Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Personal Autonomy

1. All such “hierarchical” accounts are responses to, and developments of, the work of Harry Frankfurt. (See Frankfurt 1988c) Frankfurt has modified his own original account many times. (See Frankfurt, 1988e, 1988f, 1999b, 2002b, 2002d)

2. See Watson 1975. Whereas hierarchical accounts tend to reflect sympathies with Hume's philosophy of mind, Watson explicitly allies himself with Plato.

3. Bernard Berofsky calls attention to the fact that there is support “across a broad spectrum” of theorizing in psychology and psychiatry for the idea that certain inner states undermine autonomy by creating “barriers to objectivity.” They do this, he explains, by “persisting in a way that removes them from experiential review and the influence of newly acquired information.” (Berofsky 1995, p. 199) For two more examples of contemporary philosophical accounts that stress the importance of the autonomous agent's responsiveness to reasons, see Wolf, 1990 and Fischer and Ravizza,1993. (See also note 7.) These philosophers argue that responsiveness to reasons is a necessary condition of moral responsibility. But in presenting and defending their views, they suggest that unless an agent satisfies this condition, she does not really govern herself. As Wolf puts it, they are interested in the “relation to one's will which is necessary in order for one's actions … to be ‘up to oneself' in the way that is necessary for responsibility.” (4) (For more on this relation, see note 9.) (Note that Wolf reserves the term ‘autonomy' for one particular conception of this self-relation: the incompatibilist view that an agent's control over her behavior must be “ultimate” — that “her will must be determined by her self, and her self must not, in turn, be determined by anything external to itself” (10).) According to Wolf, responsiveness to reasons is a necessary supplement to a coherentist condition: “a person's status as a responsible agent rests not only on her ability to make her behavior conform to her deepest values but also on her ability to form, assess, and revise those values on the basis of a recognition and appreciation of … the True and the Good.” In stressing that an autonomous agent “must be in a position that allows her reasons to be governed by what reasons there are… [i.e.,] by what is valuable and worthless” (117-118), Wolf evokes a tradition that goes back to Plato. But she rejects the Platonic conception of values as “things” that can be “apprehended by some special faculty” (123). Fischer and Ravizza likewise try to steer clear of controversial metaethical assumptions. “Regular reasons-receptivity” is, they argue, essential to having “guidance control” over one's action. “It involves a pattern of actual and hypothetical recognition of reasons (some of which are moral reasons) that is understandable by some appropriate external observer. And the pattern must be at least minimally grounded in reality.” (90) (Unlike Wolf, Fischer and Ravizza do not think that reasons responsiveness suffices for moral responsibility. They believe that in order for an agent to “own” the reasons-responsive mechanism that produces his action, he must “take responsibility” for it. To do this, he must “see himself as an agent” and “accept that he is a fair target of the reactive attitudes as a result of how he exercises this agency in certain contexts” (210-211).)

4. Note that if one thinks that someone can be an autonomous agent without being accountable for her behavior, then one may have a different rationale for insisting that an agent must be responsive to reasons in order to be accountable for her behavior. See note 9.

5. The importance of acquiring motives in a way that is responsive to one's own reasoning is taken for granted by most writers on autonomy — though it is widely acknowledged that agents need not actively deliberate prior to every autonomous action. On this view autonomy is “achieved when the individual subjects the norms with which he or she is confronted to critical evaluation and then proceeds to reach practical decisions by way of independent and rational reflection” (Young 1986). In other words, one's conduct is autonomous only if one exercises “assorted introspective, imaginative, reasoning, and volitional skills.” (Meyers 1987) A procedural requirement of this kind is often grafted onto coherentist accounts. Thus, in his early work, Gerald Dworkin argues that someone who identifies with his motives lacks autonomy if this identification reflects the fact that he has “been influenced in decisive ways by others in such a fashion that we are not prepared to think of it as his own choice” (Dworkin 1976, 25,) (In later work, Dworkin suggests that an autonomous agent need not actually identify with her motives as long as she is capable of altering her preferences in light of her uncompelled reflection.) (Dworkin 1988, 17) For some examples of recent attempts to work out the details of such a condition, see Mele 1995 and Christman 1991. Mele argues that an autonomous agent must be capable of reflecting critically upon her desires, and of altering them in light of this reflection. Similarly, Christman stresses the importance of the autonomous agent's ability to reflect (in a “minimally rational” way) on the process whereby she acquired a given desire. He argues that someone acts autonomously when she is moved by a given desire, only if she would not reject the desire if she reflected on its genesis.)

6. As Dworkin puts it, what is necessary for autonomy is “some ability both to alter one's preferences and to make them effective in one's actions” (Dworkin 1988).

7. Some of those who press this point champion the “relational” aspects of autonomy. They stress the extent to which whether a person governs herself depends on her social circumstances. (See Mackenzie and Stoljar) Many of these philosophers are struck, in particular, by the challenges posed when a member of an oppressed group internalizes the notion that she is not fully qualified to be self-governing. This sort of case, they argue, reveals the relation between responsiveness to reasons and self-respect and/or self-trust. (See Benson 1994 and 2000)

8. For a powerful defense of the incompatibilist position, see van Inwagen 1983. Much of the debate over the relationship between causal determinism, on the one hand, and autonomy, free will, and moral responsibility, on the other, consists of attempts to challenge and defend the modal argument that is at the heart of this defense. This argument spells out the widespread intuition that someone does not govern her own action if it was caused in a way she could do nothing to control. Frankfurt's alleged counterexamples to this “Principle of Alternative Possibilities” have also been the focus of intense philosophical debate. (See Frankfurt 1988b) For a thorough discussion of the modal argument for incompatibilism, see Fischer 1994. For an attempt to work out a rigorous incompatibilist conception of autonomy, see Kane1996. According to Kane, the desire to be an autonomous agent is the desire to have “the power to be the ultimate producers of [one's] own ends… the power to make choices which can only and finally be explained in terms of [one's] own [will] (i.e., character, motives, and efforts of will).” “No one,” he argues, “can have this power in a determined world.” (254)

9. The chief advocate of this approach is David Velleman. (See Velleman 2006) Intentions, he claims, are a special sort of belief that the agent has the power to make true. “Our expectation of doing something embodies an invention rather than a discovery. For we can simply adopt the expectation that we're going to do any one of the things for which we have some antecedent motives, and this expectation will modify the balance of forces so as to make itself true. We are thus in a position to make up our forthcoming behavior. Making up what we will do is, in fact, our way of making up our minds to do it.” (24)

10. Insofar as there is a distinction between claiming that someone is a (more or less) autonomous person and claiming that she governs herself when she acts, this is because the former claim attributes a capacity to the person, together with a disposition to exercise it under at least most circumstances.

11.Attempts to make sense of weakness of will go back to Plato and Aristotle. For some more recent discussions, see Donald Davidson 1980, Gary Watson 1977, Michael Bratman 1979, Alfred Mele 1995, Sarah Buss 1997 and Sarah Stroud and Christine Tappolet 2003. (Recently, Richard Holton has pointed out that there is a familiar conception of weakness of will according to which it is not a failure to conform to one's contemporaneous all-things-considered evaluative judgment but a failure to follow through on an earlier resolution. (See Holton 1999)

12. The example is Frankfurt's (Frankfurt 2002b). The mother, he says, may be “glad to be putting her need for the relationship above what is best by a measure that she now refuses to regard as decisive” (163). More generally, Frankfurt argues that “the fact that something is important to someone is a circumstance that naturally has its causes, but it may neither originate in, nor be at all supported by, reasons. It may simply be a brute fact, which is not derived from any assessment or appreciation whatever” (161). “Suppose,” Frankfurt elsewhere writes, “I were to conclude for some reason that it is not desirable for me to seek the well-being of my children. I suspect that I would continue to love them and to care about their well-being anyhow. This discrepancy between my judgment and my desire would not show that I had become alienated from the desire.” (Frankfurt 2002, 223) For a thorough discussion of Frankfurt's position, see Watson 2002.

13. For a defense of the view that there must be a constitutive aim of agency, see David Velleman, 2000b See also Velleman 2000c. Velleman has recently expressed reservations about identifying the underlying aim with the disposition to govern one's own behavior. But Christine Korsgaard has defended this Kantian idea. (See Korsgaard 2009.)

14. Note that to be “accountable” is not necessarily to satisfy the conditions that justify others in holding one accountable. As Gary Watson points out, holding someone accountable for wrongdoing involves reacting adversely to this person; and this means that whether one is justified in holding someone accountable depends on whether it is fair to react adversely to what she does. The answer to this question may depend on more than whether she governs her action. It may depend, for example, on whether she had the conceptual capacities we expect a moral agent to exercise. (See Watson 2004) Note further that some philosophers (most notably Peter Strawson) have argued that there is no important conception of accountability according to which the judgment that someone is praiseworthy or blameworthy presupposes the further judgment that she has determined her own action in some special way. This skepticism appears to be supported by the very concerns raised in this section: if we cannot spell out the special metaphysical condition that renders agents accountable for their actions, then it is tempting to conclude that whether someone is accountable for her actions is not a metaphysical matter after all. (For an exploration of the Strawsonian approach to moral responsibility, see Watson 1993. For a more recent attempt to develop a Strawsonian approach, see Wallace 1994. See also Arpaly 2006.)

15. Thomas Reid is an early champion of this approach. More recently, agent-causation theories have been defended by Richard Taylor and Roderick Chisholm; and more recently still, by Randolph Clarke and Timothy O'Connor.

16. See, for example, Korsgaard 1996 and Bok 1998. As Bok explains,

When I act for reasons, the events that cause me to act as I do might be external to me, but the reasons that I regard as determining what I do cannot be. For while, qua event, my acceptance of some reason for action might or might not ultimately be caused by something outside myself, in regarding it as a reason for action I must regard it as having a justification that is independent of those causes. This justification might at various points appeal to theoretical claims. But I cannot regard it, qua justification, as having been produced or foisted on me by any natural event. When I consider it as a justification, I consider not its causal origins but its rational grounds; and I accept or reject it on that basis. When I explain what leads me to accept it, I will adduce not the causes that led me to do so, but the reasons that convinced me that it was sound. Because any reasons I adduce must themselves be reasons I accept, this type of explanation will not ultimately lead me to adduce determining factors that I do not regard as my own.(206)

For essentially the same point in a less Kantian context, see D.M. McKay 1960 and 1973, and Hampshire 1983. Like others, they point out that the question “How will A act?” has no determinate answer for A until she decides how to act. What is a simple fact from the perspective of a third-person observer is not a fact from the perspective of the agent herself. Similarly, David Velleman argues that the freedom that counts where autonomous agency is concerned is epistemic freedom with respect to one's alternatives (Velleman 2000).

This essential formal feature of the practical point of view is at the center of most existentialist conceptions of human agency. Thus, for example, Jean-Paul Sartre claims that “[M]otives are only for consciousness. And due to the very fact that the motive can arise only as appearance, it constitutes itself as ineffective. … [C]onsciousness is not subject to it because of the very fact that consiciousness posits it; for consciousness has now the task of conferring on the motive its meaning and its importance” (Sartre 1956, 71).