Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Preferences

1. A lexicographic preference relation gives absolute priority to one good over another. In the case of two-goods bundles, AB if a1>b1, or a1=b1 and a2>b2. Good 1 then cannot be traded off by any amount of good 2. Debreu shows that such a preference relation cannot be represented by a standard utility function.

2. This and the counterexample below have been dismissed on the ground that properties α and β were intended only for changes in the set of alternatives which do not change the agent's information of the alternatives' desirability. However, it is not clear how much of a distinction can be made between cases for which the properties hold and those for which they were not, without recurring to criteria of the same type as α or β. Such a criticism thus runs the danger of turning into an immunising defence of the properties.

3. WARP and SARP are often formulated in terms of preferences. This is confusing, because they really are conditions on choices necessary for the derivation of preferences from them. For this reason, WARP and SARP are here presented in the slightly less readable form of conditions on choices.

4. A variety of models of preference change have been proposed that differ in what they want to achieve. Psychometric analysis only strives to record relationships between past and current preference orderings, not to explain them. It makes almost no rationality assumptions. Böckenholt (2002), for example, discusses a Thurstonian vector autoregressive model that investigates the strength of the relation between past and current preference rankings (with ties). A crucial assumption in this investigation is the normal distribution of the individual differences in preference judgements. A justification of this assumption would require insights into the underlying mechanisms that the data and the models used in this research do not provide. This requires models of explanatory scope.

5. All of these assumptions, in particular (1) and (3), have been extensively scrutinised. Today, many economists believe that the crucial problem lies in assumption (3), Independence of irrelevant alternatives. If one had more information about individual well-being, allowing for example the comparison of individual welfare levels with regard to a particular alternative, one could avoid the impossibility result. As shown by Sen (1986), replacing the function mapping individual preferences onto social preferences by a “social welfare functional” mapping profiles of individual utility functions onto social preferences does the trick. In this extended setting, Unlimited Domain, Pareto and Non-Dictatorship can be retained unaltered. But Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives has been weakened into the requirement that the social ranking of two alternatives should only depend on the levels of utility attained by the individuals at these two alternatives. With this weakened version of (3), the impossibility disappears.