Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Medieval Mereology

1. Thirteenth- and fourteenth-century logicians take great pains to distinguish these different distributive functions of terms because they believe that this will help them to resolve a number of sophisms (sophismata). Some of these sophisms involve the terms “whole” and “part”. For example, a number of later logicians tackled such sophisms as “The whole Socrates is less than Socrates” (Totus Sortes est minor Sorte) and “The whole Socrates is a part of Socrates” (Totus Sortes est pars Sortis). For an overview of syncategorematic terms and the application of the theory of distributive terms to the resolution of various sophismata, see Kretzmann 1982. On the categorematic and syncategorematic senses of “whole” and their application to mereologically themed questions, see Zupko 2003, 158-61, and Fitzgerald, 2009.

2. One must remember that Aristotle and his medieval students lived in periods of time well before organ transplants were even conceivable. I leave it as an exercise for the reader to think through the implications of modern medical technology on the Aristotelian distinction between substantial and accidental forms. 

3. Some modern interpreters have suggested that the Neoplatonic philosopher Porphyry, and by association, Boethius think that universals are collections of individuals (Cross 2002, and Zachhuber 2000). I have argued elsewhere that this cannot be Porphyry's or Boethius' understanding of universal wholes (Arlig 2005, 75-83). Professor Cross, in private conversation, has recanted his interpretation of Porphyry, although he still suspects that some Neoplatonically influenced thinkers, especially some of the early Greek Church Fathers, did in fact think that the universal is a concrete collection of particulars. Cross may well be right.

4. Here it is especially important to appreciate that my terminology is stipulated. In actual medieval discussions, substantial parts are given any number of names, including most confusingly the label “essential parts”. The genus and differentia, which are parts of the essence of a thing, must be carefully distinguished from what I have called substantial parts. While many medieval philosophers think that one can understand the unity of a definition as something analogous to the unity of a form with its matter, a genus is not literally matter and a differentia is not literally a form. We also need to distinguish both the essential parts of a definition and the substantial parts of a concrete substance from “parts principal in essence” (see Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus §§ 6-7 [= Cousin 1836, 507-8]), which to many modern readers are perhaps the truly essential—i.e. necessary—parts. It is also worth noting that some medieval philosophers distinguish between “quantitative” parts and “qualitative” parts (see, e.g., Albert of Saxony Sophismata 45 and 49, discussed in Fitzgerald, 2009, 61-6). The latter include not only substantial forms but also accidental forms, since they too do not lie side-by-side with one another, but rather one imbues and perfects the other. For example, the form of a statue (which is generally considered to be an accidental form) is in the same place as all the statue's bronze and it completes the being of the statue.

5. Even though no medieval philosopher endorsed the view that a part was the same as the whole, many nevertheless entertained the question “Whether the Whole and the Part are the Same” (Utrum totum et pars sint idem). See, for example, (pseudo) Siger of Brabant Quaestiones in Physicam, q. 19 (1941, 47) and Aquinas Commentaria in libros Physicorum, book 1, lect. 3, n. 3. Interestingly, many of these thinkers (including the two just mentioned) resolve the problem by appealing to the classic Aristotelian distinction between simpliciter and secundum quid predications. That is, if z consists of x and y, x is the same as z with respect to x and y is the same as z with respect to y. The rules of inference governing predications secundum quid and predications simpliciter prevent any untoward conclusions, such as x being the same as y.  

6. Here might be another example of someone who understands the phenomenon of mereological overlap. In a twelfth-century treatise on logic associated with the school of Gilbert of Poitiers, the author claims that while every whole is “other” (aliud) than its part, no part is other than its whole “because none [of the parts] has something substantial which its whole does not have”, whereas “for any whole there is something substantial that belongs to no one of its parts” (Compendium Logicae Porretanum III.10-11 [1983, 38]). In general, however, I have not encountered very many medieval thinkers who seem to allow that parts can overlap. Consider, for instance, Aquinas, who claims that “no part contains in itself a thing divided along with it” (aliam sibi condivisam) (Summa Theologiae III, q. 90, art. 3, contra 2).

7. On Ockham, see Normore 2006. For discussion of Buridan's theory of identity over time see King 1994, 413, and Pluta 2001, 52-59. A faithful paraphrase of Buridan's Quaestio can be found in Pluta 2001 (53-59); a newly reconstituted Latin text can be found in his notes 13-26. Albert of Saxony more or less echo Buridan's theory of identity in his Quaestiones in Aristotelis Physicam I, q. 8.