Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Peirce's Logic

1. Peano's arithmetic, Russell and Whitehead's systems, Gentzen's natural deductive systems, Hilbert's programs, and Gödel's incompleteness theorems are prime examples.

2. See the papers by Brady, Burch, Iliff, and Merrill in Houser et al. (eds.) 1997.

3. For a number of manuscripts written between these two papers, see Dipert 2004, pp. 297-299.

4. According to Peirce's terminology, there are three kinds of predicates, ‘absolute terms,’ ‘simple relative terms,’ and ‘conjugative terms’ (CP 3.63). These correspond to monadic, dyadic, and ternary predicates, in modern terminology. Also, there is a controversy between ‘relatives’ and ‘relations.’ See Merrill, pp. 160-163. “I conclude that [Peirce's] simple relative terms stand for dyadic relations” (p. 162).

5. “Some As are Bs” is an existential statement. Peirce and others called them particular propositions. “As for particular propositions, Boole could not accurately express them at all” (CP, 3.138).

6. In Boole's expressions, the variable v is somewhat special: It denotes an “indefinite class.” There are alternative notations adopted by Peirce for existential statements: 0ab = 0 (for “Some a is b”) and 0ab = 0 (for “Some a is not b.”) (CP, 3.141). For Mitchell, refer to his “On a new algebra of logic,” in Studies in Logic, Peirce (ed.), p. 75.

7. Benjamin Peirce placed mathematics before logic. Charles Peirce gave full credit to his father's warning against not-so-mathematical philosophical reasoning that steered him away from his early ambition to combine philosophy, logic, and mathematics [CP, 1.560].

8. “On the syllogism No. IV, and on the Logic of Relations” (1859).

9. Houser correctly observes that “[w]hat is most evident in his work is the importance Peirce attached to his basic analysis of relations” (p. 14).

10. This emerges later as an issue of non-computability with relations (Dipert 1983) and a distinction between corollarial and theorematic reasoning (Hintikka 1980 and Shin 1994).

11. A pair could consist of identical objects.

12. We return to this issue below, when Peirce's existential graphs are discussed.

13. Is it the same as Boole's enterprise? A subtle important difference in the relation between mathematics and logic in Boole and Peirce was nicely explored in §2 of Van Evra 1997.

14. The collection in Houser et al. 1997 has many valuable papers on these issues. See the ones by Van Evra, Merrill, Brady, Iliff, and Burch.

15. American Journal of Mathematics, 3 (1880): 15–57, and reprinted in CP, 3.154–3.251.

16. “Brief description of the algebra of relatives” (Ms, Dated, 1882), CP, 3.306–3.322.

17. Note B, pp. 187-203 in Johns Hopkins Studies in Logic, edited by Peirce. Reprinted in CP, 3.328–3.358.

18. The American Journal of Mathematics, 7/2 (1885): 180–202, and reprinted in CP, 3.359–3.403.

19. CP, 3.396. Our modern notation is used here. The expression ‘φ(x)’ is a formula whose unbound variable is x. More rules are found in the undated Note, CP, 3.403A–3.403M.

20. Why EG was neglected is another story which the entry does not aim to explore fully, but is an interesting project.

21. For example, CP, 3.359–3.362, and CP, 2.247–2.249. Also, see Dipert 1996.

22. Popular Science Monthly, 12 (January 1878): 286–302 and reprinted in CP, 5.388–5.410.

23. For the comparison between these two graphical systems, see Shin 2002, pp. 48-53.

24. For more details, see Shin 2002, §4.3.

25. If we desire to match the syntax and the reading method in an obvious way, we may have the following alternative definition for well-formed diagrams:

  1. An empty space is a well-formed diagram.
  2. Any letter is a well-formed diagram.
  3. If D is a well-formed diagram, then a single cut of D (‘[D]’) is a well-formed diagram as well.
  4. If D1 and D2 are well-formed diagrams, then all of the followings are also well-formed:
    1. D1 D2
    2. [D1 D2]
    3. [D1 [D2]]
    4. [[D1][D2]]
  5. Nothing else is a well-formed diagram.

26. For the proof of the legitimacy of the Multiple readings algorithm, refer to Shin 2002, §4.2.2 where the equivalence of the Endoporeutic and the Multiple readings is proven.

27. “For any graph P, let ‘{P}’ denote the place of P” (Roberts 1973, p. 38). [My footnote.]

28. For a more recent improvement of Shin's reading, see Dau 2006.

29. Examples in Peirce (CP, 4.455) nicely illustrate the visual effect of an identity line.

30. See CP, 4.458. X is evenly (oddly) enclosed if and only X is enclosed by an even (odd) number of cuts.

31. See p. 51. For more complex examples, see CP, 4.502 and 4.571.

32. According to the Endoporeutic reading, we get the following reading first: “It is not the case that something is good but not ugly.” If we adopt the Multiple readings, we may directly obtain the above reading “Everything good is ugly.”