p. 80)

This cannot mean, of course, that the elimination rules are
*deducible* from the introduction rules in the literal sense of
the word; in fact, they are not. It can only mean that they can be
*justified* by them in some way.

By making these ideas more precise it should be possible to display the E-inferences as unique functions of their corresponding I-inferences, on the basis of certain requirements. (ibid., p. 81)

So the idea underlying Gentzen's programme is that we have “definitions” in the form of introduction rules and some sort of semantic reasoning which, by using “certain requirements”, validate the elimination rules.

By adopting Lorenzen's term and adapting its underlying idea to the context of natural deduction, Prawitz (1965) formulated an “inversion principle” to make Gentzen's remarks more precise:

Letαbe an application of an elimination rule that hasBas consequence. Then, deductions that satisfy the sufficient condition […] for deriving the major premiss ofα, when combined with deductions of the minor premisses ofα(if any), already “contain” a deduction ofB; the deduction ofBis thus obtainable directly from the given deductions without the addition ofα. (p. 33)

Here the sufficient conditions are given by the premisses of the corresponding introduction rules. Thus the inversion principle says that a derivation of the conclusion of an elimination rule can be obtained without an application of the elimination rule if its major premiss has been derived using an introduction rule in the last step, which means that a combination

⋮ I-inference A{D _{i}}

E-inferenceB

of steps, where {D_{i}} stands for a
(possibly empty) list of deductions of minor premisses, can be
avoided.

The relationship between introduction and elimination rules is often
described as “harmony”, or as governed by a
“principle of harmony” (see, e.g. Tennant, 1978,
p. 74). This terminology is not uniform and sometimes not even
fully clear. It essentially expresses what is also meant by
“inversion”. Even if “harmony” is a term which
suggests a symmetric relationship, it is frequently understood as
expressing a conception based on introduction rules as, e.g., in
Read's (2010) “general elimination harmony” (although
occasionally one includes elimination based conceptions as well).
Sometimes harmony is supposed to mean that connectives are strongest or
weakest in a certain sense given their introduction or their
elimination rules. This idea underlies Tennant's (1978) harmony
principle, and also Popper's and Koslow's structural
characterizations (see section
2.4).
The
specific relationship between introduction and elimination rules as
formulated in an inversion principle excludes alleged inferential
definitions such as that of the connective *tonk*, which
combines an introduction rule for disjunction with an elimination rule
for conjunction, and which has given rise to a still ongoing debate on
the format of inferential definitions (see Humberstone, 2010).

#### 2.2.2 Proof-theoretic validity

Proof-theoretic validity is the dominating approach to
proof-theoretic semantics. As a technical concept it was developed by
Prawitz (1971; 1973; 1974), by turning a proof-theoretic validity
notion based on ideas by Tait (1967) and originally used to prove
strong normalization, into a semantical concept. Dummett provided much
philosophical underpinning to this notion (see Dummett, 1991). The
objects which are primarily valid are proofs as representations of
arguments. In a secondary sense, single rules can be valid if they lead
from valid proofs to valid proofs. In this sense, validity is a global
rather than a local notion. It applies to arbitrary derivations over a
given atomic system, which defines derivability for atoms. Calling a
proof which uses an introduction rule in the last step
*canonical*, it is based on the following three ideas:

- The priority of closed canonical proofs.
- The reduction of closed non-canonical proofs to canonical ones.
- The substitutional view of open proofs.

*Ad 1:* The definition of validity is based on
Gentzen's idea that introduction rules are
‘self-justifying’ and give the logical constants their
meaning. This self-justifying feature is only used for closed proofs,
which are considered primary over open ones.

*Ad 2:* Noncanonical proofs are justified by reducing them to
canonical ones. Thus reduction procedures (detour reductions) as used
in normalization proofs play a crucial role. As they justify arguments,
they are also called “justifications” by Prawitz. This
definition again only applies to closed proofs, corresponding to the
introduction form property of closed normal derivations in natural
deduction (see section
1.3).

*Ad 3:* Open proofs are justified by considering their closed
instances. These closed instances are obtained by replacing their open
assumptions with closed proofs of them, and their open variables with
closed terms. For example, a proof of *B* from *A* is
considered valid, if every closed proof, which is obtained by replacing
the open assumption *A* with a closed proof of *A*, is
valid. In this way, open assumptions are considered to be placeholders
for closed proofs, for which reason we may speak of a substitutional
interpretation of open proofs.

This yields the following definition of proof-theoretic validity:

- Every closed proof in the underlying atomic system is valid.
- A closed canonical proof is considered valid, if its immediate subproofs are valid.
- A closed noncanonical proof is considered valid, if it reduces to a valid closed canonical proof or to a closed proof in the atomic system.
- An open proof is considered valid, if every closed proof obtained by replacing its open assumptions with closed proofs and its open variables with closed terms is valid.

Formally, this definition has to be relativized to the atomic system
considered, and to the set of justifications (proof reductions)
considered. Furthermore, *proofs* are here understood as
*candidates* of valid proofs, which means that the rules from
which they are composed are not fixed. They look like proof trees, but
their individual steps can have an arbitrary (finite) number of
premisses and can eliminate arbitrary assumptions. The definition of
validity singles out those proof structures which are
‘real’ proofs on the basis of the given reduction
procedures.

Validity with respect to every choice of an atomic system can be
viewed as a generalized notion of logical validity. In fact, if we
consider the standard reductions of intuitionistic logic, then all
derivations in intuitionistic logic are valid independent of the atomic
system considered. This is semantical *correctness*. We may ask
if the converse holds, viz. whether, given that a derivation is valid
for every atomic system, there is a corresponding derivation in
intuitionistic logic. That intuitionistic logic is complete in this
sense is known as Prawitz's conjecture (see Prawitz, 1973;
Prawitz, 2013). However, no satisfactory proof of it has been given.
There are considerable doubts concerning the validity of this
conjecture for systems that go beyond implicational logic. In any case
it will depend on the precise formulation of the notion of validity, in
particular on its handling of atomic systems.

For a more formal definition and detailed examples demonstrating validity, as well as some remarks on Prawitz's conjecture see the

Supplement on Examples of proof-theoretic validity.

#### 2.2.3 Constructive type theory

Martin-Löf's type theory (Martin-Löf, 1984) is a leading approach in constructive logic and mathematics. Philosophically, it shares with Prawitz the three fundamental assumptions of standard proof-theoretic semantics, mentioned in section 2.2.2: the priority of closed canonical proofs, the reduction of closed non-canonical proofs to canonical ones and the substitutional view of open proofs. However, Martin-Löf's type theory has at least two characteristic features which go beyond other approaches in proof-theoretic semantics:

- The consideration of proof objects and the corresponding distinction between proofs-as-objects and proofs-as-demonstrations.
- The view of formation rules as intrinsic to the proof system rather than as external rules.

The first idea goes back to the Curry-Howard correspondence (see de
Groote, 1995; Sørensen and Urzyczyn, 2006), according to which
the fact that a formula *A* has a certain proof can be codified
as the fact that a certain term *t* is of type *A*,
whereby the formula *A* is identified with the type *A*.
This can be formalized in a calculus for type assignment, whose
statements are of the form *t* : *A*. A proof of
*t* : *A* in this system can be read as showing that
*t* is a proof of *A*. Martin-Löf (1995; 1998) has
put this into a philosophical perspective by distinguishing this
two-fold sense of proof in the following way. First we have proofs of
statements of the form *t* : *A*. These statements are
called *judgements*, their proofs are called
*demonstrations*. *Within* such judgements the term
*t* represents a *proof* of the *proposition*
*A*. A proof in the latter sense is also called a *proof
object*. When demonstrating a judgement *t* : *A*, we
demonstrate that *t* is a proof (object) for the proposition
*A*. Within this two-layer system the *demonstration*
layer is the layer of argumentation. Unlike proof objects,
demonstrations have epistemic significance; their judgements carry
assertoric force. The proof layer is the layer at which meanings are
explained: The meaning of a proposition *A* is explained by
telling what counts as a proof (object) for *A*. The distinction
made between canonical and non-canonical proofs is a distinction at the
propositional and not at the judgement al layer. This implies a certain
explicitness requirement. When I have proved something, I must not
only have a justification for my proof *at my disposal* as in
Prawitz's notion of validity, but at the same time have to be
*certain* that this justification fulfills its purpose. This
certainty is guaranteed by a demonstration. Mathematically, this
two-fold sense of proof develops its real power only when types may
themselves depend on terms. Dependent types are a basic ingredient of
of Martin-Löf's type theory and related approaches.

The second idea makes Martin-Löf's approach strongly
differ from all other definitions of proof-theoretic validity. The
crucial difference, for example, to Prawitz's procedure is that
it is not *metalinguistic* in character, where
“metalinguistic” means that propositions and candidates of
proofs are specified first and then, by means of a definition in the
metalanguage, it is fixed which of them are valid and which are not.
Rather, propositions and proofs come into play only in the context of
demonstrations. For example, if we assume that something is a proof of
an implication *A* → *B*, we need not necessarily
show that both *A* and *B* are well-formed propositions
outright, but, in addition to knowing that *A* is a proposition,
we only need to know that *B* is a proposition *provided
that* *A* *has been proved*. Being a proposition is
expressed by a specific form of judgement, which is established in the
same system of demonstration which is used to establish that a proof of
a proposition has been achieved.

In Martin-Löf's theory, proof-theoretic semantics receives a strongly ontological component. A recent debate deals with the question of whether proof objects have a purely ontological status or whether they codify knowledge, even if they are not epistemic acts themselves.

*Further Reading:*

For *inversion principles* see Schroeder-Heister (2007).

For Prawitz's definition of *proof-theoretic validity*
see Schroeder-Heister (2006).

For Matin-Löf's *type theory*, see the entry on
type theory
as well as Sommaruga (2000).

### 2.3 Clausal definitions and definitional reasoning

Proof-theoretic semantics normally focuses on logical constants. This focus is practically never questioned, apparently because it is considered so obvious. In proof theory, little attention has been paid to atomic systems, although there has been Lorenzen's early work (see section 2.1.1), where the justification of logical rules is embedded in a theory of arbitrary rules, and Martin-Löf's (1971) theory of iterated inductive definitions where introduction and elimination rules for atomic formulas are proposed. The rise of logic programming has widened this perspective. From the proof-theoretic point of view, logic programming is a theory of atomic reasoning with respect to clausal definitions of atoms. Definitional reflection is an approach to proof-theoretic semantics that takes up this challenge and attempts to build a theory whose range of application goes beyond logical constants.

#### 2.3.1 The challenge from logic programming

In logic programming we are dealing with program clauses of the form

A⇐B_{1}, …,B_{m}

which *define* atomic formulas. Such clauses can naturally be
interpreted as describing introduction rules for atoms. From the point
of view of proof-theoretic semantics the following two points are
essential:

(1) Introduction rules (clauses) for logically compound formulas are not distinguished in principle from introduction rules (clauses) for atoms. Interpreting logic programming proof-theoretically motivates an extension of proof-theoretic semantics to arbitrary atoms, which yields a semantics with a much wider realm of applications.

(2) Program clauses are not necessarily well-founded. For example, the head of a clause may occur in its body. Well-founded programs are just a particular sort of programs. The use of arbitrary clauses without further requirements in logic programming is a motivation to pursue the same idea in proof-theoretic semantics, admitting just any sort of introduction rules and not just those of a special form, and in particular not necessarily ones which are well-founded. This carries the idea of definitional freedom, which is a cornerstone of logic programming, over to semantics, again widening the realm of application of proof-theoretic semantics.

The idea of considering introduction rules as meaning-giving rules for atoms is closely related to the theory of inductive definitions in its general form, according to which inductive definitions are systems of rules (see Aczel, 1977).

#### 2.3.2 Definitional reflection

The theory of definitional reflection (Hallnäs, 1991;
Hallnäs, 2006; Hallnäs and Schroeder-Heister, 1990/91;
Schroeder-Heister, 1993) takes up the challenge from logic programming
and gives a proof-theoretic semantics not just for logical constants
but for arbitrary expressions, for which a clausal definition can be
given. Formally, this approach starts with a list of clauses which is
the *definition* considered. Each clause has the form

A⇐ Δ

where the head *A* is an atomic formula (atom). In the
simplest case, the body Δ is a list of atoms
*B*_{1}*,**…*,*B*_{m},
in which case a definition looks like a definite logic program. We
often consider an extended case where Δ may also contain some
structural implication ‘⇒’, and sometimes even some
structural universal implication, which essentially is handled by
restricting substitution. If the definition of *A* has the
form

then *A* has the following introduction and elimination
rules

Δ _{1}· · · Δ _{n}AA

[Δ _{1}][Δ _{n}]AC· · · CC

The introduction rules, also called rules of *definitional
closure*, express reasoning ‘along’ the clauses. The
elimination rule is called the *principle of definitional
reflection*, as it reflects upon the definition as a whole. If
Δ_{1}*,**…**,*
Δ_{n} exhaust *all possible conditions*
to generate *A* according to the given definition, and if each
of these conditions entails the very same conclusion *C*, then
*A* itself entails this conclusion. If the clausal definition
is viewed as an inductive definition, this principle can be viewed as
expressing the extremal clause in inductive definitions: Nothing else
beyond the clauses given defines *A*. Obviously, definitional
reflection is a generalized form of the inversion principles discussed.
It develops its genuine power in definitional contexts with free
variables that go beyond purely propositional reasoning, and in
contexts which are not well-founded. An example of a non-wellfounded
definition is the definition of an atom *R* by its own
negation:

This example is discussed in detail in the

Supplement on Definitional reflection and paradoxes.

*Further Reading:*

For *non-wellfoundedness* and *paradoxes* see the entries
on
self-reference and
Russell's paradox,
as well as the references quoted in the supplement linked to.

### 2.4 Structural characterization of logical constants

There is a large field of ideas and results concerning what might be called the “structural characterization” of logical constants, where “structural” is here meant both in the proof-theoretic sense of “structural rules” and in the sense of a framework that bears a certain structure, where this framework is again proof-theoretically described. Some of its authors use a semantical vocabulary and at least implicitly suggest that their topic belongs to proof-theoretic semantics. Others explicitly deny these connotations, emphasizing that they are interested in a characterization which establishes the logicality of a constant. The question “What is a logical constant?” can be answered in proof-theoretic terms, even if the semantics of the constants themselves is truth-conditional: Namely by requiring that the (perhaps truth-conditionally defined) constants show a certain inferential behaviour that can be described in proof-theoretic terms. However, as some of the authors consider their characterization at the same time as a semantics, it is appropriate that we mention some of these approaches here.

The most outspoken structuralist with respect to logical constants,
who explicitly understands himself as such, is Koslow. In his
*Structuralist Theory of Logic* (1992) he develops a theory of
logical constants, in which he characterizes them by certain
“implication relations”, where an implication relation
roughly corresponds to a finite consequence relation in Tarski's
sense (which again can be described by certain structural rules of a
sequent-style system). Koslow develops a structural theory in the
precise metamathematical sense, which does not specify the domain of
objects in any way beyond the axioms given. If a language or any other
domain of objects equipped with an implication relation is given, the
structural approach can be used to single out logical compounds by
checking their implicational properties.

In his early papers on the foundations of logic, Popper (1947a; 1947b) gives inferential characterizations of logical constants in proof-theoretic terms. He uses a calculus of sequents and characterizes logical constants by certain derivability conditions of such sequents. His terminology clearly suggests that he intends a proof-theoretic semantics of logical constants, as he speaks of “inferential definitions” and the “trivialization of mathematical logic” achieved by defining constants in the way described. Although his presentation is not free from conceptual imprecision and errors, he was the first to consider the sequent-style inferential behaviour of logical constants to characterize them. This is all the more remarkable as he was probably not at all, and definitely not fully aware of Gentzen's sequent calculus and Gentzen's further achievements (he was in correspondence with Bernays, though). However, against his own opinion, his work can better be understood as an attempt to define the logicality of constants and to structurally characterize them, than as a proof-theoretic semantics in the genuine sense. He nevertheless anticipated many ideas now common in proof-theoretic semantics, such as the characterization of logical constants by means of certain minimality or maximality conditions with respect to introduction or elimination rules.

Important contributions to the logicality debate that characterize logical constants inferentially in terms of sequent calculus rules are those by Kneale (1956) and Hacking (1979). A thorough account of logicality is proposed by Došen (1980; 1989) in his theory of logical constants as “punctuation marks”, expressing structural features at the logical level. He understands logical constants as being characterized by certain double-line rules for sequents which can be read in both directions. For example, conjunction and disjunction are (in classical logic, with multiple-formulae succedents) characterized by the double-line rules

Γ⊢ A, Δ Γ⊢B, ΔΓ⊢ A∧B, Δ

Γ, A⊢ Δ Γ,B⊢ ΔΓ⊢ A∨B, Δ

Došen is able to give characterizations which include systems of modal logic. He explicitly considers his work as a contribution to the logicality debate and not to any conception of proof-theoretic semantics. Sambin et al., in their Basic Logic (Sambin, Battilotti, and Faggian, 2000), explicitly understand what Došen calls double-line rules as fundamental meaning giving rules. The double-line rules for conjunction and disjunction are read as implicit definitions of these constants, which by some procedure can be turned into the explicit sequent-style rules we are used to. So Sambin et al. use the same starting point as Došen, but interpret it not as a structural description of the behaviour of constants, but semantically as their implicit definition (see Schroeder-Heister, 2012b).

There are several other approaches to a uniform proof-theoretic characterization of logical constants, all of whom at least touch upon issues of proof-theoretic semantics. Such theories are Belnap's Display Logic (Belnap, 1982), Wansing's Logic of Information Structures (Wansing, 1993b), generic proof editing systems and their implementations such as the Edinburgh logical framework (Harper, Honsell, and Plotkin, 1987) and many successors which allow the specification of a variety of logical systems. Since the rise of linear and, more generally, substructural logics (Di Cosmo and Miller, 2010; Restall, 2009) there are various approaches dealing with logics that differ with respect to restrictions on their structural rules. The recent movement away from singling out a particular logic as the true one towards a more pluralist stance (see, e.g., Beall and Restall, 2006) which is interested in what different logics have in common without any preference for a particular logic can be seen as a shift away from semantical justification towards structural characterization.

There is an abundant literature on category theory in relation to
proof theory, and, following seminal work by Lawvere, Lambek and others
(see Lambek and Scott, 1986, and the references therein), category
itself can be viewed as a kind of abstract proof theory. If one looks
at an arrow *A* → *B* in a category as a kind of
abstract proof of *B* from *A*, we have a representation
which goes beyond pure derivability of *B* from *A* (as
the arrow has its individuality), but does not deal with the particular
syntactic structure of this proof. For intuitionistic systems,
proof-theoretic semantics in categorial form comes probably closest to
what denotational semantics is in the classical case.

*Further Reading:*

For *Popper's theory of logical constants* see
Schroeder-Heister (2005).

For *logical constants* and their *logicality* see the
entry on
logical constants.

For *categorial approaches* see the entry on
category theory.

## 3. Extensions and alternatives to standard proof-theoretic semantics

### 3.1 Elimination rules as basic

Most approaches to proof-theoretic semantics consider introduction rules as basic, meaning giving, or self-justifying, whereas the elimination inferences are justified as valid with respect to the given introduction rules. This conception has at least three roots: The first is a verificationist theory of meaning according to which the assertibility conditions of a sentence constitute its meaning. The second is the idea that we must distinguish between what gives the meaning and what are the consequences of this meaning, as not all inferential knowledge can consist of applications of definitions. The third one is the primacy of assertion over other speech acts such as assuming or denying, which is implicit in all approaches considered so far.

One might investigate how far one gets by considering elimination
rules rather than introduction rules as a basis of proof-theoretic
semantics. Some ideas towards a proof-theoretic semantics based on
elimination rather than introduction rules have been sketched by
Dummett (1991, Ch. 13), albeit in a very rudimentary form. A more
precise definition of validity based on elimination inferences is due
to Prawitz (1971; 2007). Its essential idea is that a closed proof is
considered valid, if the result of applying an elimination rule to its
end formula is a valid proof or reduces to one. For example, a closed
proof of an implication *A* → *B* is valid, if, for
any given closed proof of *A*, the result of applying modus
ponens

A→BAB

to these two proofs is a valid proof of *B*, or reduces to
such a proof. This conception keeps two of the three basic ingredients
of Prawitz-style proof-theoretic semantics (see section
2.2.2):
the role of proof reduction and the
substitutional view of assumptions. Only the canonicity of proofs
ending with introductions is changed into the canonicity of proofs
ending with eliminations.

### 3.2 Negation and denial

Standard proof-theoretic semantics is assertion-centred in that
assertibility conditions determine the meaning of logical constants.
Corresponding to the intuitionistic way of proceeding, the negation
¬*A* of a formula *A* is normally understood as
implying absurdity *A* →⊥, where ⊥ is a
constant which cannot be asserted, i.e., for which no assertibility
condition is defined. This is an ‘indirect’ way of
understanding negation. In the literature there has been the discussion
of what, following von Kutschera (1969), might be called
‘direct’ negation. By that one understands a one-place
primitive operator of negation, which cannot be, or at least is not,
reduced to implying absurdity. It is not classical negation either. It
rather obeys rules which dualize the usual rules for the logical
constants. Sometimes it is called the “denial” of a
sentence, sometimes also “strong negation” (see Odintsov,
2008). Typical rules for the denial ~*A* of *A* are

~ A~B~ A~ B~( A∨B)~( A∧B)~( A∧B)

Essentially, the denial rules for an operator correspond to the
assertion rules for the dual operator. Several logics of denial have
been investigated, in particular Nelson's logics of
“constructible falsity” motivated first by Nelson (1949)
with respect to a certain realizability semantics. The main focus has
been on his systems later called N3 and N4 which differ with respect to
the treatment of contradiction (N4 is N3 without *ex contradictione
quodlibet*). Using denial any approach to proof-theoretic semantics
can be dualized by just exchanging assertion and denial and turning
from logical constants to their duals. In doing so, one obtains a
system based on refutation (= proof of denial) rather than proof. It
can be understood as applying a Popperian view to proof-theoretic
semantics.

Another approach would be to not just dualize assertion-centered
proof-theoretic semantics in favour of a denial-centered
refutation-theoretic semantics, but to see the relation between rules
for assertion and for denial as governed by an inversion principle or
principle of definitional reflection of its own. This would be a
principle of what might be called
“assertion-denial-harmony”. Whereas in standard
proof-theoretic semantics, inversion principles control the
relationship between assertions and assumptions (or consequences), such
a principle would now govern the relationship between assertion and
denial. Given certain defining conditions of *A*, it would say
that the denial of every defining condition of *A* leads to the
denial of *A* itself. For conjunction and disjunction it leads
to the common pairs of assertion and denial rules

AB~ A~BA∨BA∨B~( A∨B)

AB~ A~ BA∧B~( A∧B)~( A∧B)

This idea can easily be generalized to definitional reflection, yielding a reasoning system in which assertion and denial are intertwined. It has parallels to the deductive relations between the forms of judgement studied in the traditional square of opposition (Schroeder-Heister, 2012a; Zeilberger, 2008). It should be emphasized that the denial operator is here an external sign indicating a form of judgement and not as a logical operator. This means in particular that it cannot be iterated.

### 3.3 Harmony and reflection in the sequent calculus

Gentzen's sequent calculus exhibits a symmetry between right
and left introduction rules which suggest to look for a harmony
principle that makes this symmetry significant to proof-theoretic
semantics. At least three lines have been pursued to deal with this
phenomenon. (i) Either the right-introduction or or the
left-introduction rules are considered to be introduction rules. The
opposite rules (left-introductions and right-introductions,
respectively) are then justified using the corresponding elimination
rules. This means that the methods discussed before are applied to
whole sequents rather than formulas within sequents. Unlike these
formulas, the sequents are not logically structured. Therefore this
approach builds on definitional reflection, which applies harmony and
inversion to rules for arbitrarily structured entities rather than for
logical composites only. It has been pursued by de Campos Sanz and
Piecha (2009). (ii) The right- and left-introduction rules are derived
from a characterization in the sense of Došen's double
line rules (section
2.4),
which is then read
as a definition of some sort. The top-down direction of a double-line
rule is already a right- or a left-introduction rule. The other one can
be derived from the bottom-up direction by means of certain principles.
This is the basic meaning-theoretic ingredient of Sambin et al.'s
*Basic Logic* (Sambin, Battilotti, and Faggian, 2000). (iii) The
right- and left-introduction rules are seen as expressing an
interaction between sequents using the rule of cut. Given either the
right- or the left-rules, the complementary rules express that
everything that interacts with its premisses in a certain way so does
with its conclusion. This idea of interaction is a generalized
symmetric principle of definitional reflection. It can be considered to
be a generalization of the inversion principle, using the notion of
interaction rather than the derivability of consequences (see
Schroeder-Heister, 2012b). All three approaches apply to the sequent
calculus in its classical form, with possibly more than one formula in
the succedent of a sequent, including structurally restricted versions
as investigated in linear and other logics.

### 3.4 Subatomic structure and natural language

Even if, as in definitional reflection, we are considering definitional rules for atoms, their defining conditions do not normally decompose these atoms. A proof-theoretic approach that takes the internal structure of atomic sentences into account, has been proposed by Wieckowski (2008; 2011). He uses introduction and elimination rules for atomic sentences, where these atomic sentences are not just reduced to other atomic sentences, but to subatomic expressions representing the meaning of predicates and individual names. This can be seen as a first step towards natural language applications of proof-theoretic semantics. A further step in this direction has been undertaken by Francez, who developed a proof-theoretic semantics for several fragments of English (see Francez, Dyckhoff, and Ben-Avi, 2010; Francez and Dyckhoff, 2010).

### 3.5 Classical logic

Proof-theoretic semantics is intuitionistically biased. This is due
to the fact that natural deduction as its preferred framework has
certain features which make it particularly suited for intuitionistic
logic. In classical natural deduction the *ex falso
quodlibet*

⊥ A

is replaced with the rule of *classical reductio ad
absurdum*

[ A→ ⊥]

⊥ A

In allowing to discharge *A* →⊥ in order to infer
*A*, this rule undermines the *subformula principle*.
Furthermore, in containing both ⊥ and *A*
→⊥, it refers to two different logical constants in a single
rule, so there is no *separation* of logical constants any more.
Finally, as an elimination rule for ⊥ it does not follow the
general pattern of introductions and eliminations. As a consequence, it
destroys the *introduction form property* that every closed
derivation can be reduced to one which uses an introduction rule in the
last step.

Classical logic fits very well with the multiple-succedent sequent calculus. There we do not need any additional principles beyond those assumed in the intuitionistic case. Just the structural feature of allowing for more than one formula in the succedent suffices to obtain classical logic. As there are plausible approaches to establish a harmony between right-introductions and left-introduction in the sequent calculus (see section 3.3), classical logic appears to be perfectly justified. However, this is only convincing if reasoning is appropriately framed as a multiple-conclusion process, even if this does not correspond to our standard practice where we focus on single conclusions. One could try to develop an appropriate intuition by arguing that reasoning towards multiple conclusions delineates the area in which truth lies rather than establishing a single proposition as true. However, this intuition is hard to maintain and cannot be formally captured without serious difficulties. Philosophical approaches such as those by Shoesmith and Smiley (1978) and proof-theoretic approaches such as proof-nets (see Girard, 1987; Di Cosmo and Miller, 2010) are attempts in this direction.

A fundamental reason for the failure of the introduction form
property in classical logic is the indeterminism inherent in the laws
for disjunction. *A*∨*B* can be inferred from
*A* as well as from *B*. Therefore, if the disjunction laws were the
only way of inferring *A*∨*B*, the derivability of
*A*∨¬*A*, which is a key principle of classical
logic, would entail that of either *A* or of ¬*A*,
which is absurd. A way out of this difficulty is to abolish
indeterministic disjunction and use instead its classical de Morgan
equivalent ¬(¬*A* ∧¬*B*). This leads
essentially to a logic without proper disjunction. In the quantifier
case, there would be no proper existential quantifier either, as
∃*xA* would be understood in the sense of
¬∀*x*¬*A*. If one is prepared to accept
this restriction, then certain harmony principles can be formulated for
classical logic.

*Further Reading*

For *negation and denial* see Tranchini (2011a); Wansing
(2001).

For *classical logic* see the entry on
classical logic.

## 4. Conclusion and outlook

Standard proof-theoretic semantics has practically exclusively been occupied with logical constants. Logical constants play a central role in reasoning and inference, but are definitely not the exclusive, and perhaps not even the most typical sort of entities that can be defined inferentially. A framework is needed that deals with inferential definitions in a wider sense and covers both logical and extra-logical inferential definitions alike. The idea of definitional reflection with respect to arbitrary definitional rules (see 2.3.2) and also natural language applications (see 3.4) point in this direction, but farther reaching conceptions can be imagined. Furthermore, the concentration on harmony, inversion principles, definitional reflection and the like is somewhat misleading, as it might suggest that proof-theoretic semantics consists of only that. It should be emphasized that already when it comes to arithmetic, stronger principles are needed in addition to inversion. However, in spite of these limitations, proof-theoretic semantics has already gained very substantial achievements that can compete with more common approaches to semantics.

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## Other Internet Resources

- de Campos Sanz, Wagner and Thomas Piecha (2012). “Remarks on
Constructive Semantics for Classical and Intuitionistic
Logic”.
*Submitted for publication*(Manuscript available). - Tranchini, Luca (2012b). “Proof-Theoretic Semantics, Paradoxes,
and the Distinction between Sense and denotation”,
*Submitted for publication*(Manuscript available).

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category theory | connectives: sentence connectives in formal logic | Curry's paradox | Hilbert, David: program in the foundations of mathematics | logic, history of: intuitionistic logic | logic: classical | logic: intuitionistic | logic: linear | logic: substructural | logical constants | mathematics, philosophy of: intuitionism | paradoxes: and contemporary logic | proof theory: development of | realism: challenges to metaphysical | Russell's paradox | self-reference | truth: revision theory of | type theory

### Acknowledgments

Supported by DFG grants Schr 275/15-1 (ESF EUROCORES LogICCC project “Dialogical Foundations of Semantics” [DiFoS]) and Schr 275/16-1 (French-German ANR-DFG project “Hypothetical Reasoning—Logical and Semantical Perspectives” [HYPOTHESES]). I would like to thank the editors, especially Ed Zalta, and an anonymous reviewer for their very detailed and helpful comments and suggestions.