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First published Tue Jun 12, 2007

Olympiodorus of Alexandria, presumably a pupil of Ammonius Hermeiou, the commentator on Aristotle, teacher of Simplicius and Philoponus, was one of the last pagans to teach philosophy at the school of Alexandria in the 6th century. In his lectures, he interpreted classical philosophical texts, mainly by Plato and Aristotle; we still possess three of his commentaries on Plato and two on Aristotle. At times, these seem to be carefully crafted pieces of pedagogy, but at other times they read more like transcripts drawn up by one of the students. Although Olympiodorus comes across as a very learned man and guardian of traditional paideia, both literary and philosophical, his œuvre compares unfavorably, from a philosophical standpoint, with commentaries written by either Ammonius or Olympiodorus' contemporaries such as Simplicius and John Philoponus. Still, his work is valuable in that it affords us vivid insights into the way in which pagan philosophy was taught to young members of the Christian elite who, for the most part, would move into careers in the clergy or at the Byzantine court. The 6th century Alexandrian Olympiodorus must be distinguished from another Olympiodorus who supposedly lived in the first half of the 5th century C.E. and was said by Marinus in his Life of Proclus to have been a teacher of the latter at Athens. No better evidence of this earlier figure survives. The relationship of the younger philosopher Olympiodorus to an alchemist, supposedly of the same name and provenance, remains a matter of dispute.

1. Life

There are exactly three more or less solid facts on the basis of which one can reconstruct the general parameters of Olympiodorus' life. First, he held the chair of philosophy in Alexandria (the majority of manuscripts of his work refer to him as “the philosopher of Alexandria”). Second, he saw himself as intellectual heir to Ammonius (see in Meteor. 153,7; 175,14; 188,36; 238,19; 255,23; 256,27; Olympiodorus refers to Ammonius frequently as “the great philosopher”, in one case as “our philosopher”, in Gorg. §40.5; cf. §39.2, and he may have been Ammonius' pupil). Third, some of his lectures were delivered not long after 565 (cf. in Meteor. 52,31; the way Olympiodorus reminds his students about a comet that had appeared in March/April 565 suggests that the event occurred a couple of years earlier). It is generally assumed that Ammonius passed away (or at least stopped teaching) sometime in the period between 517 and 526. If these dates are correct, we can infer that Olympiodorus was a young man when he came to be one of the last pupils of Ammonius and that he led an active intellectual life into his late sixties, or early seventies of that century. Accordingly, the dates of Olympiodorus' life should be approximately 500–570, encompassing the entire reign of emperor Justinian the Great (527–565). Since John Philoponus was teaching philosophy actively until the mid-30s (without ever holding the chair of philosophy), it seems likely that Olympiodorus began his teaching career around that time to become the official successor to Ammonius.

The best way to understand the circumstances of his life is to get a sense of the final period of pagan philosophy in the age of Justinian (for a more detailed account, see Wildberg 2005, with further references). For our purposes, the most important factor is that in the age of Justinian, philosophy, as a discipline taught in schools of higher education, had acquired a highly ambiguous status. On the one hand, almost anyone in the empire was perfectly aware of the fact that Justinian had, right from the beginning of his reign, taken severe measures to eradicate philosophy as a way of pagan life and learning, both private and public. The closing of the Athenian School around 529 (with an apparent expropriation of its property) is only the most notorious example. On the other hand, members of the elite were evidently also acutely aware that it was impossible to sustain the culture of the empire, both secular and clerical, without a classical education, part of which was and always had been, philosophy. A training in philosophy was all the more necessary since only a firm grounding in logic and ontology could prepare one in a meaningful way for participation in the subtle theological debates that dominated the best minds at the time, notably the intractable problem of the nature of Christ: Does Christ have two natures, one human, one divine, or one compound nature? How can one possibly understand the side-by-side of divinity and humanity in a single substance? One could not hope to become an expert in theology (then regarded as the highest form of philosophy) without having exposed oneself in a serious way to the works of Aristotle and Plato. And so, under the emperor who did perhaps more than anyone to cripple philosophy, philosophy flourished — in Alexandria especially, but also elsewhere — in a manner unparalleled in late antiquity.

This is the world to which Olympiodorus belonged, a highly trained pagan philosopher rendering his services to an (at least officially) entirely Christian audience. Undoubtedly, the religious presuppositions of his students, their needs, interests, and expectations, determined to a large extent the parameters and content of his classes, and, as we shall see, foregrounded the need for a considerable amount of pedagogy on the part of the lecturer. It is clear that even if he had wanted to, Olympiodorus could not have expounded the views of Plato and Aristotle with the same zeal and conviction as, for example, Simplicius, who had no audience to lecture to (once Justinian had closed the school in Athens). To be sure, philosophy was alive and well in the imperial institutions, but the latter were confined on all sides by the walls of orthodoxy and heresy. This is what has to be kept in mind before one joins the chorus of detractors who bewail the philosophical paucity of Olympiodorus' commentaries. (For a list of his works, see below, sect. 6.)

2. Commentaries on Plato

Olympiodorus begins his commentary on Plato's Alcibiades with a grand gesture: “Aristotle began his own Theology with the words: ‘All men by nature desire to know, and evidence for this is our love of perception’. But as I begin to speak about Plato's philosophy, I would say this, which is better, that all men have a desire for Plato's philosophy, because all men want to draw something useful from it; they hurry to be spell-bound by its fountain and stand still only when they are full of Platonic enthusiasm.” Olympiodorus is working hard to galvanize his audience with his own passion for Plato; but it is characteristic of his entire work that he holds out for them, in the first place, that something useful is to be gained from the study of Plato.

Useful in what sense? As if piecing together a Byzantine mosaic, Olympiodorus hands his students the shards and tesserae that could amount, in the appropriate number and arrangement, to classical paideia. His commentaries on Plato abound with references to Homer, Demosthenes, the 2nd-century C.E. orator Aelius Aristides, Plutarch, Epictetus and Aristotle as well as works of Plato other than the one being commented on, notably the Republic, even if his students had not read it yet. One gets the impression that Olympiodorus gently but firmly directs his pupils' attention to an intellectual world waiting for them to discover it — if they want to. We are entering a period in late antiquity in which Plato and Aristotle cease to be gateways to the ‘truth’ and turn into some kind of cultural heritage that was worth keeping alive for other reasons. Olympiodorus has rightly been called “the first classicist” (Tarrant 1997).

This effort to stem the tide of cultural pauperization was carefully packaged and structured, without depriving the lecturer of the necessary amount of flexibility: each class (praxis) was divided into three sections. The reading of the original Platonic (or Aristotelian) text was followed by an ‘overview’ over the passage (theôria), which in turn segued into a closer reading (lexis). The overview allowed the professor to make all kinds of general remarks on the significance and meaning of the passage under discussion; the close reading presented more detailed and often simply philological, linguistic, logical, or rhetorical observations not unlike those found in our modern annotated editions. The procedure of dividing one's comments into these two different sections seems to be a formalized development of Proclus' work (see Beutler 1949, 226).

Falsehood or truth in philosophical matters (somewhat abstractly enshrined for Olympiodorus in ‘common notions’ [koinai ennoiai]) is not something he much talks about. The reason may not have been that he harbored no such convictions, but that they would have been inappropriate or unwanted in the classroom. Very often, what has proved most interesting to modern scholars for historical reasons are remarks made entirely in passing, for example the puzzling statement that some of the endowment of the Academy in Athens was still intact in his time (in Alc. §141.1f.); that the Alexandrian rhetor Anatolius adapted a line of Homer to great effect in the year 546 (in Alc. §2.79–82); or that suicide is forbidden because, according to the Orphic tradition, “human bodies belong to Dionysus” (in Phaed. §1.3).

Occasionally, we encounter an anecdote about Ammonius, whom Olympiodorus clearly revered and whom he invokes frequently to inflate his own authority. One such anecdote is suggestive of a tension between imperial rule and the political views of the philosophers. Near the end of the Gorgias commentary (§42), Olympiodorus endorses the view that aristocracy is the best form of government and far superior to democracy, and he justifies this by claiming that the city, just like the human being, is a microcosm that should resemble the macrocosm ‘universe’. But this argument seems to favor monarchy; for just as the universe is ruled by one, i.e., God, there “should not be a number of ordinary people who rule, but one prudent and true statesman.” Olympiodorus continues: “Now, if somebody says ‘But this is monarchy, not aristocracy, and that is not the same thing’, reply as the philosopher Ammonius replied: ‘Give him the knuckles and praise him. For it is the same, … even if there are many exceedingly good people, the form a living unit, for they have everything in common.’” (§42.2)

One question to ask is how the opposed positions of teacher and student, paganism and Christianity, ancient and ‘modern’ played out in Olympiodorus' classroom? Here are some illustrative examples. The Delphic oracle still seemed to enjoy an awe-inspiring reputation, but the names of Greek gods in Plato's text, especially Zeus, are often omitted and/or replaced by the word ‘God’. Olympiodorus has trouble showing his students ways in which to make sense of pagan divinities in their effort to adapt pagan philosophy to the Christian context: “Do not be disturbed by names when you hear talk of a ‘Power of Cronus’ or a ‘Power of Zeus’ or suchlike, but concentrate on the objects themselves, for we signify something different when we use these names. If you wish, think that these powers do not have individual essences and are not distinct from one another, but place them within the first cause and say that there are within it both intellectual and vital powers” (in Gorg. §47.2).

At times the underlying tensions rise to the surface, but Olympiodorus was expertly evasive of trouble from the audience. In his 44th lecture on the Gorgias, for instance, he reassures his students that pagan myths ought not to be taken literally; one ought to understand that names such as Zeus and Hera and Hades were merely part of the language in which ‘they’ (i.e., the ancient Greeks) talked. Puzzled by the vertiginous and conflicting possibilities of allegorical and non-allegorical interpretations of myth, once they are not taken literally, one obstinate student must have intervened, for Olympiodorus makes the following evasive remark (§44.7): “If someone says ‘Then neither ought we put trust in philosophers, since they are in disagreement, some saying the soul is water, others that it is air, some that it is mortal, others that it is immortal’, we reply that in this case we put our trust in those who stay closer to the common notions. But [in myths] there are no common notions to guide our education. Hence we should first explicate the myths — for indeed Plato explicates them. So he said earlier …”.

Even if some students were repelled by the general world-view of paganism, it is clear that many of them were fascinated by its more sinister aspects. At one point in the Gorgias (513a), Socrates mentions in passing certain Thessalian witches who pull down the moon and cause an eclipse. In Lecture 39 on the Gorgias, Olympiodorus explains the story behind these witches in a few broad strokes, apparently to his own satisfaction. But witchcraft was just the thing students wanted to hear a bit more about from the pagan philosopher, so Lecture 40 begins like this: “Since last time I referred to the Thessalian women, it is worth explaining the practice, why people think wizards draw down the moon [at an eclipse], and why ordinary people beat on bronze. Note that an eclipse is nothing other than the privation of light. During this privation in particular, while it is dark, certain infernal demons wander around, since the world is without light. Then unholy and God-hating wizards cast spells to attract these demons. Hence the multitude believes that they draw down the moon. And since at such time demons are among us, people beat on bronze, thereby casting off and driving the demonic interference away. I have dealt with these things because you are not without ideas about these customs. Now let me come to the present topic.” Philosophically, all this is of no interest at all, but looking at it from a cultural point of view one gets a fascinating whiff of the bewildering concerns of students reading Plato in the sixth century.

Being a pagan philosopher on the municipal payroll of the City of Alexandria—or worse, being dependent on voluntary student fees—must have been no enviable position. One can imagine that the act of playing the token philosopher in Alexandria and lecturing for decades on important matters which no-one in the audience any more really cared about took its toll. The Greek Anthology attributes to Olympiodorus an at the same time artful and depressing epigram (Anth. Gr., Appendix 177):

Had the writing of Plato not checked my impulse,
I would have loosened by now the grievous, baneful bond of life.

3. Commentaries on Aristotle

The Prolegomena to Aristotle's logic, or in a sense to his whole philosophical work, begins again with a carefully worded statement that is reminiscent of the first words of the Alcibiades commentary: “Since we want to enjoy the fountain of good things, there is an eagerness in us to cling to Aristotle's philosophy, which provides life with the principle of good things, and not the least because it leads the bright mind towards precision as to what is being sought.” (Proleg. 1,3–6). The Prolegomena consists of five lectures in which he gives his students a brief overview of the various schools of Greek philosophy and the division of the works of Aristotle; he explains, among other things, the aim of Aristotle's philosophy (recognition of the Good — apparently the prime mover of the Metaphysics — as the principle of everything, 9,14–30) and the moral an intellectual requirements of a student and of a teacher of philosophy (10,3–33). The various philosophical thinkers and schools are being introduced without evaluations of their philosophical merits, and there is no talk about the harmony of the philosophers in general, or between Plato and Aristotle. 

Olympiodorus adopts the view of Iamblichus that the subject-matter (skopos) of the Categories is speech signifying things by the mediation of thoughts (Proleg. 21,101–3; in Cat. 28,25ff), which conforms with the basic interpretation of the Categories in the school of Alexandria. Formally, too, the commentary resembles more than his other commentaries on Aristotle do the standard format familiar from other Neoplatonic commentators on Aristotle. Unlike the commentary on the Meteorology, which displays the typically Olympiodorean structure of being divided into praxeis which are then subdivided into longer expositions of the meaning of the passage under discussion (theôriai) and more detailed analyses of the text (lexeis), the commentary on the Categories is simply divided into theôriai (which don't seem to be further subdivided).

The Meteorology commentary begins without any significant introduction directly with Aristotle's text. It is impossible to tell whether his students, at that point, had worked their way through the (in the order of the curriculum) prior physical treatises, notably the Physics, de Caelo, and de Generatione et Corruptione. In any case, Olympiodorus makes no reference to lectures he had previously delivered on these texts; all he does is place the present work into the context of the other physical treatises. So he says, for example, that Aristotle wrote three treatises about the elementary bodies, the de Caelo, which concerns itself with them insofar as they are eternal, the de Generatione, which concerns their coming to be, and the Meteorology, which treats them as things that are “subject to influences” (pathainomena), a very unusual term the precise meaning of which Olympiodorus nowhere defines. The term occurs in Proclus, but in different contexts.

This commentary (written after 565) is of particular interest, since it is the only complete commentary on the Meteorology extant from antiquity. There is another commentary, written by the Christian John Philoponus some 30 years earlier, but it is incomplete (comments break off in the 12th chapter of Book I). This was, in fact, Philoponus' last commentary, written after the highly controversial contra Aristotelem and probably just at the time when he stopped teaching philosophy. Olympiodorus must have been familiar with the gist, if not the details, of Philoponus' searing criticism of Aristotle, yet he appears to be entirely unfazed by it. He announces early on the Aristotelian orthodoxy that there are five elements, not merely four, and that the celestial element (aithêr) is creative (poiêtikos), the other elements material (hulikos) (in Meteor. 2,15f). Strikingly, he happily reproduces Aristotle's argument for the existence of a fifth element from the de Caelo (the circularity of the celestial motion can only be explained on the assumption of a special celestial element, cf. in Meteor. 16,25–17,9). He polemicizes against the view that the heavens consist of fire (in Meteor. 17,1–18,30), and in no way qualifies, hides, or denies the fact (scandalous to Christians) that Aristotle thought the universe, and time, to be eternal (in Meteor. 8,8f;123,24f).

Olympiodorus' main influences in this commentary stem from Alexander of Aphrodisias, whom he cites frequently, and the views of Ammonius, which he was intimately familiar with. But Olympiodorus never refers to Philoponus. There are occasional references to certain unnamed people who proffered views Olympiodorus disagrees with (see e.g., 4,16; 7,22; 23,, but it is difficult to trace these views back to Philoponus. The latter seems to have been of no concern to him. Shockingly, perhaps, Olympiodorus simply ignores relevant and important intellectual work that was carried out in his own lifetime, in the same ‘university’, and even the same ‘department’ by a man he must have known personally. To Olympiodorus and his disciples, as with Simplicius in Athens, John Philoponus was evidently persona non grata.

4. Olympiodorus the Alchemist

Discussion of the commentary on Aristotle's Meteorology (with the co-called “chemical treatise” as its fourth book) prompts the question of the identity of the Neoplatonist Olympiodorus with another figure carrying precisely the same name who appears in the alchemist tradition. Four extant manuscripts of an alchemical work that purports to be a commentary on Zosimus' Kat’ energeian (On Activity) state that the piece was written by “Olympiodorus, the Alexandrian philosopher” (see §6 below). The alchemical treatise starts out as a commentary on Zosimus (of Panopolis, not the 5th c. C.E. historian), explaining a small passage in some detail, but then continues in the vein of a didactic letter written to an unnamed fellow alchemist (called ‘friend of the Muses’ at one point); it ‘explains’ how to join scattered parts of gold and purify metals, emphasizes the significance of ‘divine water’ (whatever that is) and so on and so forth. The author knows a smidgen about the Presocratics (whom he regards as alchemists), but next to nothing about Plato and Aristotle; instead, he can quote at length from Zosimus, Hermes, Petasius, Pelagius, and a “divine Mary” — not the mother of Jesus but a Jewish sage elsewhere attested in the alchemist tradition.

A closer survey of the text quickly reveals that scholars like H.D. Saffrey 2005 are right to suppose that the alchemical treatise cannot have been produced by the Neoplatonist philosopher. For one thing, unlike the philosopher, the alchemist seems to be a Christian, attributing a saying by Paul (“The letter kills, but the spirit gives life.” 2 Cor. 3.6) to “the Lord” (94, 13–15). In addition, contents, style, diction, as well as the whole rhetorical ambience created by the two authors are strikingly different. C. Viano 2006, who once defended the identity of the two figures and who still detects some similarities in language between the alchemical treatise and the commentary on Book IV of Aristotle's Meteorology, now proposes that the author of the alchemical treatise may have used Olympiodorus' Meteorology commentary, or another, more alchemical (rather than philosophical) work; the alchemist's manuscripts would then be testimony to the influence of Olympiodorus.

In any case, we can be quite sure that the Neoplatonist Olympiodorus did not write this piece of alchemy. Nevertheless, it seems to be clearly he whom the manuscripts refer to as the work's author. Since pseudepigraphy is one of the defining characteristics of the genre of alchemist literature, it seems safe to assume that the commentary on Zosimus is a false attribution. There never was another Alexandrian named Olympiodorus whose expertise was alchemy rather than Platonic philosophy.

5. Influence

The teaching of philosophy did not cease with the death of Olympiodorus. He evidently had intelligent pupils who devoted themselves to philosophy in a professional way. Whether they were pagans or Christians is not entirely clear, but their commentaries were passed around under such names as David and Elias. We can tell that they were influenced by Olympiodorus, not only because they refer to him, but also because they adopt his pedagogical method of dividing their lectures into theôriai and lexeis. The same goes for Stephanus of Alexandria, who taught philosophy in Constantinople at the beginning of the 7th century.

Olympiodorus' wider influence is somewhat less tangible than that of the other great Alexandrians. The Syrians and the Arabs certainly knew and read him, but not extensively. Neither did the Latin west. The commentary on the Categories has come down to us in only one manuscript (Codex Mutinensi 69), and there are only a handful of manuscripts of the Meteorology commentary. Manuscripts of his commentaries on Plato are equally rare, with the exception of those containing the Phaedo commentary. Yet, to medieval alchemists Olympiodorus' illustrious name sounded arcane enough to deserve induction into the fictitious canon of ancient alchemists.

6. List of extant works

  1. Prolegomena to Aristotle's Logic and Commentary on Aristotle's Categories: A. Busse, ed. (1902) Olympiodori Prolegomena et in Categorias Commentarium. Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca XII 1. Berlin: Reimer.
  2. Commentary on Aristotle's Meteorology: W. Stüve, ed. (1900) Olympiodori in Aristotelis Meteora Commentaria. Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca XII 2. Berlin: Reimer.
  3. Commentary on Plato's Alcibiades I: L. G. Westerink, ed. (1956) Olympiodorus. Commentary on the first Alcibiades of Plato. Amsterdam: North-Holland Publishing Company.
  4. Commentary on Plato's Gorgias: W. Norvin, ed. (1936) Olympiodori Philosophi in Platonis Gorgiam Commentaria. Leipzig: Teubner;  L.G. Westerink, ed. (1970) Olympiodorus. In Platonis Gorgiam Commentaria. Leipzig: Teubner. See also Jackson/Lycos/Tarrant 1998.
  5. Commentary on Plato's Phaedo: W. Norvin, ed. (1913) Olympiodori Philosophi in Platonis Phaedonem Commentaria. Leipzig: Teubner; L.G. Westerink, ed. (1976) The Greek Commentators on Plato's Phaedo, vol. I: Olympiodorus. Amsterdam: North-Holland Publishing Company.
  6. Life of Plato (= Introduction to the lectures on Plato's Alcibiades): A. Westermann, ed. (1862) Olympiodori Vita Platonis. In: Westermann, Olympiodori, Ammonii, Iamblichi, Porphyrii et aliorum Vitae Platonis, Aristotelis, Pythagorae, Platoni et Isidori. Paris: Didot, pp. 1–4. See also the Alcibiades commentary, No. 3 above, pp. 1–9.

Apart from these works, we possess scholia from Olympiodorus' commentary on Aristotle's de Interpretatione in the Codex Vaticanus Urbinas Graecus 35. The mutilated anonymous commentary on the de Interpretatione extant in Codex Parisinus Graecus 2064 and edited by L. Tarán 1978 has been wrongly ascribed to Olympiodorus. The same holds for the commentary on Plato's Philebus which, although attributed to Olympiodorus, has been shown by L. G. Westerink 1959 to be the work of Damascius.

Olympiodorus must have written a great deal more over his long career. He himself refers to a commentary on Porphyry's Introduction (see in Cat. 16,26; 60,10; 68,15.17); it was used by David and Elias. There must have been commentaries on Aristotle's Analytics (a late hand in the Jerusalem manuscript Taphos 150 attributes the commentary on the Prior Analytics contained therein to Olympiodorus) and on Aristotle's physical treatises (commentaries on de Generatione et Corruptione and on de Anima are mentioned in Arabic sources, and the Ambrosianus Q 74 possibly contains a fragment of the latter, see Rashed). In the Alcibiades commentary (§110,8f.), Olympiodorus announces lectures on the Sophist.

The work On the ‘On Activity’ by Zosimus; all that has been said by Hermes and the Philosophers should be regarded as a spurious work. For an edition see: Bertholet, M. and Ruelle, C.-M. (1888) Collection des anciens alchemistes grecs, vol. III, Paris: Steinheil, pp. 69–104. French translation in vol. II, pp. 75–113.


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Ammonius | David | Elias | Neoplatonism | Philoponus | Simplicius