Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanisław Leśniewski

First published Fri Nov 23, 2007; substantive revision Tue Oct 25, 2011

Stanisław Leśniewski (1886–1939) was one of the principal founders and movers of the school of logic that flourished in Warsaw between the two world wars. He was the originator of an unorthodox system of the foundations of mathematics, based on three formal systems: Protothetic, a logic of propositions and their functions; Ontology: a logic of names, and functors of arbitrary order; and Mereology, a general theory of part and whole. His concern for utmost rigor in the formalization and execution of logic, coupled with a nominalistic rejection of abstract entities, led to a precise but highly unusual metalogic. His strictures on correctly distinguishing use from mention of expressions, his canons of correct definition, and his mereology, have all informed the logical mainstream, but the majority of his logical views and innovations have not been widely adopted. Despite this, his influence as a teacher and as a motor for logical innovation are widely acknowledged. He remains one of logic's most original figures.

1. Life

Stanisław Leśniewski was born on 30 March 1886 at Serphukhov, near Moscow. His father Izydor was an engineer working on the construction of the Trans-Siberian Railway. He attended classical Gimnazjum (grammar school studying classical languages) in Irkutsk in Siberia. Leśniewski studied in Germany and Switzerland, at Leipzig, Heidelberg, Zurich and at Munich, where he heard lectures by Hans Cornelius. In 1910 he went as a doctoral student to Lwów University, where the foremost Polish philosopher of the day, Kazimierz Twardowski, a student of Franz Brentano, was professor and was building up a cadre of outstanding young philosophers. In 1912 he obtained his doctorate with a dissertation Przyczynek do analizy zdań egzystencjalnych [Contributions to the Analysis of Existential Propositions]. This was published the previous year in the leading Polish-language philosophy journal Przegląd Filozoficzny. Several further publications followed until the outbreak of war, which Leśniewski spent in Moscow teaching mathematics at Polish schools. During this period he developed what later became known as Mereology. After the Bolshevik Revolution in Russia, Leśniewski left Russia for Poland. During the 1919–21 Polish–Bolshevik War he worked as a codebreaker for the Polish General Staff's Cipher Bureau, helping Poland to survive Russia's attempt to reconquer it. He tried unsuccessfully to obtain his habilitation in Lwów, where he was blocked, getting it instead in the University of Warsaw, where in 1919 he became (Extraordinary—Associate) Professor of the Foundations of Mathematics, a position especially created for him. From then until his final illness Leśniewski lectured regularly on logical and mathematical topics, and built up his logical systems. Though his logic never became widely accepted, even in Poland, with Jan Łukasiewicz he was respected as one of the co-founders of the Warsaw School of Logic. Leśniewski's only doctoral student, Alfred Tarski (Leśniewski used to boast of having 100% geniuses as doctoral students) joined them to form the world's pre-eminent centre of mathematical logic in the interwar years. Leśniewski was made a full professor in 1936. Always a smoker, he contracted thyroid cancer and died on 13 May 1939 at the age of 53. His papers, entrusted to his student Bolesław Sobociński, included unfinished works on logical antinomies and on many-valued logic. All these papers were destroyed during the Warsaw Rising of 1944.

2. Early Works

Leśniewski's early writings are all papers on topics in the philosophy of logic and language, concerned with such issues as truth, denotation and connotation, the status of the laws of logic, and Russell's Antinomy. The primary influences in this period were John Stuart Mill, Anton Marty, and Edmund Husserl: he himself described the works as grammatical in nature. Although Leśniewski later repudiated his early works, they contain many seeds of his later interests, attitudes, and working practices. From the beginning there is an obsessive rigor in developing logical principles, including an instinctively clear and consistent marking of the use/mention distinction, that is, distinguishing talk in a language from talk about a language. Leśniewski's early works are mainly reactions to work by others, whether Brentano and Cornelius on existential propositions, Łukasiewicz on the Principles of Contradiction and Excluded Middle, Twardowski on universals, or Kotarbiński on the timelessness of truth.

The turning point in this period came when in 1911 Leśniewski read Łukasiewicz's groundbreaking 1910 monograph O zasadzie sprzeczności u Arystotelesa [On the Principle of Contradiction in Aristotle], a radical rethink of the status of the principle of contradiction in the light of modern logic. That work contained an appendix in which there was a short exposition of modern symbolic logic, in the notation of Couturat, and in Chapter 18 a brief discussion of Russell's antinomy of the set of sets which are not members of themselves. Leśniewski initially thought the Russell Antinomy was easy to fix—and while trying to fix it missed a once-a-day train when changing stations in Russia. He spent the next years perfecting his solution, and indeed the rest of his life was devoted to providing a rigorous, antinomy-free foundation for mathematics which avoided both the sloppiness of Principia and what he considered the fiction of standard set theory.

According to Leśniewski's dissertation and first paper, all positive existential propositions are analytic. This sounds absurd, but Leśniewski has reasons. Like Mill, he distinguishes between a term's denotation, which is the object or objects it stands for, and its connotation, which is the property or properties it ascribes to something. A proposition is defined to be analytic if it is (1) in positive subject–predicate form, and (2) contains no predicates connoting properties not connoted by the subject. A proposition is synthetic if it is (1) positive and (2) contains some predicate connoting a property not connoted by the subject. Contrary to Mill, who said that ‘being’ connotes the property of existing, Leśniewski thinks the predicate ‘exist’ does not connote any properties. A fortiori, ‘exist’ used as a predicate connotes no property not contained in the subject. Negative existential propositions, which have the form ‘X is/are non-existing’ are synthetic, except for such whose subject connotes non-existence, e.g. ‘A square circle does not exist’ does not, so it is synthetic, but ‘All non-existing objects are non-existing’ is analytic. All negative existential propositions are contradictory, because every subject connotes something of the form ‘being which possesses properties A, B, C, D, etc.’ Analytic negative existentials have contradictory subjects. So instead of saying ‘X exists’ we should, to express the proposition we want to be synthetic and contingent, rather say ‘Some being is the object X’.

Leśniewski saves appearances, which are that some existential propositions are true and others are false, by proposing a normative schema that propositions should fulfill to be proper expressions of the thought intended. Every proposition is to represent the possessing by the object(s) denoted by the subject of the properties connoted by the predicate. Sentences which fail to conform to this norm are improper or inadequate, and should be replaced by proper alternatives. For example ‘People exist’, which is true but is intended to be synthetic, should be expressed as ‘Some beings are people’, while ‘A square circle does not exist’ should be expressed by ‘No being is a square circle’. Here is a table of some of the equivalences:

Inadequate Expression Adequate Alternative
Only objects A exist All beings are objects A
Objects A exist Some beings are objects A
Object A exists One (a certain) being is object A
Object A does not exist
Objects A do not exist
No being is a/the object A

In “An Attempt at a Proof of the Ontological Principle of Contradiction” (1912) Leśniewski argues that ‘No object is able to be both B and not-B’ is true but disagrees with the equivalence (now generally accepted) that ‘No A is B’ is equivalent to ‘If something is A then it is not B’. The article is written in criticism of some ideas of Łukasiewicz and it afforded the occasion for the first personal meeting of the two later colleagues. Łukasiewicz described the meeting decades later in a poignant diary entry for 9 May 1949:

Yesterday was the feast of St. Stanislaus, Bishop. This was Leśniewski's name day. On his last one he already lay in the same hospital in which five days later he was to die. I met Leśniewski in Lwów in 1912. I lived then with my uncle in 10, Chmielowski Street. One afternoon someone rang at the entrance door. I opened the door and I saw a young man with a light, pointed beard, a hat with a wide brim and a big black cockade instead of a tie. The young man bowed and asked politely: “Does Professor Łukasiewicz live here?”. I replied that it was so. “Are you Professor Łukasiewicz?” asked the stranger. I replied that it was so. “I am Leśniewski, and I have come to show you the proofs of an article I have written against you.” I invited the man into my room. It turned out that Leśniewski was publishing in Przegląd Filozoficzny an article containing criticism of some my views in The Principle of Contradiction in Aristotle. This criticism was written with such scientific exactness that I could not find any points which I could take up with him. I remember that when, after hours of discussion, Leśniewski parted from me, I went out as usual to the Kawiarnia Szkocka [Scottish Café, a favorite meeting-place for academics in Lwów], and I declared to my colleagues waiting there that I would have to give up my logical interests. A firm had sprung up whose competition I was not able to face. [Translated by Arianna Betti and Owen LeBlanc; see Polish Philosophy Page: Stanislaw Lesniewski, in the Other Internet Resources section below]

In “The Critique of the Logical Principle of the Excluded Middle” (1913) Leśniewski distinguishes between an ontological principle – Every object is either A or not A – and a logical principle – Of two contradictory propositions, at least one must be true. He rejects the latter because he takes ‘Every centaur has a tail’ and ‘Some centaur does not have a tail’ to be contradictories, but both to be false because the subject-term ‘centaur’ is empty. This clearly depends on a reading of the universal with existential import. If instead for the universal we take ‘Any centaur has a tail’, which is true if there are no centaurs, then we do get a contradictory pair with opposite truth-values.

In the course of this paper Leśniewski argues against Twardowski's theory of general objects and Meinong's theory of impossible objects, as well as offering solutions to the paradoxes of Grelling and the Liar. The paper is the richest of his early “logico-grammatical” works. The argument against Twardowski goes as follows. Call a general object one which has all and only the properties shared by some group of objects. For example the general horse has all and only the properties shared by all horses: it is neither black nor brown nor white, neither male nor female, neither young nor old, but it is indisputably equine, mammalian, and born of two equine parents. Leśniewski now reduces the definition to absurdity. Of any group of at least two objects, there will be some property that some of them have that others do not have. For example, some horses are black and others are not black. So the general horse is not black, because some horses are not black; but nor is it not black, because some horses are not not black. Hence the general horse is neither black nor not black, which is a contradiction. Hence there are no general objects for groups of more than one thing. Leśniewski liked this argument well enough to retain his allegiance to it even while repudiating all other parts of his early work; he rejected universals consistently thereafter. But the argument does not affect those theories of universals which are happy to accept that universals may have properties their instances do not, for example being instantiated, or repeated.

In “Is truth only eternal or both eternal and without a beginning?” (1913) he argues for timeless bivalence against Kotarbiński's view that future contingent propositions lack a determinate truth-value. This paper convinced Kotarbiński he had been in error. The exchange is notable for showing that the discussion of the logical status of future contingent propositions, which inspired Łukasiewicz to invent many-valued logic a few years later, was already under way in Lwów before the First World War.

In “Is the class of classes not subordinate to themselves subordinate to itself?” (1914) Leśniewski offers his first published analysis of Russell's Paradox, claiming that ‘the class of As’ refers to the unique mereological sum of As, so that since every object is subordinate to itself, no class of objects is not subordinate to itself, and Russell's Paradox fails to arise. The non-standard term ‘subordinate to’ which he took from Łukasiewicz, is defined by Leśniewski as follows. An object P is subordinate to a class K if and only if, for some a, K is a class of as (a mereological sum of as, as we shall see), and P is an a. Let P be a hemispherical part of a sphere Q. The class of all hemispheres of Q is, on Leśniewski's understanding, simply Q itself, so P is subordinate to Q. In fact, according to this view, any object is a class, and subordinate to itself. Leśniewski retained this “concrete” understanding of classes throughout his life, claiming that it conformed to Cantor's own statements. That other set theories gave a different account of things was in Leśniewski's view their problem, not his.

During World War I, when Leśniewski lived in Moscow, he completed “Foundations of a General Theory of Sets I” (1916). Despite the use of the term ‘mnogość’ (set), this was a first rigorous deductive presentation of the theory of parts, wholes and concrete collections. Leśniewski later dropped the term ‘mnogość’ and instead invented the term ‘Mereology’, meaning ‘theory of parts’, an irregular coinage from the Greek μερος, part, in order to differentiate his view from what he ironically called “official” set theory. In this paper the language is a highly regimented Polish supplemented with variables, because at the time Leśniewski did not trust symbolic methods, having found the use/mention confusions in Whitehead and Russell's Principia Mathematica a barrier to understanding, and assuming any symbolic logic had to be like that. Only later did Leśniewski discover the much tidier work of Frege, which he thereafter held up as the foremost example of symbolic logic to that date. Leśniewski was one of the earliest logicians to appreciate the virtues of Frege's logical work as largely independent of its inconsistency. In later years, Leśniewski proved that Frege's “way out” of the paradox, which involved a restriction of the fatal abstraction principle Basic Law V, had the unacceptable consequence that there could not be more than one object. This work was not published, but was reconstructed after World War II by Sobociński (1949).

3. Development of Leśniewski's Logical Systems

Becoming frustrated with the inexactnesses and foibles of natural language as a medium for working, in 1920 Leśniewski let himself be persuaded by Leon Chwistek that it would be advantageous to overcome his distaste for symbolism and formulate his logical thoughts using symbols. Mereology having been rather well formulated already in 1916, the transition to symbolism was straightforward there. The fact that axiomatization came first, and symbolization of the already axiomatized theory followed subsequently, gave Leśniewski a strong reason to dissociate the use of formal methods from formalism, according to which formulas are without interpretation. Leśniewski's formulas had an intended interpretation from the start.

3.1 Early Mereology

The original (1916) formulation of Mereology, not yet so called, and not yet formalized with special symbols, had the primitive concept ‘part’, four axioms and three definitions at its basis. They are:

Axiom I. If object A is part of object B, then B is not part of A

Axiom II. If object A is part of object B, and object B is part of object C, then A is part of C.

These specify respectively the asymmetry and transitivity of the part relation.

Definition I. The expression ‘ingredient of object A’ is used to denote A, and every part of A.

That is: Object B is an ingredient of object A if and only if either B is A or B is part of A. Nowadays the term ‘ingredient’ is often simply rendered as ‘part’ and Leśniewski's ‘part’ is called ‘proper part’.

Definition II. The expression ‘set [mnogość] of objects m’ is used to denote every object A such that if B is any ingredient of A, then some ingredient of B is an ingredient of some m, and this m is an ingredient of A.

That is: A is a set of m if and only if every ingredient of A has a common ingredient with (mereologically overlaps) some m, and this m is part of A. Intuitively, a set of m is what we would now call a mereological sum, consisting of one or more m, but not necessarily all of the m.

Definition III. The expressions ‘set of all objects m’ and ‘class [klasa] of objects m’ are used to denote every object A such that (i) every m is an ingredient of A, and (ii) if B is an ingredient of A, then some ingredient of B is an ingredient of some m.

That is: a class of m is a set of all the m. That such classes exist and unique are the import of the remaining axioms:

Axiom III. If some object is (an) m, then some object is a class of objects m.

Axiom IV. If A is a class of objects m, and B is a class of objects m, then A is B.

With these axioms we may speak of ‘the class of m’ whenever there is at least one m.

In terms of these basic principles, Leśniewski proves a number of theorems and defines several important mereological concepts, such as overlapping (having an ingredient in common) and being exterior to (having no ingredient in common). It is characteristic of this essay that Leśniewski is keen to appropriate the terminology of set theory for his own purposes. Further terminology includes ‘element’, which is defined as follows:

Definition IV. The term ‘element of object A’ is used to denote any object B which, for some meaning of the expression ‘x’, is such that (i) A is the class of objects x, and (ii) B is (an) x.

It is swiftly proved that the ingredients of A and the elements of A are the same. The definition illustrates how Leśniewski formulated the idea of quantification in his early semi-prose work: instead of “for some x” he says “for some meaning of the expression ‘x’ ”. When showing all ingredients of an object are its elements, Leśniewski instantiates the bound variable by saying “Using the expression ‘x’ with the meaning of the expression ‘ingredient of the object A’ …”. We will return to this below when discussing Leśniewski's understanding of the quantifiers.

By Leśniewski's own later and very exacting standards, this first formulation of Mereology is methodologically imperfect, because it intersperses axioms and definitions. A cleaner formulation would express all axioms in terms of the mereological primitive (here ‘part’) only. This would be possible in this case simply by substituting the definitions of defined terms in Axioms III and IV, but it would not be especially enlightening. It also results in an axiom system that can be substantially simplified, both by reducing the number of axioms and by simplifying and shortening them. These desiderata (fewer, shorter, and more perspicuous axioms) often pull in different directions.

3.2 Ontology

The language of Mereology in 1916 used many expressions besides the specifically mereological primitive ‘part’: in addition to nominal variables, there are expressions forming sentences from nominal variables, as in ‘A is (a) b’, ‘A is B’, ‘every a is a b’, ‘some a is a b, ‘no a is a b’, as well as words such as ‘object’ and ‘exist’. Complex names also occur in sentences, as the expressions ‘part of A’ and ‘ingredient of A’ in ‘every part of A is an ingredient of A’. Leśniewski had hitherto taken such logical bits of language for granted, but now he needed to formalize them. He wanted a logical calculus of names and the expressions involving them. There were precedents in traditional syllogistic, and more especially in the algebra of logic of Ernst Schröder, which Leśniewski looked at in coming up with his own system, based as in the case of Mereology on his intuitive understanding of the relevant expressions as carefully used in ordinary language. At first he gathered propositions he was sure were true, such as ‘If A is b, then A is A’. We know about this one because it is mentioned, presumably scornfully, in a diary entry by Twardowski for 1 July 1919, as being the first axiom of the new system that Leśniewski was working on at the time. Leśniewski has left us a graphic description of his method of working at this crucial and fluid time of his development [Collected Works 366-9]:

While using colloquial language in scientific work and attempting to control its ‘logic’, I endeavoured to somehow rationalize the way in which I was using in colloquial language various types of propositions passed down to us by ‘traditional logic’. While relying on ‘linguistic instinct’ and the often non-uniform tradition of ‘traditional logic’, I attempted to devise a consistent method of working with propositions that were ‘singular’, ‘particular’, ‘general’, ‘existential’ etc. The results of my efforts were useful and I continued my efforts in applying to the ‘symbolism’ the equivalents of various types of propositions, after the change to the ‘symbolic’ way of writing.

While working in this way, and attempting to define some expressions in terms of others, Leśniewski came to focus on singular propositions of the form ‘A is (a) b’, which he henceforth wrote as ‘A ε b’, borrowing from Peano the lower-case epsilon, the first letter of the Greek ‘εστι’, is. It was this connection with meanings of ‘is’ that prompted Leśniewski to name this system ‘Ontology’. He thought it would be possible to base it on singular inclusions like ‘A ε b’ alone, in addition to concepts taken from the logic of connectives and quantifiers. The key thought was that the following should be true

A is a if and only if (every A is a, and at most one object is A)

This requires the two expressions ‘every A is a’ and ‘at most one object is A’ to be defined. The first can be helped along by

every a is b if and only if (some object is a, and for any X, if X is a, then X is b)

which requires ‘some’ and ‘object’ to be defined: they can be helped further by

some a is b if and only if for some X, X is a and X is b

if A is b, then A is an object

while the second can be helped by

at most one object is a if and only if for any A and B, if A is a and B is a, then A is the same object as B

and finally we have

A is the same object as B if and only if (A is B and B is A).

Putting these together, and inspired by Russell's theory of definite descriptions, Leśniewski arrived in 1920 at a single axiom based on the single primitive ‘is’:

A is a if and only if ((for some B, B is A) and (for any B and C, if B is A and C is A, then B is C), and (for any B, if B is A then B is a))

The story has it that Leśniewski discovered this axiom, his efforts fortified by eating bars of chocolate, while sitting on a bench in Warsaw's Saxon Garden. Symbolically, using a somewhat more modern symbolism than Leśniewski's, but borrowing his upper corners for marking quantifier scope, the axiom becomes

OL AaA ε a ↔ (∃B B ε A ∧ ∀BC (B ε AC ε A) → B ε C ∧ ∀B B ε AB ε a)

Several things are notable about this axiom and its formulation. It is in the form of a universally quantified equivalence, with the right-hand side as it were explicating the left-hand side, so that it is a kind of implicit definition of the primitive ‘ε’. The right-hand side, taking its cue from Russell, says that there is at least one A (first conjunct), there is at most one A (second conjunct), and any A is an a (third conjunct). The use of capital letter variables is an informal aid to perspicuity: they mark the positions in sentences (especially before ‘ε’) where a variable can only yield a truth of its immediate context if it is singular. Where small Italic variables are used, there is no such presumption of singularity. In principle only one typeface of variables is needed. On the basis of his axiom Leśniewski developed a powerful system of general logic comparable in strength to a simple type theory.

3.3 Protothetic

Both Mereology and Ontology presuppose a deeper logical layer, comprising a propositional logic of connectives like ‘if’, ‘not’ and ‘and’, and the as yet unexplicated logic of the quantifiers ‘for all’ (‘∀’) and ‘for some’ (‘∃’). Having settled Ontology on an axiomatic basis, Leśniewski turned to the axiomatization of this. He originally spoke of the “theory of deduction”, which was the name Whitehead and Russell used for the propositional calculus, but because they did not introduce a logic of quantifiers until later, he coined the term ‘Protothetic’, from the Greek for ‘first theses’. It is characteristic of Leśniewski's logic that he introduces quantifiers in the most basic part of his logic, even before names are introduced. This is unlike most modern theories, which introduce quantifiers only when names and predicates are brought in. It leads to questions about the nature of quantification in Leśniewski which we will revisit below.

Leśniewski's preference for an axiom system, based in part on the success of Ontology, and also on considerations about the nature of definition, was to base a logical system on the single connective of material equivalence, together with the universal quantifier. He was held up for some time in doing this for Protothetic by his inability to see how to eliminate the connective of conjunction in terms of equivalence. Given quantification and equivalence, negation is easy to define, in a way Russell once suggested to Frege:

Def.~ : p~p ↔ (p ↔ ∀r r)

The solution was found for Leśniewski by his 21-year-old doctoral student Alfred Teitelbaum, later renowned under his adopted name as Alfred Tarski. It consisted in quantifying not just sentences but sentential functions or connectives:

Def.∧: pqpq ↔ ∀f p ↔ (f(p) ↔ f(q))

in this case, quantifying one-place connectives. Assuming there are just four of these connectives, assertion, negation, Verum (tautology) and Falsum (contradiction), it is straightforward to show that the right-hand side is equivalent to the conjunction of p and q. Tarski's doctoral dissertation centres around this result.

As to axiomatization, Leśniewski knew that the pure theory of equivalence could be based on two axioms stating skew-transitivity and associativity:

P1 ((pr) ↔ (qp)) ↔ (rq)
P2 (p ↔ (qr)) ↔ ((pq) ↔ r)

Pure equivalential calulus has the quaint property, shown by Leśniewski, that a formula is a theorem if and only if every propositional variable in it occurs an even number of times. After universally quantifying these axioms, a further axiom was added to introduce propositional functions, in this case two-placed ones

P3 gpf g(pp) ↔ (∀rf(rr) ↔ g(pp) ↔ ∀rf(rr) ↔ g((p ↔ ∀qq) ↔ p)) ↔ ∀qg(qp)

Once again Leśniewski and his students sought after shorter and more perspicuous formulations, or ones consisting of a single axiom, though the latter tended to be neither short nor perspicuous.

With Protothetic launched, Leśniewski could now look back on his system of foundations and see that it consisted of a hierarchy of three systems, developed in reverse order: Protothetic, introducing connectives, quantifiers and higher functions; Ontology, introducing the new category of names, with the new primitive ‘is’, and Mereology, based on a primitive mereological functor such as ‘part of’ or ‘ingredient of’, but introducing no new categories of expressions not already foreseen in Ontology.

4. Philosophical Aspects of Leśniewski's Logic

4.1 Semantic Categories

One of Leśniewski's most lasting contributions to the metatheory of logic is his theory of semantic categories. This grew out of a theory of simple types which he developed about 1922. In type theory, expressions belonging to different logical types cannot be substituted for one another without turning grammatical or well-formed expressions into ungrammatical or ill-formed ones. Only well-formed or grammatical expressions may have a sense or meaning. The theory was developed by Bertrand Russell as a way of blocking set-theoretic paradoxes, though there were anticipations in the work of Ernst Schröder and Gottlob Frege. In type theory it is usually assumed that variables at each type range over a domain of entities specific to that type, and that all such domains are mutually disjoint. In Frege for instance the domains were objects and functions of various levels, while in Russell they are a hierarchy of propositional functions. This platonistic and ontologically inflationary position was naturally uncongenial to the nominalist Leśniewski, and he readjusted the notion of category, turning categories from classes of entities (with their attendant expressions) to classes of expressions alone. His inspiration was in part the traditional syntactic theory of different parts of speech, and in part Husserl's theory of Bedeutungskategorien (meaning categories) from the latter's Logical Investigations. Where Husserl's categories were of abstract meanings, Leśniewski, ever the nominalist, substituted categories of (concrete) expressions. Although like later writers he could have called the classes of expressions ‘syntactic categories’, he deliberately chose the expression ‘semantic categories’ in order to emphasize that the expressions combined grammatically are all meaningful, unlike the meaningless marks proposed by formalist writers of the Hilbert School.

Leśniewski himself never gave an explicit formulation of the theory of semantic categories, being content to work with them in practice. The first formulation was by his contemporary Kazimierz Ajdukiewicz, in the 1935 article ‘Syntactic Connection’. Ajdukiewicz's essay became the fountainhead of the subsequent subdiscipline of categorial grammar. Modifying Ajdukiewicz's notation, we may explain semantic categories as Leśniewski used them. It should be noted that the theory applies only to Leśniewski's logical systems, not to ordinary language, about which Leśniewski became rather sceptical as to its ability to be unambiguously precise. Subsequently it has been shown that categorial grammar can be applied quite successfully to the syntax of natural languages.

There are in Leśniewski two basic categories: sentence (S) and name (N). In Protothetic, only the former is used: Ontology and Mereology add the latter. The distinction between sentences and names is ultimate: what we can say about sentences is that they are there to say things that are true or false (obviously from a logical point of view we are overlooking questions and commands), whereas names are there to denote things. Leśniewski, following tradition, allows names to denote several things, or one thing, or indeed no things as all. So ‘Istanbul’ denotes one thing, namely the Turkish city, ‘city’ denotes many things, namely all cities, and ‘unicorn’ denotes nothing at all. In Leśniewski's mature work Mill's notion of connotation is dropped, along with the concept of property which it employs, so the sole logical function of names is denoting. Again following tradition rather than the modern approach of Frege and Russell, Leśniewski makes no syntactic distinction between general terms or common nouns on the one hand and singular terms or proper names on the other. This is often said to be because his native Polish lacks definite and indefinite articles, which make the distinction more grammatically obvious, but this conjecture is nonsense because Leśniewski spoke and wrote fluent German, and German is awash with articles. It seems much more likely that Leśniewski deliberately chose to follow the traditional rather than the modern way because he thought it both more expressively powerful and closer to natural language.

Since language does not consist solely of unarticulated sentences or names, there are expressions of other categories, which combine in a rule-governed way with one another to produce further expressions, ultimately sentences. In the regimented environment of Leśniewski's logical languages this always takes place in the following way: a combining expression, which we may call a functor, precedes a left parenthesis of some kind, which is then followed by a sequence of one or more argument expressions, followed by a right parenthesis symmetric to the other one, which terminates the complex. The general schema is then

functor +left parenthesis+argument 1 + … + argument n+right parenthesis

as exemplified by

F(a1… an)

or, more concretely, ~(p), ϙ(pq), ε{Aa}.

Now let us provide a notation, inspired by Ajdukiewicz, for the category of a functor such as ‘F’. If the category of ‘a1’ is α1, the category of ‘an’ is αn, and the category of the whole expression ‘F(a1… an)’ is β, then the category of the functor expression ‘F’ we write as


which indicates the category of the output to the left and the category of its inputs in order within the angled brackets. Call this the categorial index of the expression. Thus the category of sentential negation is S⟨S⟩, that of conjunction is S⟨SS⟩, while that of the epsilon functor ‘ε’ is S⟨NN⟩, since it builds a sentence using two names as arguments.

What Ajdukiewicz showed in his 1935 paper was that we can develop a calculus of grammatical combination using such a notation: we take a putatively well-formed expression, rearrange it if necessary into functor-first order, then see if we can “multiply out” arguments and functors to arrive at a single categorial index. If we can, the complex expression is grammatical, well-formed, or syntactically connected. For example ‘ε{Aa}’ is syntactically connected as follows: writing the category of an expression e as |e| we have

|ε| = S⟨NN⟩, |A| = |a| = N, so |ε{Aa}| = S⟨NN⟩ × (N × N) = S

as we would expect. Ajdukiewicz used a “quotient” notation instead of our angled brackets; this makes the idea of “multiplying out” more graphic, but becomes cumbersome for complex cases.

There may be functors whose arguments are functors: for example a conjunction holding between two binary predicates has a category S⟨S⟨NN⟩S⟨NN⟩⟩. There may also be what are called many-link functors, which are functors whose values are functors. For example, the English morpheme ‘–ly’ converts an adjective, category N⟨N⟩, into an adverb, for example of category S⟨N⟩⟨S⟨N⟩⟩, so ‘–ly’ has effective category S⟨N⟩⟨S⟨N⟩⟩⟨N⟨N⟩⟩. In some subsequent categorial grammars, transitive verbs are quite plausibly taken to have the many-link category S⟨N⟩⟨N⟩ rather than the binary predicate category S⟨NN⟩. This move is indeed a standard trick in logic, first introduced by Moses Schönfinkel in 1924, for dispensing with many-placed functors in favor of many-link but one-placed functors. Had he known of this, Leśniewski would no doubt have disapproved. While there is no loss of logical power in eliminating many-placed functors, the move is unnatural, and Leśniewski would not have countenanced defining many-placed functors as many-link ones in disguise, as we find in Church for instance.

With the two basic categories of sentence and name, every category and expression, no matter how complex, will have a categorial index beginning either with ‘S’, so ultimately leading to the formation of a sentence, or ‘N’, so ultimately leading to the formation of a name. Following a useful terminological suggestion of Eugene Luschei, we may call the former propositive categories and expressions, the latter nominative categories and expressions (Luschei 1962, 169).

Note that the parentheses in Leśniewski's notation do not themselves have a category: they are syncategorematic. Their function is twofold: to mark the beginnings and ends of argument strings, and to help indicate the semantic category of the functors. Thus Leśniewski used round parentheses for functors yielding sentences from sentences, i.e. connectives, and braces for functors yielding sentences from names, i.e. predicates. In principle an unlimited number of shapes of parentheses might be required, and indeed in some works of students of Sobociński there are several dozens of different shapes. Leśniewski gave parentheses this second role because he wished to remain very flexible about the forms of expression used for functors, even allowing the same shape to be used in “analogous” functors, for example 3-placed conjunction, or “higher-order” epsilons and equivalences, or other logical constants. Obviously this is a contingent feature of his notation: other conventions will do just as well.

More important for metalogical purposes is the fact that the universal quantifier too is syncategorematic in Leśniewski. This is marked symbolically in that the lower corners which he used to symbolize the universal quantifier are no more than a container for the variables, but more crucially, in that any finite string of different variables may occur in such a quantifier, no matter how assorted their categories. There are some advantages in this flexibility. Leśniewski does not need to give rules for many different kinds of universal quantifier, but gives rules for the one sort in one go. But there are some disadvantages too. In his “official” notation for his logics, Leśniewski has only the universal quantifier, and does not define the particular quantifier or any others in the standard way. This was also Frege's practice, but whereas in Frege's case the parsimony seems to have been self-inflicted, in Leśniewski's case there is a systematic reason. Leśniewski was scrupulous about giving exact rules for admitting new expressions by definition. He gave such rules for Protothetic, and extended them to Ontology. These rules govern only basic and functor category expressions. Quantifiers, being variable binders, are neither basic nor functor expressions, but Leśniewski was unable to come up with acceptable canons of definition for such variable binders. He would have liked to have done so, and indeed offered students any degree they wanted, from Master's to Habilitation, if they could formulate adequate rules, but no one could. Therefore in the “official” system the universal quantifier remained as a syncategorematic expression, but still entered into legal combinations, which meant that the syntax of his systems was not fully captured by categorial grammar. Such a limitation became apparent to Ajdukiewicz also, who made an unsuccessful attempt to rectify it. Ajdukiewicz noted perceptively that a language containing Russell's circumflex abstraction operator, which Alonzo Church had notated using the Greek lambda, would be able to express any operator as a combination of an abstraction operator with a functor. Church employed this method to considerable advantage in his logic, but this work came too late to help Leśniewski. In any case, in Church it simply pushed the problem of syncategorematicity over to the lambda operator.

4.2 Definitions

The status of definitions in logic and outside it has been surprisingly controversial. Probably the standard view among logicians is that of Russell, according to which definitions are mere abbreviations whose role is to render complex propositions more easily surveyable by feeble humans. According to this view, when a logician defines, say, conjunction in terms of implication and negation, as

pq   =df   ~(p → ~q)

this is to be understood as merely a shorter expression substituting for the longer one. In this case the abbreviatory value is negligible, but in the case of some long expressions, such as that for the ancestral of a relation, or in very many areas of mathematics, it may be considerable. Russell expressed this view somewhat over-dramatically by calling a definition an expression of the author's will. On this view, a definition cannot be true or false; it may be appropriate or helpful, or not, and there are certain proprieties to be observed, such as not having dangling variables in either definiens or definiendum, and not trying to define an expression in terms of itself, but beyond this, the methodological requirements on abbreviation are minimal. In many modern logical systems, definitions are said to be confined to the metalanguage only, and not to appear in the object language at all.

There is nothing wrong with this view, but it is emphatically not that of Leśniewski. According to him, a definition introduces a new expression into the object language. Again, the proprieties have to be respected, and getting these right turns out to be a tricky matter. Also, it is up to the author of a logical system as to which definitions he or she chooses to introduce. But there is an important difference. Since definitions add new expressions to the object language, they add expressions in places where they can be quantified, and so can enhance the system's expressive power. Leśniewski admits this option: according to him it is the logician's job to keep adding to the system. If in the process, new things are provable that were not provable before, so much the better, provided the proprieties are respected. If we can prove a theorem not containing a defined expression after a definition has been introduced that could not be proved before, the definition is said to be creative. Most logicians decry creative definitions: Leśniewski embraced them. Leśniewski contended that the symbol ‘=Def.’ used by most logicians actually sneaks an unrecognized primitive into their work. He thought this of Whitehead and Russell, and it is why he wanted to formulate Protothetic based on equivalence alone, since then the same connective is primitive that is used for definitions. In his view, definitions are object-language equivalences and should be recognized as such. In retrospect we can see that this view was too extreme. There is room for abbreviatory definitions, and indeed Leśniewski “inoffically” used one himself, that of the particular quantifier. What Leśniewski calls ‘definitions’ might better be called ‘definitional axioms’. That these can be added as we go along rather than collected together at the beginning of a logic is simply a feature of his way of doing logic.

Perhaps the most important creative definition used by Leśniewski is one from Ontology, due to Tarski in 1921. Is is for a functor * of category N⟨N⟩:

ABA ε *(B) ↔ ∃cA ε cB ε A

where ‘A ε *(B)’ can be read as ‘A is the unique B’. It allowed the long axiom of Ontology to be replaced by the short one (see below): without it, the replacement was not possible.

4.3 Nominalism

We noted that Leśniewski, persuaded by his argument against Twardowski's general objects, was a nominalist. It was no doubt part of his antipathy towards set theory. His friend Kotarbiński formulated a very extreme nominalism, called variously reism, pansomatism, and concretism, according to which the only things that exist are material bodies. Leśniewski would not go this far, because he did not see how after-images and dreamt things, which he thought existed, could be material bodies. But in elaborating his logic he emphatically rejects anything which is not concrete, individual, located in space and time. This goes for the logical systems themselves. His view, which would nowadays be called inscriptionalism, is that logical systems are actual collections of concrete marks, whether printed on paper in books and journals, or in handwritten notes, or more ephemerally as spoken words, chalk marks on blackboards, or (nowadays) patterns on computer screens. Leaving aside the non-trivial metaphysical question of what can in principle count as a logical inscription, we must consider what effect this stance had on his attitude to logic and logic systems.

The effect is far-reaching and radical. If a logical system is a concrete complex of signs, then it cannot be infinite. Also, to conform to logical practice, it has to be admitted that logical systems change over time. Ideally, they change by being added to, as new theorems are proved. In practice, they may degrade or be wholly destroyed, which was indeed the sad fate of Leśniewski's own personally written systems in November 1944. If a logical system is published in a book or journal, and there are several copies, then there are as many such systems as there are copies. Assuming the copies are all faithful, then each copy is typographically exactly like all the others. They are, in Leśniewski's parlance, all equiform. In practice of course, equiformity is not quite exact, even in printed works, but the minute variations are insignificant, and in any case we wish to recognize handwritten manuscripts and other variants to be equiform for logical purposes with systems which are physically somewhat different. Again the metaphysical fine detail is less important that the fact that we get by most of the time with constrainedly inexact similarity.

Almost all metalogical ways of dealing with logical systems are platonistic. They assume that the simple and complex expressions are abstract types, that they are infinite in number, that an axiom system has infinitely many logical theorems, and so on. Leśniewski can admit none of this. So he has to find a way to deal with logical systems as something organic, growing and changing with time. He does so by employing a complex system of metalogical definitions, which he calls ‘terminological explanations’, and inference rules, which he calls ‘directives’. In effect Leśniewski gives a schematic grammatical and logical framework for an indefinitely extensible language, decades in advance of the advent of formal descriptions of computer programming languages, which are the nearest equivalent elsewhere.

It is hard to give a flavor of the terminological explanations (TEs) in a short space: their complexity and cumulative effect has to appreciated at first hand. The most thorough account is in the TEs for Protothetic in Grundzüge, Section 11, and there is also a compressed account of TEs for Ontology. A somewhat more manageable set for a version of propositional calculus with definitions, based on Łukasiewicz's bracketless notation, is given in the 1931 paper ‘Über Definitionen in der sogenannten Theorie der Deduktion’, and based on lectures from 1930–31. There Leśniewski gives TEs in words rather than symbolic abbreviations, and with copious examples. Nevertheless, it is intellectually challenging, since for all the complex TEs (metalogical definitions), Leśniewski demanded logical independence of all the various clauses, to be shown by suitable models. As a result, it took graduate students three semesters to work through a set of TEs in Leśniewski's seminar (personal information from Czesław Lejewski) .

The TEs are a means to an end: that of formulating a system's directives. A directive sounds like an imperative, but its illocutionary force is subtler. Assume a logical system has been developed up to a certain point, that is, up to a certain last written thesis (Leśniewski's word covering axioms, theorems and definitions). At the very least, the axiom or axioms will have been written down. Assume for the sake of argument that the development has been fine up to now. There is no categorical imperative to extend the system by adding another thesis, but let us suppose the system's author (or indeed any assistant) wishes to do so. He or she writes down a new collection of marks. Not just anything goes however. The marks have to be legible (obviously), grammatically well-formed as a sentence (no unbound variables are allowed), and finally admissible according to the directives. The directives lay down what may be admitted next after a given sequence of theses. For example, the next thesis may be an instantiation from a previous universally quantified thesis, or a modus ponens from two previous theses, or a quantifier distribution from a previous thesis, or a definition acceptable according to the canons, or a thesis of extensionality. Admissibility is always relativized to the prior sequence: the order of introduction matters. If the new candidate thesis is admissible according to one of the directives, it passes the test and becomes part of the system, which can then be extended still further. Otherwise it is rejected and the system is not extended.

Leśniewski's supreme achievement as a logician, in his own eyes, was to formulate the metalogical requirements for extending a concrete system by directives, relative to the previous state of the system. Since the system is not planned or fixed in advance, the TEs and directives have to be schematically flexible enough to accommodate any future additions, while not being so liberal as to allow contradictions or nonsense to arise. Finding that balance, most especially in the rules for admissible definitions, was a considerable feat. The definition of ‘definition’ for Protothetic run to 18 separate complex clauses, and in Ontology, which adds a second style of definition, another 18 clauses.

Definitions, which seem so peripheral to most logical systems, are in fact key to the potential power of Leśniewski's logic. The axioms of a system generally use very few semantic categories near the bottom of the recursive hierarchy. It is by definitions that new semantic categories are introduced into the system; once a new category is in, variables for it may be introduced and quantified, a thesis of extensionality formulated for it, and it can provide arguments for further, higher-level functors. So although, unlike a typed logic conceived platonistically, only finitely many types or categories are actually in play in any one system, the potential to go on is restricted only by contingent limitations.

The easiest way to get an idea of how definitions work in Leśniewski's logic is not to look at the published work on Mereology or Protothetic, but at the extended list of “Definitions and Theses of Leśniewski's Ontology” from S. Leśniewski's Lecture Notes on Logic, published in 1988. Taken from student notes of a 1929–30 lecture course ‘Elementary Outline of Ontology’, they comprise one axiom, 59 definitions and 633 listed (not proved) theorems, covering syllogistic, Boolean algebra, the notions of property(-predicate) and higher-order property, relations, higher-order epsilons, and several chunks of the theory of relations including converses, fields and relative products, as known from Peirce, Schröder, Whitehead and Russell. Not coincidentally, the sketched development includes a large number of styles of parentheses.

4.4 Quantification

Much has been written about the way in which Leśniewski understood the quantifiers ‘for some’ (∃) and ‘for all’ (∀). There are three aspects to the controversy: (1) how the quantifiers are to be read; (2) how they are to be understood; and (3) the logical and philosophical significance of the way they are understood. The controversy arose principally because of a discrepancy between the way in which Leśniewski and Leśniewskians take the quantifiers to mean, and the orthodox way of understanding them, as formulated in particular by Quine. Leśniewski's student Lejewski recounts how after moving from Poland to Britain he was surprised to find that the local (Quinean) understanding was very different from the one he had grown up with. The problem is exacerbated by the fact that Leśniewski did not produce or even envisage a semantics for his logic, considering, as had Frege and Russell, that his system was already meaningful and had no need of a semantics to be grafted onto it from outside. Historically it is interesting that Quine's preoccupation with the idea of ontological commitment and its connection to quantification and its domain, go back to discussions he had with Leśniewski when he visited Warsaw in 1933. Quine relates that he and Leśniewski stayed up until late at night disputing whether the use of higher-order variables committed Leśniewski to platonic objects, as Quine thought, or not, as Leśniewski thought. Obviously to a nominalist like Leśniewski the thought that his cherished system should involve him in unwanted ontological commitments would be most repugnant.

As to the reading of the quantifiers, while we note that in his pre-symbolic writings Leśniewski favored expressions like “for some meaning of the expression ‘x’ ” and “for every meaning of the expression ‘x’ ”, which may give us a hint as to how he understood quantification, he later preferred the unadorned ‘for some’ and ‘for all’, followed by the relevant variables, and it seems sensible simply to follow this.

The meaning or interpretation of the quantifiers is a more subtle question. It seems very likely that Leśniewski thought of the quantifiers as a notational necessity when a domain could be infinite, since infinite disjunctions and conjunctions were not possible. In Protothetic, as its computational variant makes clear, there is strictly no need for quantifiers, since each semantic category, no matter how high in the hierarchy, has only finitely many possible (extensional) values. But in Ontology, where there is no logical requirement that the domain of individuals be finite, the quantifiers are indispensable. One thing for sure is that they cannot be given an existentially committed reading, where ‘for some’ means ‘there exists’. The reason is that the laws of quantification and the definability in Ontology of a necessarily empty term ‘Λ’, for which it is true that no Λ exists, entail the truth of the quantified proposition ‘for some a, no a exists’ (cf. T.127 of “Definitions and Theses of Leśniewski's Ontology” in S. Lesniewski's Lecture Notes in Logic). This would be contradictory if ‘for some’ meant ‘there exists’. Leśniewski always used the expression ‘particular quantifier’ rather than ‘existential quantifier’. So the question is how the quantifiers are to be understood if not in the standard way.

Quine took from his discussions with Leśniewski the idea that the quantifiers were somehow substitutional. There is an element of truth in this. A universally quantified formula ∀XX licenses the inference to any formula —C— obtained by substituting any well-formed expression C of the appropriate category in place of the bound variable X, and likewise for all the other variables occuring bound by the same quantifier. Dually, from —C— one may infer ∃XX for suitable categories of bound variable. These are the usual quantifier rules, liberalized to apply to any categories of variable in batches of one or more. So for example if there is a theorem universally quantifying nominal variables, such as ‘∀aany a is an a’, we can validly infer ‘any Λ is a Λ’ even though the name is empty. Quine assumed that the lack of ontological commitment must entail that the quantifiers range over expressions rather than things. This would not have been acceptable to Leśniewski, because it would constitute use/mention confusion, and because while it is true for the nominalist that there are only finitely many expressions, it is not known to be true, and may in fact be false, that there are only finitely many things.

Is there then a third way to understand the quantifiers that is neither referential nor substitutional? Such a way has been suggested by Guido Küng, based on the young Leśniewski's reading of the quantifiers as “for all [some] meanings of the variable ‘x’ ”. Take this preamble to be what Küng calls a prologue functor, which mentions the expression ‘x’, but take its matrix (the part after the quantifier, within the upper corners) to be a context of use of the variable, and take the variables to range over meanings, in Leśniewski's case, extensions (Küng 1977). Again there is something right and something wrong about this. If extensions are (as standardly understood) various kinds of sets, nothing could be more abhorrent to Leśniewski. He laid great store on logic not being committed to the existence of anything, being ontologically neutral: no existence statement is a theorem of any of his systems. So to have found that after all he is committed, by the back door as it were, to the hated sets, would have been a bitter blow. The correct insight of this understanding is that neither objects nor expressions are what quantifier expressions range over. They do not range over extensions either: they do not range over anything. But for each category of expression there are numerous ways in which an expression of that category can mean. A sentence can be true or they can be false. A name can name one thing, or several things, all things, or no things at all. Functor expressions mean according to how the way the outputs of their combinations mean when their inputs have certain meanings. Given a domain of individuals, in principle all possible ways of meaning are delimited for all categories of expression. Quantifiers tap into this potentiality. But it goes against the nominalist grain of Leśniewski's thought to reify all the different potential ways an expression could mean as if these were additional objects. So when Leśniewski told Quine his use of quantified variables in categories other than names did not commit him to platonic objects, he was being truthful. What he was committed to, from the moment he accepted bivalence of truth and falsity onwards, was that expressions of the various categories may be variously meaningful.

4.5 Leśniewski's Aversion to Semantics

We have seen how Leśniewski developed his logical systems in the struggle to provide an antinomy-free foundation for mathematics, comparable to those of Frege or Whitehead and Russell, but without their defects. His gradual move from a highly stylized prose-with-variables to fully formalized systems precluded him from considering his logic as an uninterpreted system, as did Hilbert. From the start, he considered his systems, even the fully formalized ones, to be comprised of constant expressions, primitive and defined, with a fixed intended meaning, which he attempted to make clear by examples and elucidations. He also considered all his axioms and theorems to be true. In this he was following Frege and Russell, who likewise did not envisage an external source as somehow conveying a meaning upon expressions and truth upon sentences of logic.

This attitude to logic began to be overtaken by the development of logical semantics, not least at the hands of his own former student Tarski. The turning point came with the publication of Tarski's essay on the concept of truth in the languages of deductive sciences. This paper was produced in a preliminary version in 1929–30, updated when Gödel's incompleteness results became known in 1931, and eventually published in Polish in 1933. Leśniewski was known to be opposed to it. There are probably two reasons for this. One is that in his metalogical apparatus Tarski avails himself of set theory. Even though his use is not extensive, it is an incursion of set theory into the metatheory of logic, of which Leśniewski could not but disapprove. The other reason is probably that whereas in earlier parts of the monograph Tarski adheres faithfully to a conception of finite types akin to Leśniewski's theory of semantic categories, in later parts he distances himself from this as an unwarranted restriction and accepts the propriety of transfinite types.

There is in fact nothing inherently anti-semantic about Leśniewski's logical systems. They may be given more standard formulations and considered model-theoretically (cf. Stachniak 1981.) They may also be investigated metalogically in their own terms, and without reneging on Leśniewski's scruples about abstract entities. The fact is that few people have considered it worth the effort of pursuing the project.

5. Mature Systems

Throughout the 1920s, Leśniewski and his students worked hard to improve the logical systems by finding single axioms, shorter axioms, trying out new primitives, and generally seeking logical perfection. The work, and Leśniewski's involvement in teaching, were so intense that for several years he published nothing. As this became something of an embarrassment, since his results were being quoted without being in print, he resolved to postpone a fully systematic exposition and present instead a more autobiographical account of how the systems arose and were improved. This took the form of two series of articles from 1927–31. One series, ‘O podstawach matematyki’ [‘On the Foundations of Mathematics’] appeared in the premier Polish philosophy journal Przegląd Filozoficzny, and, eschewing mathematical symbolism, was dedicated to an up-to-date exposition of Mereology. The other series, ‘Grundzüge eines neuen Systems der Grundlagen der Mathematik’ [‘Fundamentals of a New System of the Foundations of Mathematics’] began to appear in 1929 in the mathematical journal Fundamenta Mathematicae, and was dedicated to Protothetic. Its 81 pages and 11 sections ended with the promise ‘Fortsetzung folgt’, ‘Continuation follows’, but it did not, because in the meantime Leśniewski had fallen out with the other editors of the journal over the status of set theory. The article did not get beyond the preliminaries of Protothetic, setting out the history, axioms, and rules (directives) for extending the system, and outlining a number of variants, but not starting the deductions proper. It was not until a new logic journal Collectanea Logica was set up in 1938 that Leśniewski was able to continue. After a 60-page introduction to the continuation, ‘Einleitende Bemerkungen zur Fortsetzung meiner Mitteilung u.d.T. “Grundzüge eines neuen Systems der Grundlagen der Mathematik” ’, summarizing the earlier article and bringing the story up to date, there followed another 83 pages comprising Section 12, and listing twelve definitions and 422 theorems of Protothetic, with skeletal information about how they are derived, expressed in Leśniewski's own idiosyncratic notation for the connectives and quantifiers. The journal did not appear in print because of the outbreak of the Second World War: the printing plates from which offprints had fortunately been made were destroyed in the bombing of Warsaw in September 1939, by which time Leśniewski was already dead.

Leśniewski's own notation for Protothetic is explained in ‘Supplementary Remark III’ of the Introductory Remarks: one-place connectives are made up of a horizontal bar ‘–’ supplementable at either end by a vertical bar ‘|’. A bar at the right-hand end of the line signifies the connective gives output value T(rue) for input value T, the absence of a bar signifies the output value for input T is F(alse). Similarly a bar at the left-hand end of the line signifies output value T for input value F, the absence of a bar signifies output F for input F. The four extensional one-place connectives are thus systematically notated, with negation, the most important, written as ‘⊢’. For two-place connectives bars are added radially as spokes to a circular central hub ‘’. As before the presence of a bar indicates an output value T, its absence an output value F. The top position is for first and second inputs F, the bottom position for first and second inputs T, the left position for first input T and second input F, the right position for first input F and second input T. Thus all sixteen possibilities are catered for. For example the conjunction connective is written ‘ϙ’. If one connective H is contained geometrically in another G, the implication G(pq) → H(pq) holds, and merging two connectives gives a connective equivalent to their conjunction. While this notation is systematic and elegant, it has never caught on. Like Łukasiewicz, Leśniewski always puts the connective before its arguments, but he encloses the arguments in parentheses, thus the conjunction of p and q is written ‘ϙ(pq)’. The reason for parentheses, which Łukasiewicz could dispense with, will become clear. In this “official” notation, the only quantifier is the universal, written by placing the variables bound between lower corners, as for example ‘ ˻pqf˼ ’, and placing the quantifier scope or matrix within upper corners, so for example ‘˻pqf˼ ϙ(f(pq)f(qp))’ is Leśniewski's way of writing what we write as ‘pqf f(pq) ∧ f(qp)’. In his everyday logical work and derivations however, Leśniewski used a slightly modified version of Whitehead and Russell's Principia Mathematica notation.

Among the variant versions of Protothetic Leśniewski mentions in his 1929 article, one is a single-axiom version containing 82 signs. (In 1945 Sobociski produced a single axiom version with 54 signs only.) The other and more interesting idea is an algorithmic or “computative” system of Protothetic, mentioned above in Section 8. This is in effect a way to formalize the idea of truth-tables, invented by Łukasiewicz, but applied beyond simply sentences to the values of more complex functors of first and higher order. Leśniewski does not take the idea very far, but it was subsequently developed further by Owen Le Blanc.

To modern students of logic accustomed to streamlined methods of working with propositional logic, Leśniewski's Protothetic, especially in its “official” versions, must appear very cumbersome and difficult to understand and work with. In part this is a question of the age of the systems and Leśniewski's aversion to semantics (see above). However, Leśniewski did not always present his work so fiercely. For purposes of everyday derivation he employed what can only be described as a system of natural deduction, making assumptions, following their consequences, collecting them and inferring conditionals and biconditionals, in the manner to which all students of logic have since become accustomed. Astonishingly, neither he nor any of his students thought fit to codify these practices into a system of rules. This was done instead at Łukasiewicz's suggestion by Stanisław Jaśkowski. The discovery of natural deduction is generally attributed to others, but there is a chance that Leśniewski used it, in a recognizably modern form, earlier than others. That he did not codify it probably resulted from his viewing it as a pedagogical device and a way of sketching out how a “proper” (i.e. axiomatic) proof was to go. Another way to take some of the forbidding appearance out of Protothetic is to look for more readily comprehensible axioms. The following two-axiom set based on implication as the primitive (an alternative Leśniewski also looked at) is rather straightforward; the result was again obtained by Tarski:

P3 pqp → (qp)
P4 pqrf f (rp) → (f (r (p → ∀ss) ) → f (rq) )

The first is the universal closure of a standard axiom of propositional calculus going back to Frege. Recalling that F(alse) can be defined as ∀ss and negation as p → F, the second is the universal closure of

f (rp) → (f (r ~p) → f (rq))

which simply says that if f (r any truth-value) then f(rq) for arbitrary q, and that it obviously correct. It can be (tediously) checked that the result is valid for all sixteen extensional binary truth-functions substitutible for ‘f ’. Dragging the whole of Protothetic out of these simple beginnings is obviously much harder, and depends on coming up with suitable definitions for the connectives.

In Ontology, Leśniewski and his students, particularly Sobociński, worked on replacing the 1920 “long” single axiom by a shorter one, eventually arriving at the unshortenable

OS AaA ε a ↔ ∀B A ε BB ε a

This axiom gives a much less obvious insight into the intended meaning of ‘ε’ than the original 1920 axiom. For a delicately balanced combination of brevity with clarity the following equivalent two-axiom set is perspicuous:

OS1 AbA ε bA ε A
OS2 ABc (A ε BB ε c) → A ε c

where notably the first axiom is precisely the one that Leśniewski mentioned to Twardowski in 1919.

Although Ontology is perhaps the most generally interesting of Leśniewski's systems, it was known during his lifetime less through his own published work, which was confined to a short, technical and inaccessible memoir, but through a gentle and sympathetic exposition in Kotarbiński's 1929 widely read and influential Warsaw texbook known simply as the Elementy. Kotarbiński explains how he had no need to come up with a logical system of names and predicates, since he could get one ready-made from a firm with an excellent reputation. Leśniewski was duly grateful for the plug.

The fact that the basic sentence-module in Ontology is singular inclusion of the form ‘A ε b’ has misled some commentators into thinking that Leśniewski turned his back on the Fregean notion of predication as functional application and instead reverted to a medieval “two-name” account of predication. Indeed, except for the matter of tense, Leśniewski's account of the truth-conditions of such singular sentences—that they are true if and only if the subject term denotes a single object and the predicate term denotes one or more objects of which this is one—is almost exactly the same as that given by the medieval nominalist William of Ockham. However, whether or not Ockham was a two-name theorist, Leśniewski definitely was not. The general form of the singular sentence is the same as that of any binary predication, f(ab), or in Leśniewski's notation, f{ab}. Singular inclusion is no syncategorematic copula: it is a special binary predicate. That it is chosen as the primitive is understandable but not compulsory. Leśniewski knew that other predicates than ‘ε’ could be taken as primitive, a fact emphasized later by Lejewski.

It was in Mereology, Leśniewski's oldest system, that there were the most varied developments. The 1927–30 article series on Mereology as part of the foundations of mathematics rang the changes in possible primitives. After scathing attacks on Whitehead's and Russell's use/mention confusions in Principia, and on standard set theories, he retraces the formal development of his 1916 paper, noting in a long footnote the similarities with Whitehead's theory of events, whose formal development he also criticises. He then summarizes the development up to 1920, continuing with additional results unpublished in 1916, taking the number of theorems up to 198. Further chapters tidy up the axiomatization in terms of ‘part’, and show that ‘ingredient’ can be taken as primitive. The theorems are taken up to 264, then ‘exterior’ is shown to be a possible primitive. There the development is arrested, and a final section discusses singular propositions of the form ‘A ε b’, with a note on how to understand propositions about a thing which changes. Using the example ‘Warsaw of 1830 is smaller bigger than Warsaw of 1930’, Leśniewski proposes to consider ‘Warsaw in 1830’ and ‘Warsaw in 1930’ as denoting time-slices of the temporally much longer object he calls ‘Warsaw from the beginning to the end of its existence’. In this way he claims to bring many uses of ‘is’ in ordinary language within the scope of an analysis using his Ontology. This four-dimensional understanding of ordinary objects is now commonplace, but at that time it was something of a rarity. The discussion is one of the few places in Leśniewski's mature work where he indulges in anything similar to the philosophical logic of his early years. Otherwise, when not discussing formal systems and proving theorems, his prose discussions tend to be intemperate though frequently justified criticisms of the statements of others, most especially the proponents of standard set theory.

6. Personality and Legacy

6.1 Leśniewski as a Person

Normally the character of an academic is of marginal relevance to his or her work. In the case of Leśniewski there is reason to think otherwise. The extreme rigor that he applied in logic, the unflichingly high standards he set himself and others, his blank incomprehension of intellectual, formal and linguistic inexactness, and his willingness to let academic disagreement sour his relationships with colleagues, all speak of an unusual rigidity. This seems to have been deeply anchored: of his school days we know little other than that he was intolerant of exceptions to any rule, whether or not the rule was sensible. After one of his early Polish essays was typeset with a spelling mistake in the title (‘środku’ instead of ‘środka’), he always quoted the incorrect title, because to correct it would have been to break the rule that quotation must be literal and exact. In his early years he nursed the project of translating Anton Marty's rambling and polemical 1908 treatise Untersuchungen zur Grundlegung der allgemeinen Grammatik und Sprachphilosophie [Investigations on the Founding of General Grammar and Philosophy of Language]. He never got beyond the second word of the title, ‘zur’, which is admittedly not easily captured in all its nuances—it can mean ‘toward’ as well as ‘on’ or ‘about’. Having carried a copy of the book around for some time and asked all his friends and colleagues how they would translate ‘zur’, he gave up. No doubt his interests shifted, but the incident demonstrates both his punctiliousness and his inflexibility.

Biographical material about Leśniewski is fairly sparse, and it is even harder to gain a clear idea of what he was like as a person. A photograph of him in Twardowski's seminar in 1913 shows a short, dapper man with a goatee and a flamboyant neckscarf, as described by Łukasiewicz. A later photograph from the same period lacks the goatee but retains a moustache. The two known later photos show a stiffly-posed, stocky, clean-shaven man in a business suit with the slicked-back hair of the period, looking more like a bank manager than a professor of logic, except for an intense stare. Leśniewski was known to be a fierce critic of what he considered unclear, which was pretty well everything. His stock complaint was that he could not understand what speakers were saying, or writers were writing. In the light of his pathological inability to see beyond the literal meaning on the page to any intended but inaccurately expressed meaning this is unsurprising, but also unendearing. In the early 1920s Marjan Borowski, the editor of Przegląd Filozoficzny, complained to Twardowski that people were afraid to submit papers or give talks in Warsaw because they were fearful of being criticised by Leśniewski, though he added with some glee that the scourge of God had risen up against him in the shape of one Tajtelbaum – the young Tarski. Even the phlegmatic Twardowski found his former student irritating: in a diary entry for 12 August 1930 he complains, “In general those who behave according to Lesniewski's model ask very arbitrarily for analysis where it is convenient to them—if, however, one of them asks for analysis where it is not convenient to him, they turn to intuition. And if the opposer in the discussion sometimes tries to turn to intuition, they reply ‘We don’t understand what you consider to be intuitively given’.” Twardowski's 1921 paper ‘Symbolomania and Pragmatophobia’ is a plea for philosophers not to put symbols above things, and is clearly directed against Łukasiewicz and Leśniewski and their students.

Leśniewski was however not lacking in a certain heavy humor. Lejewski reported that he once mocked a Warsaw Professor of Classics for wearing sunglasses (then rather rare): “Is the world too dazzling for him?” He was equably resigned to his lectures being sparsely attended because of their extreme technicality. One semester, unexpectedly many students turned up at the first lecture. He looked around the room in surprise and asked “What are you all doing here? I am not Bergson.” For those who were just there for the sake of doing a course and clocking up their attendance he quietly signed off their lecture books straight away, and told them not to worry about coming again. The few die-hards came for the sake of the logic. Leśniewski would enter the lecture room with a briefcase stuffed with papers, root around, find where he had got to and carry on, writing formulas and explaining how they were derived. When Quine visited some of these lectures, he was able to follow them despite knowing no Polish.

Leśniewski married in 1913: his wife Zofia Prewysz-Kwinto came from a landed family in Lithuania. They had no children. Before World War I Leśniewski seems to have had the means to travel around to different German cities to study, and to spend time after his doctorate in Paris, San Remo and St. Petersburg.

Leśniewski inspired devotion in a very small coterie of students, a few of whom stayed fiercely loyal, but sooner or later he ended up alienating nearly everyone, either through his robust professional opinions, or his manner, or his political views. He started out as a radical socialist—his decision to spend the war in Russia was partly personal and partly political—but after the excesses of the October Revolution and its aftermath he rejected socialism. From the 1920s he supported the authoritarianism of Józef Piłsudski, but from about 1930 his views took on a darker anti-Semitic tinge. An unsavory letter written to Twardowski in 1935 complains of “filthy tricks” being played on him “by certain Jew-boys or their foreign friends”, declares a personal antipathy to Tarski, whose career he would not obstruct, but admits he “would be extraordinarily pleased if some day I were to read in the newspapers that he was being offered a full professorship, for example in Jerusalem, from where he could send us offprints of his valuable works to our great profit.” Tarski had been passed over for the chair in Lwów, which went to Chwistek on the strength of praise from Russell, even though the Varsovians, including Leśniewski, had supported Tarski. Tarski certainly felt aggrieved and no doubt suspected anti-Semitic motives, but like Leśniewski he was prickly and sensitive about matters of priority. It is in retrospect mildly grotesque to see how carefully Leśniewski and Tarski dance around each other in their prefaces and acknowledgements, neither wishing to give public offence to the other. Despite their disagreements and suspicions however, they long continued to meet once a week, with no one else present, to discuss logic.

Leśniewski's antipathy towards set theory was so vehement and his criticisms so intemperate that it led to a break in relations with his set-theoretically minded mathematical colleagues Sierpiński and Kuratowski; he resigned from the editorial board of Fundamenta Mathematicae, with the result that he was no longer able to publish his own work there. By the end of his life, Leśniewski's only surviving close friend was the saintly patient and faithful Kotarbiński, who alone of his colleagues visited him in hospital in his last illness. They had been born just one day apart in 1886. The cancer that killed Leśniewski was no doubt exacerbated by smoking: cigars and a large pipe. During the operation he was conscious and without anaesthetic because of the dangers and he was allowed to smoke even then to distract himself from the pain. But he did not recover, and died sitting in his favourite armchair, brought specially into the hospital.

6.2 Leśniewski's Legacy

Of the students that Leśniewski had taught at Warsaw, some went on to logical and philosophical careers of their own, most notably Tarski, whom Leśniewski correctly recognized as a genius, and who went on to outshine his teacher. Among those who stayed fairly close to Leśniewski's own views were Jerzy Słupecki, Bolesław Sobociński, Czesław Lejewski, and Henry Hiż. The first three in particular contributed after World War II to the reconstruction of many of the logical results that had been lost in 1944. Serendipitously recovered students’ notes from Leśniewski's lectures, translated and published in 1988, give some idea of the detail of Leśniewski's teaching, but his lectures ranged more widely than the extant works show. At all times however, Leśniewski's logical position was a minority one, which was respected while being rejected, and it won few converts after his death. The reasons for his sidelining have been analysed by Grzegorczyk (1955). Leśniewski's work was developed in the 1920s when an axiomatic approach was standard, as in Hilbert's school, but his negative attitude to semantics as a separable part of logic meant he was unsympathetic to the shift towards a semantic approach initiated by Tarski, and he would have remained opposed even had he lived longer. His vituperative rejection of set theory made him no friends and many enemies among mathematicians, while his unwillingness and inability to find anything worthwhile in the works of philosophers lost him their sympathy. His obsessive concern for the minute detail of axiomatizations was unattractive to many when more streamlined methods were available, and his radical nominalism made the presentation of logic according to his principles a matter of extreme inconvenience. Even Tarski, who was initially very much a follower, had to admit that Leśniewski's conception of logical systems as concrete collections of inscriptions growing in time through the addition of new theses made them “thoroughly unrewarding objects for methodological and semantic research”.

In retrospect we can see Leśniewski's obsession with the fine detail of axiomatics and his rejection of semantics as conditioned by his own idiosyncratic development and the predominant research interests of the 1910s and 1920s. It is in fact possible to apply more standard metalogical considerations to his systems, such as investigating them for consistency and completeness. However, the difficulties and complications of working within the confines of a fully nominalistic attitude—sans sets, sans abstract expression types—have put off all but a very few, and the relative ease with which results can be obtained when fewer ontological scruples are in play makes Leśniewski's systems and others like them interesting mainly to certain philosophers, while mathematicians and mathematical logicians have by-passed them.

On the other hand, Leśniewski's concerns for the proprieties of quotation and use/mention, the object-language/metalanguage distinction, canons of correct definition, and his development of Mereology as the dominant formal theory of part and whole have all passed into the mainstream, and the logical expertise he helped to instil into a generation of Poles contributed in large part to making Warsaw the premier interbellum location for mathematical logic. In the entrance to the 1999 University of Warsaw Library building stand four concrete pillars and sculptures by Adam Myjak, celebrating the philosophical achievements of Poland. The figures represented are Leśniewski's teacher Twardowski, his colleague Łukasiewicz, his student Tarski, and Leśniewski himself.


Primary Sources: Works by Leśniewski

Selected Secondary Sources

Secondary literature is mainly scattered across journals, but the most useful compact sources are three collections:


Individual Works

Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
inpho icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
phil papers icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

definitions | logic: classical | Lvov-Warsaw School | mereology | nominalism: in metaphysics | quantifiers and quantification | Tarski, Alfred | types and tokens