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Phenomenology of Religion

First published Wed Oct 1, 2008

This entry examines the relevance of phenomenological considerations for the concept of God (or the sacred otherwise characterised) and the question of what sort of rational sense is implied in the adoption of a religious point of view. The discussion distinguishes various perspectives on the subjective character of religious experience, and examines the relation between religious experience and experience of the material world. It also considers the interaction between experience, conceptual framework (including religious doctrine) and practice, and the contribution, if any, of emotional feelings to the epistemic significance of religious experience. In all of these ways, an appreciation of the 'phenomenology of religion' proves central to an understanding of what is involved practically, cognitively and affectively in a religious way of life.

1. The phenomenology of religious experience

Commentators on religious experience disagree on the role of phenomenological considerations. Is there a phenomenology that is distinctive of religious experience? And if there is, do we have a reliable vocabulary to describe it? Is there a phenomenology of mystical experience which crosses faith boundaries? Or are such experiences saturated with tradition-specific doctrinal assumptions? Are reports of religious experiences in central cases best read as doctrine-inspired interpretations of the subjective character of the experience, rather than as accounts of their phenomenology? And does the affective phenomenology of religious experience do any epistemic work? Let's consider some of these issues.

1.1 Religious experience as encounter with God

William Alston (1991, Chapter 1) has noted that we don't have a well-developed vocabulary for the description of the phenomenal qualia of “mystical” experience. (Compare William James's suggestion that “mystical” experiences are “ineffable”: 1902, p. 380.) If someone takes God's goodness to be displayed in a mountain landscape, then the phenomenology of their experience can perhaps be set down easily enough, at least in some central respects; but what about the case where an experience is said to be more directly of God (the case which Alston intends to pick out by the expression “mystical perception”)? Alston suggests that our inability to describe the elements of such experiences from a phenomenological point of view does not imply that they lack a distinctive phenomenology, or that they fail to be directed at some mind-independent reality, in rather the way that sense experiences are.

We lack a relevant vocabulary, he argues, because we cannot construct any simple correlation between a range of “stimulus conditions” for mystical perception and the kinds of experience which are likely to arise under those conditions. And therefore we cannot refine a vocabulary for the description of mystical experience by replication of relevant conditions and renewed attention to the phenomenology of the experiences that occur under those conditions. By contrast, there is no difficulty in general in specifying the phenomenology of an experience of, say, turning one's face into a breeze, because it is easy to recreate the stimulus conditions for such an experience, and we can therefore attend repeatedly to the character of the experience. And since others can also do this, we can establish a public language for the description of such experiences.

This difficulty in identifying the stimulus conditions for mystical perception in no way impugns its epistemic worth, Alston thinks, because God is said to be a personal reality, and an experience of God's presence therefore cannot be brought about in some relatively mechanical way, simply by creating an appropriate set of sensory or other conditions. (Compare O'Hear 1984, Chapter 2.) So given what we mean by “God,” it is only to be expected that mystical perception will fail to yield a vocabulary that will allow us to specify at all precisely a correlative phenomenology. In other words, even if (perhaps especially if) mystical perception were veridical, we would not expect to have such a vocabulary. So the absence of the vocabulary cannot be thought to constitute an objection to the good epistemic standing of such experiences.

Notwithstanding these considerations, Alston and other commentators have noted that in the Christian mystical tradition anyway there is in fact quite a well developed vocabulary for describing the subjective quality of such experiences. This vocabulary is modelled on that of ordinary sense perception. So there are “spiritual sensations” of touch, sight, taste, smell and hearing which are taken to be in some way analogous to their counterparts in ordinary sense perception. As Nelson Pike (1992) notes, this tradition has commonly differentiated three varieties of experience of God: those associated with the “prayer of quiet,” the “prayer of union,” and “rapture,” in order of increasing intimacy of acquaintance with God. And each of these phases of the spiritual life, it has been said, is associated with its own distinctive phenomenology.

For example, speaking of the “prayer of quiet,” Pike comments that in such experiences

phenomenologically, God is located in that place within the body where one normally experiences oneself to be. … the spiritual sensations involved are akin to ordinary auditory and olfactory perceptions as well as to ordinary perceptions of heat. They do not include sensations akin to those associated with inside or outside touch or to those connected with taste. (1992, p. 159)

Of course, even this vocabulary can only carry a person so far towards an understanding of the phenomenology of the experiences that are here being described, because the vocabulary is after all only patterned on that which applies in ordinary sense experience. So to ascertain more exactly the nature of these “spiritual sensations” it would be necessary to experience them firsthand (Pike 1992, p. 161). Nonetheless, the convergence of mystical testimony upon some such set of descriptions gives us a reason to think that these experiences, like ordinary sense experiences, can be ordered in ways that admit of a degree of inter-personal confirmation — and that there is a kind of correlation between the “angle of view” one takes up in relation to the purported object of the experience (corresponding to one's progression through the spiritual life, and one's degree of closeness to God) and the phenomenology of the associated experience.

These observations suggest another response to the objection that mystical perception is epistemically defective because we lack a reliable vocabulary for the description of the phenomenology of such experiences. On the contrary, it may be said, there is such a vocabulary, albeit that it is not as developed or its full meaning as generally accessible as the vocabulary that we use for the description of the phenomenology of ordinary sensory experience.

Some commentators have sought to distinguish between that component of a report of a religious experience which is a record of its phenomenology and that component which involves an interpretation of the experience according to some favoured doctrinal scheme (Stace 1961). As Pike notes, it is possible in principle that whole traditions of mystical experience are more concerned to communicate the doctrinal implications of such experience rather than its phenomenological content (1992, p. 174), and that they adopt a vocabulary for talking about the experiences that will suit this purpose. But in light of the language of “spiritual sensations” we may doubt (with Pike) that this is the right way to understand the Christian mystical tradition. At least some strands of this tradition seem to display a keen interest in recording the phenomenology of various experiences. (See Turner 1995 for a contrasting, non-experientialist reading of Christian mystical writing.)

And there is a ready “spiritual” explanation of why there should be such an interest: so that the believer can track their progress through the spiritual life. Where the “ordinary believer” is concerned, such progress is not likely to involve some abstractly intellectual kind of achievement, and on some approaches anyway, it is not likely to involve some new proximity to God that can be specified independently of developments in the phenomenology of one's experience. So in these cases, the phenomenology serves to reassure the believer of their growing closeness to God.

Such an approach can admit of corruptions, as when the believer seeks out certain exalted experiences, and takes pride in them because of what they are thought to signify about intimacy with God, or perhaps takes pleasure in them simply because of their thrilling or in other ways pleasing phenomenological feel. David Pugmire (1998) speaks of “dramaturgical” and “narcissistic” cases of emotional experience where, respectively, the emotion is taken to signify one's superior status in some respect, or where it is valued because of its pleasant phenomenological feel. And we might think of some religious experiences in similar terms. However, these cases are presumably corruptions, and the tradition which has evolved the language of “spiritual sensations” need not as such have any tendency to value religious experience for these reasons.

Indeed, in so far as spiritual sensations are prized for these reasons — because of their phenomenological feel or as a way of underwriting one's sense of one's own importance — then they will be religiously defective (given the religious importance of the virtue of humility for example); and they are also likely to be epistemically defective, because of the suspicion that the believer, whether consciously or not, is engineering the production of such experiences for the advantages that they confer in these respects. It is in part for these reasons that there exists a very broadly based tradition of testing religious experiences by their fruits in practice. An experience which fails to issue in a livelier regard for the interests of one's neighbour, for example, is to that extent disconfirmed on religious grounds (Alston 1991, pp. 250–254).

It is worth noting, with Pike, that even if a description of a religious experience employs a relatively theoretical or metaphysically loaded vocabulary, rather than simply using the language of sensation, it does not follow that this is an interpretation of the experience rather than an attempt to communicate its phenomenological content: it may be, for example, that one's experience is as of being appeared to by a very powerful spiritual being, rather than simply a matter of certain sensations of heat, touch or whatever being undergone, which are then interpreted on the basis of some doctrinal scheme.

Some commentators have argued on the contrary that the theistic meaning of an experience cannot be given directly in its phenomenology, since “it's God” or “it's omnipotent” can never be part of the phenomenology of an experience but must involve some interpretation of the phenomenology (Forgie 1984 and Zangwill 2004). Whatever stance one takes here, it will be necessary to acknowledge that in ordinary sense experience we commonly recognise someone without reliance upon inference, rather than starting from some set of minimally interpreted sensations (blobs of colour and so on) and inferring that the presence of this person in particular would best explain these phenomena.

Some scholars have sought to apply the distinction between experience and interpretation to theistic mysticism in particular, arguing that theistic mystical experiences have the same content as non-theistic mystical experiences, and are just differently interpreted and reported, because in all cases mystical experience is experience of “undifferentiated unity” (Stace 1961, p. 236) (mystics who are orthodox theists have had to reckon of course with the teaching that there is an ineradicable ontological distinction between creature and creator). And some have wondered whether “introvertive” mystical experiences in all traditions (as distinct from “extrovertive” mystical experiences, where material objects are experienced as one) are devoid of any phenomenological content, in so far as “what emerges is a state of pure consciousness: ‘pure’ in the sense that it is not the consciousness of any empirical content. It has no content except itself” (Stace, p. 86). It is tempting to represent such experiences in these terms in part no doubt because any attribution of a phenomenological content to an experience is likely to imply a subject-object structure (to imply some account of how something seemed to the subject of the experience), so contradicting the purported, non-dualistic content of an introvertive mystical experience. (Compare Plotinus on union with the One in Enneads VI.9.11.)

Other commentators have rejected the idea that mystics across traditions have experiences which are subjectively the same, but just differently reported. On the contrary, they say, the categories of a faith tradition will make a difference not simply to the ways in which experiences are reported, but will also inform the character of the experience itself (Katz 1978).

John Hick's (1989) study is a particularly influential application of this Kantian sort of perspective within the domain of religious experience. Hick argues that religious experiences are structured according to tradition-specific sets of religious concepts. On this view, all the major faiths offer a way of encountering one and the same ultimate religious reality — but Christians encounter this reality in Trinitarian mode, while Hindus encounter it as Brahman, and so on.

Hick is clear that this is not a matter of the advocates of the various faiths having an experience whose phenomenological content is much the same across the traditions, but just differently interpreted and differently reported; rather, tradition-specific concepts (such as those of the Trinity and Brahman) enter into the content of the experience. Analogously, we might say that there is a sense in which a newborn infant and I have the same experience when we look out upon a room of tables and chairs, in so far as the same image is imprinted on our retinas; but we would presumably wish to say that the phenomenology of these experiences remains quite different even so, and that only I have an experience which seems to be of tables and chairs, and in which my visual field is organised accordingly (so that regions of colour are sorted into table- and chair-like configurations).

This account of religious experience and the contribution of doctrine in shaping its phenomenology sits very well with Hick's defence of a pluralistic reading of the major faiths. On this view, these traditions are all valid in so far as all provide a vehicle for experience of ultimate religious reality or what Hick terms “the Real” (an expression which is intended to be neutral between the various designations for this reality which are favoured by the different traditions). And the traditions are indeed all equally valid in so far as there can be no question of the doctrinal content of any one tradition's experience of the Real corresponding more closely to the character of the Real “in itself”; rather, the doctrinal content of such experiences derives in every case from the side of culture or a person's religious formation, rather than mapping the character of the Real in itself. Identifying the intrinsic character of the Real is beyond the scope of any human enquiry. Instead, we have to make do with appearances of the Real, where these appearances vary with the culturally constituted ways of being religious that are made available in the various faiths.

Of course, this picture invites the objection that a culturally reductionist account of religious experience is surely then to be preferred: if the phenomenological content of religious experience is fixed in all its detail by a person's socio-religious context, then why not think of such experience as simply a cultural product, rather than as having some culture-transcendent reference (Stoeber 1992)? To shore up the claim of religious experience to connect the believer to a mind-independent reality we require, rather, some sort of convergence across traditions concerning the nature of the reality which is revealed in such experiences — instead of Hick's rigorously agnostic (and therefore tradition-neutral) affirmation that the Real in itself eludes all our categories, and so cannot be considered as personal or impersonal, one or many, or even good or evil. (Compare Byrne 1995.)

Hick's approach might also seem to be in trouble for more straightforwardly religious reasons: as he notes, most believers privilege the picture of the sacred that is favoured in their own tradition (rather than thinking of that picture as simply another way of representing an appearance of the Real). And perhaps this is religiously necessary. If believers thought that their religious symbols, and in turn the content of their religious experience, lacked any ultimate reference (since these symbols are concerned simply with the realm of appearances), then it may be doubted whether they would be adequately motivated to live religiously: if religious symbols are interpreted in this agnostic way, and if the phenomenology of religious experience fails therefore to map in any respect the character of the Real in itself, then how is the Real to be intelligibly the object of a response of love and faith, rather than simply of bafflement or perhaps indifference?

So philosophical treatments of the phenomenology of religious experience draw quite diverse conclusions: religious experience (in at least some central cases) is said variously to have no phenomenological content (not to be like anything), or to have a content which at any rate cannot be communicated readily in verbal terms, or to have a phenomenological content that can be described because it is analogous to the “sensational” quality of ordinary sensory experience, where this content can then be interpreted in doctrinal terms, or to have a phenomenological content which is given in the doctrinal scheme of the relevant faith tradition, where this scheme functions rather like a lens through which religious reality is viewed, or to have a phenomenological content which never comes clearly into view in public discourse, since reports of such experiences typically focus upon the implied doctrinal meaning of the experience which is, on this account, to be sharply distinguished from its phenomenological content.

These disputes sometimes have a relatively conceptual character, and sometimes are rooted more clearly in questions about various bodies of documentary evidence. As we have seen, a person's stance on these questions may well make a difference to their approach to other issues: including the question of whether religious experience is discredited by the difficulties in describing its phenomenological content, and the questions of whether we should favour a pluralist account of the faiths or a non-reductionist reading of religious experience.

1.2 Religious experience and relationship to material context

So far we have been concentrating upon religious experience understood as experience of God or the sacred otherwise understood. Some commentators have argued that the philosophy of religion literature has not paid sufficient attention to the fact that religious experience is often in the first instance experience of some material context, a building or landscape for example. And the phenomenology of the experience is therefore given, at least in significant part, in our experience of a set of material objects (Brown 2004).

On this sort of approach, religious experience is sometimes conceived not so much as an encounter with God considered as a particular item of experience, but more as a matter of seeing “in depth” the religious meaning of some material context. If we take up this suggestion, then a new range of possibilities for developing a phenomenology of religion comes into view.

Some scholars have argued that spaces reserved for religious activity have a distinctive character, which sets them apart from merely profane spaces (Eliade 1958). For instance, an approach to a sacred space may require the believer to cross various thresholds, and perhaps to undertake a relatively arduous journey on account of the topography of the place, as when it is set on a mountain or island.

Expounding this tradition of thought, Thomas Barrie notes that:

To reach the threshold and sacred place, often there is a path and entry sequence. The path that leads to the place can take many forms … and typically involves a series of spaces or events, each becoming increasingly more sacred. This sequence acts as a marker of the sacred ground, as protection for the uninitiated, and as a trial to be endured for those seeking the divine. (1996, p. 59)

Similarly Barrie writes of how: “The pilgrim's route along the path underlines the gravity of the journey being undertaken and gives opportunities for the initiate to turn back” (p. 60). Implied in this sort of structuring of sacred space is a correlative phenomenology: one which requires of the devotee an appropriate seriousness and focussed attention, if they are to grasp aright the sacred reality that is to be encountered in the sanctuary (compare Jones 2000 on the various strategies of “ritual-architectural allurement”).

Some Christian commentators have taken exception to this sort of picture, arguing that what makes a place religiously special for a Christian is simply the presence there of a Christian community, engaged in a life of other-regarding love (White 1995). Acknowledging this difference of view, Harold Turner (1979) distinguishes between the domus dei and domus ecclesiae approaches to sacred architecture. On the first perspective, a holy building is conceived as a house of God, and it should therefore be a suitably imposing space, displaying superior craftsmanship and adorned with the finest materials — all of which will imply a correlative phenomenology, whereby the mind is lifted up towards God. (Compare Abbot Suger's account of the abbey of Saint Denis.) By contrast, on the domus ecclesiae perspective, the church building functions primarily as a meeting place, and its construction should therefore serve the needs of the community which gathers there, and facilitate their interaction and fellowship.

Turner gives as an example of the domus dei approach the meditation room at the United Nations Headquarters in New York. This space features a block of iron ore illuminated by a shaft of natural light which descends from a skylight. Accordingly it speaks of a meeting of heaven and earth, of light and dark, and of the ambiguous history of human beings in their relationship to the earth, in so far as iron ore has been used for the making both of weapons and of ploughshares. And by virtue of the conditions of stillness and dimmed light that obtain here, the room invites a response of quiet, reverential seriousness. In all of these respects there is implied, once more, a correlative phenomenology.

In fact, the relationship between the conception of sacred architecture that Barrie describes and Turner's domus ecclesiae tradition need not be flatly antithetical. For Turner acknowledges that even within a Christian context it will be appropriate to make some use of “temple” elements, not least for those members of the community who have not yet fully assimilated a Christian understanding of these matters. And more importantly, even a building which adheres uncompromisingly to domus ecclesiae principles will over time take on some of the characteristics of the domus dei ideal — because even when it is not in use for worship, the fact that it has been organically caught up in the life of the Christian community will quite properly condition our sense of its significance, and the sort of use to which it can be put.

Here Turner notes the experience of a young Quaker who contrary to his professed principles admits to feeling that he ought not to smoke within the meeting house when he is taking his turn on the cleaning rota. This response is fitting, Turner notes, in so far as the history of the building as a site of Christian gathering rightly shapes our sense of its meaning in the present (pp. 327–328). And this sense of the building's significance will imply a correlative phenomenology: the space will be experienced as inviting a respectful or dignified kind of appropriation.

On the other side, Barrie notes that while the sacred place is set apart as a zone where the gods may be encountered, this is not to say that such places have no part to play in the life of a community. On the contrary, sacred spaces will typically serve as an important focus for a community's profession of the values which bind it together (1996, p. 52).

Some Christian commentators have sought to identify a similar middle ground by acknowledging that Christian categories, and the Christian liturgy, are likely to be experienced as strange or even alien by many in modern western societies. The evangelisation of such people may well depend then, in the first instance, not so much upon exposure to specifically Christian concepts as upon experiences of transcendence mediated through encounters with the beauty or majesty of the natural world, or of church or other buildings. These experiences serve then as a propaedeutic for Christian teaching. (Compare Brown 2004, pp. 407–408.)

It is reasonable to suppose, for example, that the religious significance of the great cathedrals of the medieval period was not just a matter of the Christian stories with which they were associated, in so far as they were connected with, say, the deeds of particular holy figures or their relics. Their meaning is also given in their sheer sensory impact: through their monumental scale and controlled use of light, and through the interplay between the solidity of stone and the diaphanous qualities of glass, these structures can speak of the sacred by inducing a response of hushed wonderment.

Of course natural spaces are also able to evoke a sense of the sacred, for the same sorts of reason. And Erazim Kohák has argued that some of the key concepts of western philosophical theology have their original life setting in experiences of nature. On this basis he gives a kind of phenomenological rendering of the cosmological and design arguments.

He writes for example that:

We are, though only by a hair. We could easily not be. The stark white glow of the January moon, pressing down on the frozen forest, sears away the illusion of necessity. (1984, p. 188)

Here Kohák is giving a phenomenological counterpart for the concept of contingency. Of course, he does not think that what results is a newly cogent form of the cosmological argument: he is not giving an argument at all. What he is doing, we might say, is to bring out the religious resonance of the concept of contingency: the concept does not simply signify the possibility of not-being, but when appropriated in the way he describes draws us into a life of “thanksgiving”. As he says, solitude, and being free from the feeling of technological mastery that is characteristic of urban life, “teaches thanks” (p. 188).

Similarly Kohák comments that

The natural world, abandoned by a human dweller, does not disintegrate into a meaningless aggregate. It may seem that way as the ridge of the abandoned barn sags and caves in… That, though, is only the human order of passing. … The nature abandoned by humans is yet not abandoned. It is not simply that it is lawlike in performance, manifesting observed regularities. Its order is far more intimate than that. It is the order of a sphere of mineness. (1984, p. 189)

Standard versions of the argument from design, when they appeal to the world's lawlikeness, do not require any reference to the phenomenology of human experience. But here Kohák is giving a phenomenological rendering of the concept of order, and seeking to root our sense of God in this more “intimate,” phenomenologically informed sense of the world's regularity.

Again, as with the concept of contingency, his concern is to bring out the existential import of the concept of order. When grounded in the kind of experience he describes here, order does not just signify lawlikeness, a notion which has no particular phenomenological content, but a realm of belonging, a place which has been set in order by someone, so that it can be inhabited and constitute a home. This way of developing the concept points once more to its relevance for religious life: to experience order in these terms is to experience God as present in the world, and caring for it.

So we could also take Kohák to be providing a phenomenological rendering of the concept of divine presence. He offers this comparison:

The house belongs: on entering it, we sense its order not simply as an order, but specifically as the order of a Lebenswelt, of an inhabited context ordered by a caring presence. Trying to cook in a strange kitchen brings it home: things have their places, unknown to us, but not arbitrary. The house is a sphere of someone's mineness. (p. 189)

It might be said: the content of the concept of divine presence is really given, surely, in standard philosophical and theological analyses of it. To say that God is omnipresent, for example, is to say that God is directly active in all places, or that God has unmediated knowledge of everything that happens wherever it happens. (See Aquinas, Summa Theologiae 1a. 8. 3 and Swinburne 1993.) On this view, Kohák's observations constitute a kind of psychological gloss on the concept: we human beings sometimes register the divine presence in such experiences of “mineness,” but these experiences form no part of the concept.

It is implied in Kohák's discussion that the experience of mineness enters more deeply into our understanding of divine presence than this account would suggest. Analogously we might say that if we are to have a full understanding of what it is for something to be blue, then we require firsthand experience of blueness, since someone who has not had this experience will not know this truth about blue: that it is manifest in human experience in this way.

Kohák is suggesting I think that our understanding of divine presence, or equally of contingency and order, also has some phenomenological content: to see in full what it is for God to be present, one needs to have some experiential knowledge of the contexts in which the concept of divine presence originates. Or to put the matter otherwise, he is saying that to see in full the religious import of the concepts of order, contingency and divine presence, to see what role they might play in a religious life, it is necessary to have some appreciation of the relevant phenomenology. (This is sort of point is often made in phenomenological discussions by saying that “empathy” is required if we are to understand the defining concepts of a faith tradition: see Dupre 1998, pp. 36–37.)

There are parallels here with discussion in ethics, where some commentators have supposed likewise that a full appreciation of certain cardinal moral concepts depends upon being able to grasp, through first hand experience, the relevant phenomenology. Raimond Gaita for example argues that our concept of the individuality of other persons (in the sense which is relevant when we speak of them as being from a moral point of view irreplaceable) is not fully expressible independently of reference to the phenomenology of our moral experience. The sense of this concept is given in, for example, the experience of being haunted by the victim of your wrong-doing, where it this particular individual who haunts you, rather than some representative of humanity in general, or someone whose individuality can be adequately specified simply by reference to, for example, their distinguishing empirical properties (of hair colour, height, or whatever it may be) (1991, p. 51).

In the same sort of way, Kohák is taking the notion of divine presence, when it functions in religiously resonant ways, to be rooted in certain experiences of the world, so that someone who lacks those experiences will not have the same idea of divine presence. This thought might seem to offend against the public character of our concepts. But it is perhaps more a matter of the public meaning of certain concepts being open to deepening in ways that are relative to experience. Iris Murdoch remarks similarly on how a person's concept of courage at the age of twenty is not the same as their concept of courage at the age of forty: life experience contributes to a deepening of the concept (1985, p. 29).

We have been considering various understandings of the phenomenology of religious experience, where religious experience may be construed as an encounter with God as a particular entity, or as an encounter with some material context, given by our built or natural environment or some combination of these. In this latter case, it may be that God is manifest not so much as a particular item in our perceptual field, but instead as the meaning that is presupposed in our making sense of a material context, rather as “mineness” on Kohák‘s account is the meaning that is presupposed in our making sense of the order presented by the forest. In this way, different emphases in the phenomenology of religion are likely to correlate with different conceptions of God: not only in so far as a given conception of God has a phenomenal content, but also in so far as different phenomenologies are likely to be associated with different conceptions of the sense in which God may be conceived as “individual.”

2. Emotions and religious experience

Many commentators have thought that the phenomenology of religious experience is given in significant part by its affective tone. When God is made known in the experience of guilt, as someone to whom we are accountable and who summons us to newness of life, or when God is revealed in the feeling of wonderment at the scale of the cosmos, or when God is manifest in the experience of encountering some thrilling and awe-inspiring “other”, or in many other cases too, the religious import of the experience is given in large part in our affective responses. It is noteworthy too how often the language of “spiritual sensations” involves reference to states of feeling. And perhaps this is a conceptual requirement: what sense would there be in the idea of a religiously authentic encounter with God, the supreme good and maker of all, which left the subject of the experience unmoved?

2.1 Emotional feelings and encounter with God

I say “emotional feelings” here to distinguish this case from various other uses of feeling language: as for example when we say that we felt something was missing, a usage which may imply no particular phenomenology but only some intuitive registering of an absence, or when we say that we felt a stab of pain, which will imply some sort of phenomenology but need not suggest the kind of directedness that is typical of emotional feelings, as I shall suggest shortly. (Compare Ryle 1971.)

As with the question of its phenomenology more generally, so there is controversy surrounding the contribution of emotional feelings in particular to the character of religious experience. William Alston asks: if the phenomenological content of a religious experience were purely affective, would this be a reason to doubt that it was directed at anything? In this case, he notes, we might well suspect that the experience consists in a felt response to some believed presence (1991, pp. 49–50), rather than some presentation of God to the believer.

This sort of scepticism about the contribution of the emotions to the intentionality or God-directedness of religious experience reflects a certain model of their structure, according to which they are comprised of a thought component and a feeling component, where the first gives rise to the second (as the thought of God's presence is said here to cause a certain feeling). For example, embarrassment on this account will involve the thought (a thought which may be simply entertained rather than asserted) that I have done something which will lower the regard in which I am held by others — where this thought gives rise to a feeling of a broadly negative nature, involving some sort of pain, discomfort or distress (and depending on the model, the particular character of this feeling may be taken to be relative to embarrassment or kindred emotions, or understood in more generic terms) (see Budd 1985, Chapter 1).

So on this standard account, emotion types can be differentiated by reference to the thoughts of which they are comprised. Or where two emotions have the same thought content, they can be differentiated by reference to the state of feeling which is engendered by the thought, as when we treat pity and schadenfreude as distinct emotions types, since they involve different felt responses to the thought of someone else's misfortune.

This account of the emotions allows that they are directed at the world. So they are not on this view to be assimilated to mere stomach churnings or twinges or throbbings. Instead they have some sort of intellectual content, rather than just being a matter of registering in feeling some physiological disturbance. (Compare again the case of embarrassment: this is not just a matter of feeling flushed, and so on.) On this point then, this account brings emotional experience more firmly into our intellectual life than did the late nineteenth century and early twentieth century account, associated with William James and others, which treated emotions simply as ways of recording changes in physiological condition (James 1884). However, it remains true on this perspective that the directedness of the emotions is a function of their thought content, which is understood in distinction from their feeling content.

Some more recent theories have wanted to challenge this distinction, and to regard emotional feelings as themselves forms of thought, as themselves having an intellectual content. This much is often implied in our description of such feelings, as for example when we characterise schadenfreude as a matter of taking pleasure in someone's misfortune. This is to represent the pleasure that arises here as directed at some state of affairs of which it is cognisant, rather than supposing simply that the thought of someone's misfortune causes a feeling of pleasure.

If we allow that emotional feelings can have some intellectual content in their own right, then we have a powerful tool for understanding how the affective phenomenology of religious experience may turn out to be integral to its God-directedness. For example, returning to Alston's concerns regarding the contribution of emotional feelings to the phenomenological content of religious experience, if we take emotional feelings to be intrinsically contentful, then we may wish to say that the phenomenological content of a religious experience could be purely affective without this posing any difficulty for the thought that the experience is directed at some mind-independent reality — rather than being simply a sensation-like feeling which is caused by the thought that God is present.

The idea that emotional feelings may constitute a mode of perception is another familiar theme in recent work in moral philosophy, in the writings of John McDowell (1981) and others. (See Wynn 2004 for an attempt to relate McDowell's thought to religious experience.) It has also been defended by various philosophers of emotion.

For example, John Deigh (1994) writes of how our perception of certain qualities may be realised in our felt response to them: I may register the scariness of something in my feeling of being scared, rather than say in an affect-neutral perception of some quality as scary, which then engenders a felt response. And analogously we might suppose that on occasions anyway God is made manifest in certain felt responses, rather than being known in some other fashion, which then gives rise to some correlative feeling (as on the thought-plus-feeling model of emotion).

An account of the phenomenology of religious experience which lends itself with particular directness to this sort of construal is given in Rudolf Otto's The Idea of the Holy (1959). He speaks here of how God is made known primordially as the mysterium tremendum et fascinans, as a reality that is at once attractive but which also inspires a kind of fear or dread. This sort of dread, Otto insists, is sui generis: it is a distinctively religious kind of fear which befits our relation to God, and while it is akin to the fear we associate with the “weird,” it is not to be simply conflated with this or any other kind of fear. Here, then, God is taken to be presented in our affective responses, and these responses can play this sort of role because they are assigned a distinctive phenomenological character, which marks them out from the kinds of feeling that arise elsewhere in human life. (Contrast the dialectical model of the relationship between perception and feeling that is envisaged in Alvin Plantinga's discussion of Jonathan Edwards: Plantinga 2000, pp. 301–303.)

Otto extends this account to provide a theory of religious language — doctrinal claims are, he thinks, an attempt to convey in rational, conceptually articulate terms the content of a “numinous” experience that is itself conceptually inarticulate. So here, far from thought generating a correlative feeling, it is feeling and its implicit reckoning with some transcendent reality which comes first, and discursive thought which follows on behind, trying to stammer out what is known in full only in the relevant experience. One implication of this account is, clearly, that the idea of God has some phenomenological content.

2.2 Emotional feelings and relationship to material context

This understanding of emotional feelings can also be brought into fruitful dialogue with the second of our models of religious experience, according to which religious experience is not so much a matter of encountering God directly, but is rather concerned with finding a relevant meaning in the ordering of some material context.

Peter Goldie notes that when a person falls on ice for the first time, they may come to a new understanding of the dangers presented by ice, where this additional increment of understanding is in some way embedded in their new fearfulness of ice, and may resist formulation in linguistic terms. As he puts the point: “Coming to think of it [ice] in this new way is not to be understood as consisting of thinking of it in the old way, plus some added-on phenomenal ingredient — feeling perhaps; rather, the whole way of experiencing, or being conscious of, the world is new…” (Goldie 2000, pp. 59–60). We might suppose in particular that what has changed is that ice has come to assume a new salience in the person's experience of the world, with the result that their perceptual field is differently structured when they are in the presence of ice, so as to give particular prominence to ice.

Again, there are parallels here with the literature in ethics which has treated moral perception not so much as a matter of identifying some new fact in a situation of moral choice, but rather of seeing the relative importance of various facts, and seeing which in particular deserve attention or call for some practical response. For example, the virtuous person may not be able to list some further fact concerning the circumstances of various people in a crowded railway carriage, but the fact that a particular passenger is over-burdened by their bags and in some discomfort because they have to stand may weigh with this person. This fact may come to be salient in their perception of the situation, and salience here may be in part a matter of their felt response to the passenger and their predicament. (Compare Blum 1994, pp. 31–33.)

In the same sort of way we might suppose that the religious believer who is approaching a sacred site of the kind that Barrie describes will need to have their attention focussed appropriately. And we might think that this is the role of the various thresholds and their associated challenges for the body. It is because they engender and give expression to the right kind of emotional responsiveness, broadly one of reverential seriousness, that these preparatory behaviours pave the way for a proper appropriation of the sacred space itself. Here, then, rather as with the train example, religious experience takes the form of viewing some material context with appropriate salience. (Compare Jonathan Z. Smith's (1987) proposal that it is the quality of attention accorded to sacred objects, in a given context, rather than something intrinsic to these objects, that marks them out from other kinds of object.)

3. Mundane experience and religious belief

We have been exploring various ways in which the phenomenology of religious experience may be construed, in affective and other terms. It is also reasonable to suppose that the quality of the believer's strictly mundane experience will be in some respects conditioned by their religious commitments, or will need in any case to show some sort of consonance with those commitments.

Nicholas Wolterstorff comments for example on how this world

represents a success on the part of God — God who is love — not a failure. In contemplation of what He had made God found delight. But also God knew that what He had made would serve well his human creatures. So God pronounced His ‘Yes’ upon it all, a ‘Yes’ of delight and of love. You and I must do no less. (1980, p. 69)

We might suppose, then, that the doctrine of creation implies a correlative affectively toned phenomenology, one which is open to taking delight in the world, in its materiality.

We have been considering some connections between the phenomenology of religious experience and religious epistemology. But we might also suppose that emotional experience, for example, is relevant to the epistemology of religious belief in other, less direct ways: not now because it is bound up with an experience of God or some sacred space, but just by virtue of its role in signalling that certain matters are properly the object of attention. In this way too, the phenomenology of mundane experience turns out to be religiously important.

Evolutionary accounts of emotional experience commonly emphasise the role of the emotions in constituting patterns of salience. It is obviously of adaptive value if, for example, a large, fast-approaching dog is afforded a certain salience in my perceptual field, while the colour of the linoleum floor on which I am standing is consigned to the periphery of my awareness. And to feel fear of the dog is to view the scene with such salience. (Compare Oatley and Jenkins, 1996.) Here emotional responses help to frame rational thought, by determining what it is appropriate to attend to and in turn to reason about. And arguably similar connections hold in religious contexts.

For instance, speaking of revelation, John Henry Newman comments:

That earnest desire of it, which religious minds cherish, leads the way to the expectation of it. Those who know nothing of the wounds of the soul, are not led to deal with the question, or to consider its circumstances; but when our attention is roused, then the more steadily we dwell upon it, the more probable does it seem that a revelation has been or will be given to us. (1979, p. 328)

In this way, a person's emotional experience can mark out certain matters as deserving of closer attention, and thereby it may prepare the way for a deepened religious understanding. Here the phenomenology of the experience in constituting a certain pattern of salience is once again crucial. But in this case the experience is not directly or indirectly of God, but in the first instance of the condition of one's soul. William James takes a similar line when he says of “dogmatic or idealistic theology” that “these speculations must … be classed as over-beliefs, buildings-out performed by the intellect into directions of which feelings originally supplied the hint”, giving as an example of such feelings “inner unhappiness and the need of deliverance” (1902, p. 431). (For the importance of emotional responses in framing rational thought, see also Damasio 1995, pp. 193–194.)

4. Two contrasting emphases in the study of religion

We have been examining some of the ways in which the phenomenology of human experience may be relevant to the content of religious belief (e.g., to a religiously resonant account of the concept of God's presence) and to the question of its epistemic standing (e.g., to the question of the intentionality of religious experience). When such considerations are squeezed out of an account of human religiousness, this is likely to be because of a preference for doctrine or practice as the central category in terms of which religion is to be understood. So we can think of two correlative challenges for any approach which makes some appeal to phenomenology: perhaps such an account fails to reckon with the doctrinal content of religious “belief,” and perhaps it overlooks the role of religious practice in defining religious traditions.

The first objection makes most sense if we are working with a relatively simple distinction between doctrines (creedal items derived from, say, the Bible or later theological reflection) and experience. But in practice doctrine and experience are likely to be mutually informing, and it is reasonable to suppose that in some cases religious insight involves a kind of amalgam of a doctrinal scheme and associated experience, where these elements cannot in any simple way be separated out.

Newman makes this sort of point when he distinguishes a “notion” from a “real image” of God (1979, p. 108). A notion of God is an abstract conception of God, while a real image of God, he tends to think, presupposes the notion, but deepens it by way of affectively toned, first hand experience of God. So for example, to have encountered God in the call of conscience, in the experience of remorse, is thereby to have a new understanding of the sense in which God is properly called judge, although the additional increment of understanding may not be readily verbalisable. (Compare Goldie on our knowledge of the dangerousness of ice.)

Other commentators have thought that phenomenological treatments of religion risk overlooking the central role of practices in constituting religious traditions. In his study Beyond Phenomenology, Gavin Flood remarks for example that: “It is ritual structures and performed narratives which have primacy in the transmission of traditions through the generations and not any individual experience or state of consciousness” (1999, p. 107). Again, as with doctrine, so here we might wish to avoid any overly sharp disjunction of phenomenology and practice.

This point can be made particularly succinctly by considering again the case of emotional feelings. Such feelings involve patterns of salient viewing, we have seen; but they are also connected to the posture of the body. To feel fear for example is in part to register the tensing of the body, and in turn therefore its taking stock of a particular environment, and its making ready to act in that environment (Solomon 2003 and Pickard 2003). So the intellectual content of an emotional feeling, concerning what is deserving of attention in a given context of choice, is we might suppose realised both in a correlative structuring of the perceptual field, and in a kinaesthetic appreciation of the body's readiness to act in that context.

Depending on the details of the case, we might want to see the expressive posture of the body as coming first, and giving rise to a certain ordering of the perceptual field, or vice versa. But here we seem to have two ways of grasping a certain content; and these two ways seem to be held together by the relevant emotional feeling, since such feelings are realised both in a certain pattern of salient viewing and in the feeling of a correlative posture of the body.

So here “practice,” or the readiness of the body to act in certain ways in the world, is not straightforwardly separable from “doctrine” (a conceptually organised appreciation of the world) or emotional feeling. Instead these three make up a unitary state of mind. And similarly, we might suppose, certain religious practices are reciprocally implicated in correlative ways of seeing, and in turn in correlative doctrines, in ways that resist any easy disaggregation or prioritisation. Max Scheler makes something like this sort of point when he suggests that different postures of the body in prayer reciprocally define different conceptions of God (1960, p. 266); and again we might see similar connections displayed in the responses of the body that are implied in the approach to a sacred site.

In sum then, rather than giving precedence to doctrine- or practice-based accounts of religion, we might suppose that these accounts will themselves come fully into focus only when they are combined with an appreciation of the phenomenology of religion.


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