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Logic in Classical Indian Philosophy

First published Tue Apr 19, 2011

The exercise of reasoning and the practice of argument is recorded in the early texts of India. Preoccupation with the nature of reason and argument occurs in the earliest philosophical texts, where their treatment is intimately connected with questions of ontology, epistemology and dialectics. These questions continued to be at the center of philosophical discussion through the classical and medieval period of Indian philosophy. This article will chronicle the answers Indian philosophers gave to these questions during the pre-classical and classical period.

1. Reasoning and Logic

Humans reason: that is, taking some things to be true, they conclude therefrom that other things are also true. If this is done in thought, one performs an inference; and if this is done in speech, one makes an argument. Indeed, inference and argument are but two sides of the same coin: an argument can be thought, and hence become an inference; an inference can be expressed, and hence become an argument.

Logic, at least as traditionally conceived, seeks to distinguish good reasoning from bad. More particularly, it seeks to identify the general conditions under which what one concludes is true, having taken other things to be true. These conditions can be sought in the nature of things. One asks, then, under what conditions do certain facts require some other fact. This perspective on reasoning is an ontic perspective. Next, insofar as facts are grasped in thought, one can also ask under what conditions does knowledge of some facts permit knowledge of another fact. Such conditions, once identified, would distinguish good inferences from bad inferences. This perspective on reasoning is an epistemic one. A third perspective is a dialectic one. After all, insofar as facts are stated, one can ask as well under what conditions does the acceptance by someone of some facts require him or her to accept some other fact. These conditions, once identified, would distinguish good arguments from bad arguments. Finally, since an argument is an expression of an inference, and to that extent, expressed in a language, it is natural to use the forms of linguistic expressions to identify forms of inferences and arguments and thereby to distinguish forms of good inferences and arguments from forms of bad inferences and arguments. This perspective is a linguistic one. The study of reasoning in India has been from the ontic, epistemic and dialectic perspective, and not from the linguistic perspective, the perspective best known to modern thinkers.

2. Pre-Classical Period

The fact that humans reason is no guarantee that those who do reflect on which reasoning is good and which is bad. Clearly, the activity of reasoning, on the one hand, and the activity of reflecting on which reasoning is good and which is not, on the other, are distinct, though naturally they are intimately related. The exposition here, while reporting primarily on what is explicit, will also report on what is implicit. In looking at the origins of reasoning in India, it is natural to begin with the practices in which reasoning played a role and which, as a result, were likely candidates for reflection. The obvious starting points for such practices are all forms of rational inquiry.

Rational inquiry comprises the search for reasons for publicly accepted facts, subject to public and rational scrutiny. This activity involves people both severally and collectively. It involves people severally insofar as people, individually, are the locus of inference. It involves people collectively insofar as arguments, the public manifestation of inferences, are sharpened by the scrutiny of others.

Though the origins in India of public debate (pariṣad), one form of rational inquiry, are not clear, we know that public debates were common in pre-classical India, for they are frequently alluded to in various Upaniṣads and in the early Buddhist literature. A better known, but much later, example of such engagements is the Buddhist work, Milinda-pañho (Questions of King Milinda) and Kathā-vatthu (Points of controversy).

Public debate is not the only form of public deliberations in pre-classical India. Assemblies (pariṣad or sabhā) of various sorts, comprised of relevant experts, were regularly convened to deliberate on a variety of matters, including administrative, legal and religious matters. As reported by Solomon (1976, ch. 3), much of the legal vocabulary for such deliberations includes the well-known terms of debate and argument found in the philosophical literature.

By the fifth century BCE, rational inquiry into a wide range of topics was under way, including agriculture, architecture, astronomy, grammar, law, logic, mathematics, medicine, phonology, and statecraft. Aside from the world's earliest extant grammar, Pāṇini's Aṣṭādhyāyī, however, no works devoted to these topics actually date from this pre-classical period. Nonetheless, scholars agree that incipient versions of the first extant texts on these topics were being formulated and early versions of them were redacted by the beginning of the common era. They include such texts as Kṛṣi-śāstra (Treatise on agriculture), Śilpa-śāstra (Treatise on architecture), Jyotiṣa-śāstra (Treatise on astronomy), Dharma-śāstra (Treatise on law), Caraka-saṃhitā (Caraka's collection), a treatise on medicine, and Artha-śāstra (Treatise on wealth), a treatise on politics.

3. Early Classical Period

The first five hundred years of the common era also saw the redaction of philosophical treatises in which proponents of diverse philosophical and religious traditions put forth systematic versions of their world view. These latter works bear witness, in a number of different ways, to the intense interest in argumentation during this period. This interest reveals itself in three different ways. First, authors made arguments which correspond to well-known forms of logical argument. Second, authors used or adduced logical principles of reasoning such as the principle of non-contradiction, the principle of excluded middle and the principle of double negation. Third, some authors isolated canonical forms of argument.

3.1 Reasoning Used

Many of the arguments formulated in these texts correspond to such well recognized rules of inference as modus ponens (i.e., from α and αβ, one infers β), modus tollens (i.e., from ¬β and αβ, one infers ¬α), disjunctive syllogism (i.e., from ¬α and αβ, one infers β), constructive dilemma (i.e., from αβ, α→γ, and β→γ, one infers γ), categorical syllogism (i.e., from αβ and β→γ, one infers α→γ), and reductio ad absurdum (i.e., if something false follows from an assumption, then the assumption is false). This last form of argument, termed prasaṅga in Sanskrit, was extremely common. Indeed, so common are such arguments in the works of the Buddhist philosopher Nāgārjuna (2nd century CE) that his follower, Buddhapālita (470–540), took all of Nāgārjuna's arguments to be prasaṅga arguments. As a result, Buddhapālita and his followers were, and are, referred to as prāsaṅgikas, or absurdists.

3.2 Principles Used

Though no author of classical India made the principle of non-contradiction an object of study, it was almost always presupposed. Thus, for example, in the Samyutta Nikāya (Collection of short discourses 4.298, 4.299), from the Buddhist Tri-piṭaka, one finds someone known as Nigaṇṭha Nātaputta saying: ‘See how upright, honest and sincere Citta, the householder, is’; and, a little later, he also says: ‘See how Citta, the householder, is not upright, honest or sincere.’ To this, Citta replies: ‘if your former statement is true, your latter statement is false and if your latter statement is true, your former statement is false.’

Explicit formulations of the ontic principle of non-contradiction are found very early in the philosophical literature. Thus, the Buddhist philosopher Nāgārjuna (c. 2nd century CE) often invokes an ontic principle of non-contradiction, saying such things as ‘when something is a single thing, it cannot be both existent and non-existent’ (Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā (Basic verses on the middle way) MMK 7.30), clearly reminiscent of Aristotle's own ontic formulation of the principle of non-contradiction, namely, ‘that a thing cannot at the same time be and not be’ (Metaphysics: Bk. 3, ch. 2, 996b29–30).

Nor are such formulations rare. Vātsyāyana (5th century CE), in his Nyāya-bhāṣya (Commentary on logic, a commentary on the Nyāya-sūtra [NS]), says:

Moreover, because of the exclusivity of being eternal and being non-eternal, eternality and non-eternality must be excluded as two properties of the very same property-possessor. (That is,) they cannot occur together. (comment to NS 5.1.36)

Bhartṛhari (6th centuryCE), the eminent grammarian and philosopher of language, formulates an ontic version of the principle of excluded middle in his Vākyapadīya (On sentences and words), saying ‘A thing must be either existent or non-existent: There is no third’ (VP 3.9.85).

Like Aristotle, classical Indian thinkers were aware of the possible limitation of the principle of excluded middle. Candrakīrti, for example, in his Prasannapadā (Clear-worded (commentary)), a commentary to Nāgārjuna's Mūla-mādhyamaka-kārikā, points out that incompatible properties fail equally to apply to non-existent objects.

But to some who have acquired a clear view of truth through very long practice and by whom the roots of the trees of obstruction have been unuprooted by only a little, it has been taught that it is neither true nor untrue; in order to destroy the least obstruction, both have been denied, just as one denies both whiteness and blackness of the son of a barren woman. (comment to MMK 8.18; cited by Staal 1975 p. 43; reprint, p. 50)

Finally, in classical India, one finds ontic formulations of the principle of double negation. Vātsyāyana says: ‘It is well known that the absence of those things which exist is excluded’ (commentary to NS 2.2.10).

3.3 Arguments with Form

Awareness of the fact that the form of argument is crucial to its being good is found in a Buddhist work of the third century BCE, Moggaliputta Tissa's Kathā-vatthu, in which is found the refutation of some two hundred propositions over which the Sthaviravādins, one of the Buddhist schools, disagreed with other Buddhist schools. The treatment of each point comprises an exchange between a proponent and an opponent. The refutations, of course, turn on demonstrating the inconsistency of a set of propositions. For example, in the passage below, the Sthaviravādin questions his opponent, here a Pudgalavādin, about whether or not the soul is known truly and ultimately.

Sthaviravādin: Is the soul known truly and ultimately?
Pudgalavādin: Yes.
Sthaviravādin: Is the soul known truly and ultimately just like any ultimate fact?
Pudgalavādin: No.
Sthaviravādin: Acknowledge your refutation, If the soul is known truly and ultimately, then indeed, good sir, you should also say that the soul is known truly and ultimately just like any ultimate fact. What you say here is wrong: namely, that we ought to say (a) that the soul is known truly and ultimately; but we ought not to say (b) that the soul is known truly and ultimately just like any ultimate fact. If the latter statement (b) cannot be admitted, then indeed the former statement (a) should not be admitted. It is wrong to affirm the former statement (a) and to deny the latter (b).

One easily abstracts from this the following form:

Sthaviravādin: Is A B?
Pudgalavādin: Yes.
Sthaviravādin: Is C D?
Pudgalavādin: No.
Sthaviravādin: Acknowledge your refutation, If A is B, then C is D. What you say here is wrong: namely, (a) that A is B but that C is not D. If C is not D, then A is not B. It is wrong that A is B and C is not D.

Indeed, this form is repeatedly instantiated throughout Book 1, Chapter 1.

Clearly, the author takes for granted the following: first, that the propositions assented to are inconsistent, satisfying the following inconsistent propositional schemata of α, ¬β, αβ; second, that it is wrong to hold inconsistent propositions; and, third, that if αβ, then ¬β→¬α—that is, half of the equivalence of the principle of contraposition.

The earliest passages concerned with argument and inference are found in Caraka-saṃhitā, a medical text, conjectured by some to have been redacted in its current form at the beginning of the first century CE, on the one hand, and in the philosophical literature, both Brahmanical and Buddhist, on the other. The best known brahmanical text pertaining to inference is Nyāya-sūtra (Aphorisms on logic) by Gautama, also known as Akṣapāda (c. 2nd century CE), a treatise on rational inquiry, whose actual redaction is thought by some to date to the third century CE. Two other Brahmanical works which touch on inference are the Vaiśeṣika-sūtra (Aphorisms on individuation), a treatise of speculative ontology attributed to Kaṇāda (c. 1st century CE), and the Ṣaṣṭi-tantra (Sixty doctrines), attributed by some to Pañcaśikha (c. 2nd century BCE) and by others to Vrṣagaṇa (c. after the 2nd century CE), and surviving only in fragments.

The remaining texts are found in the Buddhist philosophical literature. An early Buddhist text of unknown authorship, whose original Sanskrit has been lost, but whose translations into Tibetan and Chinese have been preserved, is the Sandhi-nirmocana-sūtra (Aphorisms on release from bondage). The earliest identified Buddhist author to write on argument and inference is the idealist Asaṅga (c. 4th century CE). One passage occurs in his Abhidharma-samuccaya (Compendium of the higher teachings), another occurs at the end of a chapter of his Yogācāra-bhūmi-śāstra (Treatise on the stages of the practice of yoga) and a third occurs in a work which survives only in Chinese translation, Shùn zhèng lùn (Treatise on according with what is correct). Shortly after him, Vasubandhu (c. 5th century CE), another Buddhist idealist, thought to be the younger brother of Asaṅga, wrote at least three works on debate: the Vāda-hṛdaya (Heart of debate), the Vāda-vidhāna (Precepts of debate) and the Vāda-vidhi (Rules of debate). No Sanskrit original survives of any of these, though Sanskrit fragments of the last have been collected by E. Frauwallner (1957). Finally, there are three works of unknown author and of unknown date which have survived only in Chinese translation: one is Xiàn chàng shèng jiào lùn (Treatise which reveals and disseminates the wise teachings), whose Sanskrit title G. Tucci gives as Prakaraṇa-ārya-vācā-śāstra and E. Lamotte gives as Ārya-deśanā-śāstra; another is Fāng biàn xīn lùn (Treatise on the heart of means), translated back into Sanskrit by G. Tucci (1929), whose Sanskrit title Tucci renders as Upāya-hṛdaya, while E. Frauwallner renders it as Prayoga-sāra; and the third is the Rú shí lùn (Treatise on truth), also translated back into Sanskrit by G. Tucci (1929) and given by him the Sanskrit title Tarka-śāstra.

With the notable exception of the Vaiśeṣika-sūtra and the Ṣaṣti-tantra, which treat inference only as an epistemic process, the preponderance of the texts mentioned above is devoted to inference as argument in debate. These texts typically enumerate, define or classify public discussions, propositions as they are used in public discussions, parts of arguments, qualities which either enhance or detract from a discussant's performance and statements or actions by a discussant which warrant his being considered defeated, including the uttering of various fallacies.

The earliest extant texts to identify the form of argument used in debate are the Nyāya-sūtra (NS 1.1.32) and the Caraka-saṃhitā (CS 2.8.31). The following is the example found in the latter text.

PROPOSITION (pratijñā): the soul is eternal
GROUND (hetu): because of being un-created
CORROBORATION (dṛṣṭānta): like space
APPLICATION (upanaya): as the sky is uncreated and it is eternal,
  so is the soul uncreated
CONCLUSION (nigamana): therefore, the soul is eternal

This form of the argument clearly reflects the debate situation. First, one propounds a proposition, that is, one sets forth a proposition to be proved. One then states the ground, or reason, for the proposition one is propounding. Next, one corroborates with an example which illustrates the connection implicit between the property mentioned in the proposition and the property adduced as its ground. The immediately ensuing step, the application, spells out the similarity between the example and the subject of the proposition. Notice that this part of the argument retains the form of reasoning by example. Finally, one asserts the proposition.

As was obvious to these thinkers, not all arguments of this form are good arguments. Not surprisingly, these texts catalogue bad arguments. Grounds adduced in arguments catalogued as bad are referred to as non-grounds (a-hetu) or as pseudo-grounds (hetu-ābhāsa). It is difficult to be sure what the basis for the classification was. In the case of the Nyāya-sūtra, the author gives neither a definition nor an example. Even in cases where definitions and examples are given, as in the Caraka-saṃhitā, the contemporary reader is not always sure what is intended. In all likelihood, included here are both cases where the premisses of the argument can be true but the conclusion false—formal fallacies—as well as cases where an argument, though formally valid, is nonetheless unpersuasive, since, for example, its ground (hetu) is as controversial as its conclusion.

These very same texts, as well as the Vaiśeṣika-sūtra, touch on inference as an epistemic process. While the examples of inference furnished all have parts corresponding to a proposition (pratijñā) and to a ground (hetu), not all the texts are equally explicit in identifying the form of inference. In particular, both the Caraka-saṃhitā (CS 1.11.21–22) and the Nyāya-sūtra (NS 1.1.5) define inference as knowledge of one fact on the basis of knowledge of another, leaving unmentioned any knowledge of a relation linking the two. Moreover, these texts classify inferences on the basis of characteristics completely extrinsic to logical features of the inferences adduced. Inferences appear to be classified according to the temporal order of the occurrences of the properties of the parts corresponding to a proposition (pratijñā) and to a ground (hetu).

Improved definitions, which mention not only the parts corresponding to a proposition (pratijñā) and to a ground (hetu) but also the relation between these two parts, are found in the Ṣaṣti-tantra and the Vaiśeṣika-sūtra, where knowledge of the relation is explicitly included in their definitions of inference. However, the relation is not a formal one, but several from a miscellany of material relations. The Ṣaṣti-tantra enumerates seven such relations, while the Vaiśeṣika-sūtra (VS 9.20) enumerates five: the relation of cause to effect, of effect to cause, of contact, of exclusion and of inherence. In each of these texts, the miscellany of material relations serves to classify inferences. Thus, although, in these two works, the parts of an inference have been made explicit, the formal connection among these parts remained implicit.

Another author who is aware that sound inference must be based on a relation between the proposition and the ground is Vātsyāyana (5th century CE), also known as Pakṣalisvāmin, the author of the Nyāya-bhaṣya, the earliest extant commentary on the Nyāya-sūtra. While the form of argument he uses retains the form of an argument by example, Vātsyāyana rejects the mere similarity and the mere dissimilarity, which underlie reasoning by example, as underlying a sound syllogism. Vātsyāyana seems to think that sound syllogisms are underpinned by the causation relation. This identification of cause with ground leaves Vātsyāyana unclear about the difference between obversion and contraposition. (See Gillon 2010 for discussion.)

As S. Katsura (1986a, 165) has shown, the works of the Buddhist philosopher Vasubandhu (5th century CE) seem to be the earliest extant works which provide a formal characterization of the inference. Vasubandhu holds that inference has only three parts, a subject (pakṣa) and two properties, one which is the property to be established (sādhya) in the subject and the other which is the ground (hetu). Exploiting an idea ascribed by his coreligionist Asaṅga in his Shùn zhèng lùn to an unknown school (thought by at least one scholar to be the Sāmkhya school), he maintained that a ground in an inference is a proper one if, and only if, it satisfies three conditions—the so-called tri-rūpa-hetu, or the three forms (tri-rūpa) of a ground (hetu). The first form is that the ground (hetu) (H) occur in the subject of an inference (pakṣa) (p). The second is that the ground (H) occur in things similar to the subject insofar as they have the property to be established (sādhya) (S). And third, the ground (H) not occur in things dissimilar from the subject insofar as they lack the property to be established (S). These conditions can be viewed as a partial specification of the validity of inferences of this form:

THESIS (pakṣa): p has S.
GROUND (hetu): p has H.
INDISPENSABILITY (avinābhāva): whatever has H has S.

The first condition corresponds to the premiss labelled ground in the schema above, while the second two correspond to the premiss labelled indispensability. In his Vāda-vidhi, Vasubandhu makes clear that the relation, knowledge of which is necessary for inference, is not just any in a miscellany of material relations, but a formal relation, which he designates, in some places, as a-vinā-bhāva, or indispensability—literally, not being without (cp. the Latin expression sine qua non)—and in others, as nāntarīyakatva, or immediacy—literally, being unmediated (Katsura 1986b, 5).

4. Classical Period

Then, Dignāga (c. 5th–6th century CE), building on the insights of his teacher, Vasubandhu, more fully isolated the formal structure underlying the Indian syllogism (Steinkellner 1993). His contributions to the development of the understanding of reason and argument in classical India are found in three of his extant works. In each case, the original Sanskrit text has been lost. Two are extant in Tibetan translation: Hetu-cakra-ḍamaru (The drum wheel of reason) and his magnum opus, Pramāṇa-samuccaya (Compendium on epistemic means of cognition), four of whose six chapters are devoted to inference and argument. One is extant in both a Chinese and a Tibetan translation: Nyāya-mukha (Introduction to logic).

First, distinguishing between inference for oneself and inference for another, Dignāga made explicit what had previously been only implicit, namely, that inference, the cognitive process whereby one increases one's knowledge, and argument, the device of persuasion, are but two sides of a single coin. Second, he changed the form of the statement of corroboration to make its logical character more salient. In particular, as S. Katsura (1986b, 11–12) has noted, Dignāga replaced the singular statements in which the ground and the property to be established are said to belong to some recognized instance and in which the ground and the property to be established are said not to belong to a recognized instance with corresponding universal statements: namely, that everything which has the ground has the property to be established; and that everything which does not have the property to be established does not have the ground. Thus, for example, where Vātsyāyana argues:

PROPOSITION (pratijñā): sound is non-eternal
GROUND (hetu): because of having the property of arising
CORROBORATION (udāharaṇa): a substance, such as a pot, having the property of arising, is non-eternal
APPLICATION (upanaya): and likewise, sound has the property of arising
CONCLUSION (nigamana): therefore, sound is non-eternal because of having the property of arising

Dignāga argues as follows:

THESIS (pakṣa): sound is non-eternal
GROUND (hetu): because of resulting from effort
CORROBORATION (dṛṣṭānta): whatever results from effort is observed to be non-eternal, like a pot.

(Katsura 1986b, 11–12). Thus, although the statements in Vātsyāyana's syllogism all have the form of either particular or existential statements:

PROPOSITION (pratijñā): p has S
GROUND (hetu): p has H.
CORROBORATION (udāharaṇa): d has H and d has S.
APPLICATION (upanaya): As d has H and has S, so p has H and has S.
CONCLUSION (nigamana): p has S.

the crucial statement of corroboration in Dignāga's syllogism has a universal form:

THESIS (pakṣa): p has S.
GROUND (hetu): p has H.
CORROBORATION (dṛṣṭānta): whatever has H is observed to have S, like d.

(where d is an instance of something recognized to have both H and S). As is clear from inspection, syllogisms of this latter form are valid.

Having thus identified within the Indian syllogism a valid form, Dignāga pressed into service the Sanskrit particle eva (only) (Katsura 1986a, 163; Katsura 1986b, 6–10) to ensure that the three forms of a ground (tri-rūpa-hetu), the truth conditions for inference identified by Vasubandhu, accurately characterize the validity of the form of Dignāga's syllogism.

Lastly, and most strikingly, Dignāga gave an alternative and an essentially equivalent characterization of the truth conditions of his syllogism, which he called the wheel of reasons (hetu-cakra). The so-called wheel of reasons is a three by three matrix, which distinguishes a proper from an improper ground and is equivalent to the last two forms of the three forms of a ground (tri-rūpa-hetu). It comprises, on the one hand, the three cases of the ground (H) occurring in some, none, or all of the property-possessors where the property to be established (S) occurs, and, on the other, three cases of the ground (H) occurring in some, none, or all of the property-possessors where the property to be established (S) does not occur. Letting S be the property-possessors in which S occurs and S be the property-possessors in which S does not occur, one arrives at the following table:

H occurs in: all S
all S
all S
no S
all S
some S
H occurs in: no S
all S
no S
no S
no S
some S
H occurs in: some S
all S
some S
no S
some S
some S

Dignāga identified the arguments corresponding to the top and bottom cases of the middle column as good arguments and those corresponding to the other cases as bad.

The view of Dignāga's work as an attempt to identify a formally valid syllogism raises two questions. First, why did Dignāga hold that the major premiss, or statement of corroboration (dṛṣṭānta), must have associated with it an example, even though examples are irrelevant to the validity of an argument? Second, why did Dignāga regard as a bad argument any argument corresponding to one whose major premiss, or statement of corroboration (dṛṣṭānta), corresponds to the middle case of the middle column, which is, in fact, a valid argument?

Some scholars think that these questions arise from a misunderstanding of what Dignāga was striving to do. According to some, such as Hayes (1980; 1988 ch. 4.2), Dignāga was striving, not to work out a deductivist form of reasoning and argument, but rather to work out an inductivist form. According to others, such as Oetke (1994; 1996), Dignāga and some of his predecessors and contemporaries were striving to spell out a defeasible form of reasoning and argument. (See Taber 2004 for a critical assessment of Oetke's view.)

Another answer to these questions is that Dignāga did not manage to work out fully the consequences of his insights. In particular, he did not fully distinguish the formal properties of a syllogism, which determine whether or not it is valid, from its non-formal properties, which determine whether or not it is persuasive. To see the plausibility of this answer, consider how one might distinguish good arguments by example from bad ones. Should one wish to argue for a conclusion of the form (Sp) by a positive example, then necessary conditions are that the positive example be similar to the subject (sa-pakṣa: lit. like-subject)—that is, it have the property to be established (S); that it have the ground (H); and that it be distinct from the subject (p) (pakṣa)— otherwise the argument would be circular. Should one wish to argue for the same conclusion by a negative example, then necessary conditions are that the negative example be dissimilar from the subject (vi-pakṣa: lit. unlike-subject)—that is, it not have the property to be established (S); and that it not have the ground (H). The ontic version of the law of non-contradiction guarantees that the negative example is distinct from the subject (p) (pakṣa).

Now Dignāga defined things similar to the subject as things distinct from the subject (p) and having the property to be established (S), while he defined things dissimilar from the subject as things not having the property to be established (S). (See: NM, 1c–2a and PS 3.19–3.20.) If one uses these terms as defined by Dignāga, then one can restate the necessary conditions for a good argument by positive example as one in which the ground (H) occurs in the subject (p) and the ground (H) occurs in the things similar to the subject (sa-pakṣa) and one can restate the necessary conditions for a good argument by negative example as one in which the ground (H) occurs in the subject (p) and the ground (H) does not occur in the things dissimilar to the subject (vi-pakṣa). As Randle (1930, 182) observed, it is a short step from these conditions to those which comprise the three forms of a ground (tri-rūpa-hetu). One simply factors out, as it were, reference to the ground (H) as follows: a ground is one (1) which occurs in the subject (p), (2) which occurs in things similar to subject (sa-pakṣa) and (3) which does not occur in things dissimilar from the subject (vi-pakṣa). Yet this restatement, as it stands, tolerates invalid arguments, for it is compatible with the ground (H) occurring in things dissimilar from the subject. Dignāga's use of the Sanskrit particle eva (only) in his formulation of the third form excludes invalid syllogisms. (Dignāga also used the particle in the formulation of the first two forms, where, for its use to be coherent, it must be construed in its emphatic sense, comparable to the English particle indeed.)

To return to the three questions raised above, consider an argument which is an instance of the middle case of the middle column.

THESIS (pakṣa): sound is non-eternal
GROUND (hetu): because of being audible.
CORROBORATION (dṛṣṭānta): whatever is audible is non-eternal.

This argument, though formally valid, is completely unpersuasive. The reason, of course, is that there is no independent empirical evidence to support the universal statement that whatever is audible is non-eternal. Requiring that there be at least some thing different from sound which is both audible and non-eternal is an obvious and plausible way to eliminate such patently unpersuasive arguments. And they are indeed ruled out by the second condition, so long as things similar to the subject are distinct from the subject. Dignāga's three forms of a ground (tri-rūpa-hetu), when given the precise formulation with the Sanskrit particle eva (only, indeed), provide necessary and sufficient conditions for what he takes to be good syllogisms.

However much scholars may disagree about Dignāga's aim in the formulation of the syllogism, all agree that his works set the framework within which subsequent Buddhist thinkers addressed philosophical issues pertaining to inference and debate. Thus, Śankarasvāmin (c. 6th century CE) wrote a brief manual of inference for Buddhists, called the Nyāya-praveśa (Beginning logic), based directly on Dignāga's work. Not long thereafter, Dharmakīrti (c. 7th century CE), the great Buddhist metaphysician, also elaborated his views on inference and debate within the framework found in Dignāga.

Dignāga's treatment of the classical Indian syllogism brought to light an important problem. The syllogism, conceived as an inference, is that whereby one who knows the truth of its premisses may also come to know the truth of its conclusion. The second premiss is known, of course, either through perception or through another inference. But how is the first premiss known? It cannot be known by inference, since the first premiss is a universal statement and the conclusions of syllogisms are particular statements. However, to know the truth of the first premiss by perception would seem to require that one know of each thing which has H, whether or not it also has S. Yet if one knew that, one would already know by perception the syllogism's conclusion. As a result, inference would be a superfluous means of knowledge.

The earliest classical Indian philosopher thought to have recognized the problem of how one comes to know the first premiss of the Indian syllogism—essentially, the problem of induction—seems to have been Dignāga's student, Īśvarasena (Steinkellner 1997, p. 638). He appears to have thought that knowledge of the syllogism's first premiss is grounded in non-perception (anupalabdhi). That is, according to Īśvarasena, knowledge that whatever has H has S comes from the simple failure to perceive something which has H but which does not have S. (See Steinkellner 1993, which draws on Steinkellner 1966.)

However, this suggestion does not solve the problem, for reasons laid out in detail by Īśvarasena's student, Dharmakīrti (c. 7th century CE). His extensive writing on epistemology in general and on reason and argument in particular formed a watershed in classical Indian philosophy. Besides his magnum opus, Pramāṇa-vārttika (Gloss on the means of epistemic cognition), one of whose four chapters is devoted to inference (svārtha-anum[specialcharacter:#x0101]na), comprising 340 verses and a commentary by him to it, and another devoted to argument (para-anumāna), which comprises 285 verses, he wrote several smaller works, including Pramāṇa-viniścaya (Settling on what the epistemic means of cognition are), Nyāya-bindu (Drop of logic), Hetu-bindu (Drop of reason) and Vāda-nyāya (Logic of debate). As he makes abundantly clear in verses 13–25 and his commentary thereto of the chapter on inference (svārtha-anumāna) of his Pramāṇa-vārttika, the simple failure to perceive something which has H but which does not have S is no guarantee that whatever has H has S; after all, while one has never encountered something which has H and does not have S, what guarantee is there that something which has H and does not have S is not among the things which one has yet to encounter? Dharmakīrti's answer was that the truth of the first premiss is guaranteed by either of two relations obtaining between properties: causation relation (tadutpatti) and the identity relation (tādātmya). Unfortunately, as one might suspect, Dharmakīrti's solution does not work. (See Gillon 1991 for details.)

Dignāga not only had a profound influence on the Buddhist thinkers who followed him, he also influenced his non-Buddhist contemporaries and their followers. It would be wrong, however, to conclude that every adoption of ideas similar to those used by Dignāga in his works should be attributed to him. After all, we cannot be certain that Dignāga's contemporaries did not arrive at similar ideas independently or that they might not have got their ideas from sources common to them and Dignāga. Indeed, in his Padārtha-dharma-saṃgraha (Summary of categories and properties), better known as Praśastapāda-bhāṣya (Praśastapāda's commentary, understood as on the Vaiśeṣika-sūtra), Praśastapāda (c. 6th century CE), an adherent of the Vaiśeṣika school, and a near contemporary of Dignāga, also clearly appreciated the formal, universal validity of the Indian syllogism, for he used the Sanskrit quantificational adjectives sarva (all) and eka-deśa (some) to formulate the second and third conditions of three forms of a ground. (See Randle 1930 ch. 3 for details.)

It was not long before the ideas on inference and argument became generally accepted not only by other non-Brahmanical thinkers, such as the Jains, but also by Brahmanical thinkers. On the one hand, one finds that the Mīmāṁsā thinker, Kumārila Bhaṭṭa (c. early 7th century CE), adopted, without special comment, the formal perspective. His logical ideas are developed at length in the one hundred eighty-eight verses of his Śloka-vārttika's (Gloss in verses) Anumāna-pariccheda (Section on inference). On the other hand, one also finds that, though the Nyāya thinker, Uddyotakara (c. late 6th century CE) argued vigorously against many of Dignāga's views, he nonetheless advocated a view which presupposed the formalization found in Dignāga's works. Thus, Uddyotakara classified grounds (hetu) as: concomitant (anvaya), where nothing distinct from particular substratum p (in the inferential schema) fails to have the property S; exclusive (vyatireka), where nothing distinct from p (in the inferential schema) has the property S; and both concomitant and exclusive, where some things distinct from p have the property S and some fail to have the property S. This classification becomes the standard classification for the adherents of Nyāya during the scholastic period.

While Brahmanical thinkers accepted the insight of the Buddhists that the canonical inference is underpinned by indispensability, they refrained from modifying the form of the syllogism they used. Rather, the Brahmanical thinkers retained the form of inference found in Vātsyāyana's Nyāya-bhāṣya. However, they understood the steps of corroboration and application to convey the indispensability relation.

In addition, in spite of the metaphysical differences which distinguished the various schools of thought, both Buddhist and Brahmanical, all thinkers came to use a naive realist's ontology to specify the states of affairs used to study the syllogism. According to this view, the world consists of individual substances, or things (dravya), universals (sāmānya) and relations between them. The fundamental relation is the one of occurrence (vṛtti). The relata of this relation are known as substratum (dharmin) and superstratum (dharma) respectively. The relation has two forms: contact (saṃyoga) and inherence (samavāya). So, for example, one individual substance, a pot, may occur on another, say the ground, by the relation of contact. In this case, the pot is the superstratum and the ground is the substratum. Or, a universal, say treeness, may occur in an individual substance, say an individual tree, by the relation of inherence. Here, treeness, the superstratum, inheres in the individual tree, the substratum. The converse of the relation of occurrence is the relation of possession.

Another important relation is the relation which one superstratum bears to another. This relation, mentioned above as indispensability (a-vinā-bhāva), and later known as pervasion (vyāpti), can be defined in terms of the occurrence relation. One superstratum pervades another just in case wherever the second occurs the first occurs. The converse of the pervasion relation is the concomitance relation.

As a result of these relations, the world embodies a structure: if one superstratum, designated as H, is concomitant with another superstratum, designated as S, and if a particular substratum, say p, possesses the former superstratum, then it possesses the second. This structure is the one which underlies the classical Indian syllogism.


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