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The Economic Analysis of Law

First published Mon Nov 26, 2001; substantive revision Fri Aug 12, 2011

Economic analysis of law applies the tools of microeconomic theory to the analysis of legal rules and institutions. Ronald Coase [1961] and Guido Calabresi [1961] are generally identified as the seminal articles but Commons [1924] and Hale [1952] among others had brought economic thinking to the study of law in the 1910s and 1920s. Moreover, as elaborated below, economic analysis of law derives from several different intellectual traditions in economics.

Richard Posner [1973] brought economic analysis of law to the attention of the general legal academy; by the late 1970s, his work had provoked a vigorous controversy within the legal academy. That controversy has usually defined the debate around the philosophical foundations of economic analysis of law. Posner made two claims: (I) Common law legal rules are, in fact, efficient; and (II) Legal rules ought to be efficient. In both claims, “efficient” means maximization of the social willingness-to-pay. In the course of the controversy, two other claims were articulated in Kornhauser [1984, 1985]: (III) Legal processes select for efficient rules; and (IV) individuals respond to legal rules economically. (In this third claim, “efficient” means “Pareto efficient.”) Kornhauser identified this last, behavioral claim as central to the enterprise.

Claim (I) is ambiguous. On the one hand, it might mean that common law legal rules induce efficient behavior. We shall call this claim (I). On the other hand, it might mean that the law is efficient; that is, that the content of the law is identified by its efficiency. We shall call this claim about the determination of legal content claim (I)′.

Claim (I)′ is difficult to evaluate for at least two reasons. First, its truth is apparently tied to a doctrinal concept of law that identifies which legal rules are in force in a community. Debate about the appropriate concept of law, of course, has lasted for well over two thousand years. We discuss this issue in section 2 below. Second, the relation between the criterion of efficiency determining the content of the law and the efficiency of the actual behavior induced under the legal rule is unclear. On one interpretation, claim (I)′ might imply claim (I). That efficiency determines the content of the law then means that the legal rule in fact induces efficient behavior. The governing legal rule in a particular dispute just is the (or a) rule that induces efficient behavior. This determination of the prevailing rule of law (under Claim (I)′ as the doctrinal concept of law) thus becomes an empirical question on which a judge might err by rendering judgment according to an inefficient rule. Indeed, one would expect judges often to err as they are ill-placed to identify rules that actually induce efficient behavior.[1]

Alternatively, we might acknowledge that claim (I)′ depends on a doctrinal conception of law that typically refers judges and agents generally to specific texts such as statutes, administrative regulations, and opinions. Under (I)′, then, the analyst interprets these opinions and other texts to extract an economic model that underlies the decision's legal view of the world. On this interpretation, (I)′ might be true even though legal rules induced inefficient behavior in the real world because the announced legal rule might be efficient within the implicit model used by judges but inefficient in the world as it actually is.

These five claims do not correspond directly to traditional questions in the philosophy of law. We have already indicated that claim (I)′ raises questions about the concept of law about which the economic analysis of law has been largely silent. The evaluative claim (II) that legal rules ought to be efficient would, if directed to judges, qualify as a theory of adjudication, one of the central concerns of anglo-american philosophy of law. Central philosophic questions concerning the concept of law, of its normativity, and the obligation to obey the law, however, are not directly addressed. The behavioral claim (IV) as well as the evolutionary claim (III) and the positive claim (II), by contrast, concern empirical issues that philosophers of law generally neglect. Nevertheless, the controversy within the legal academy has generally regarded economic analysis of law as providing a comprehensive theory of law that challenges traditional approaches to law. Indeed, an explanation of the vehemence of the controversy should identify differences in fundamental views concerning law.

1. Two Strands of Thought within Economic Analysis of Law

The vast literature of economic analysis of law is not easily characterized. As the set of distinct claims suggests, the literature contains a large number of different projects. For purposes of this essay, we identify two distinct strands of thought within economic analysis of law. We shall call one strand policy analysis and the second strand political economy.[2] These two strands may be differentiated along a number of dimensions.

First, policy analysis generally focuses on analysis of the effects of legal rules and institutions on outcomes. An outcome usually consists of the “objective” effects of the rule or institution on the behavior of “private” individuals. By contrast, political economy generally investigates the operation of political institutions such as courts, legislatures, the executive and administrative agencies; it usually focuses on the behavior of the public officials within those institutions. Ideally, one would trace the effects of different institutional rules and structures through the behavior of public officials to the effects on the behavior of private individuals. In practice, however, tracing effects of changes in institutional rules to final outcomes is too difficult and too uncertain. A change in the structure of legislative institutions, for example, would likely affect the content of the legislative programs enacted in the jurisdiction. To trace effects to final outcomes in terms of the behavior of private individuals would thus require the analyst to predict the set of statutes that would be enacted within various legislative structures.

Second, and related to the first, policy analysis generally assumes that public officials in general and judges in particular, are conscientious. Judges thus enforce the legal rules as they are announced, regardless of the judge's own view of the desirability of the legal rule or its impact on her personally. Political economy, by contrast, assumes that public officials have the same motivation as private individuals; they are self-interested. In the context of adjudication, as will be elaborated below, the political economist interprets self-interested judicial behavior as decisions that promote the policy preferences of the judge.

Third, policy analysis generally adopts a welfarist stance towards evaluation of legal rules while political economy has evolved from a more contractarian tradition. Policy analysts, when evaluating legal rules ask whether that legal rule induces behavior that satisfies some welfarist criterion, usually either Pareto efficiency or (constrained) social welfare maximization.[3] Political economy, however, has to a large extent emerged from an economic tradition, exemplified by James Buchanan,[4] that rejects the maximization of social welfare as a criterion and seeks to evaluate political institutions on grounds of consent or, more generally, within the contractarian tradition. The political economist often asks not whether welfare the rule induces pareto efficiency but whether the parties have acted voluntarily, consented to the rule, or would have (rationally) consented to the rule.

Fourth, we might understand the distinction between policy analysis and political economy as a difference in the view of the instrumentalism of law. “Instrumentalism” here means that an agent designs the law to promote some collective goal. Kornhauser [2000, 2010] discuss this idea at length. For our purposes, we need only note several ambiguities in the brief definition just given. A more careful definition would specify the agent who designs, the meaning of design, what counts as “law,” and what is a collective purpose. Right now, we note only that instrumentalism may occur at the level of the rule, the institution or the legal system as a whole.

Policy analysis tends to proceed legal rule by legal rule. It asks, for example, how does a change in the standard of care affect the behavior of tortfeasors and tort victims? Or how does contracting behavior differ if the measure of damages shifts from expectation damages to reliance damages? The analyst thus imputes a purpose (usually, but not necessarily, of maximization of social welfare) to the promulgator of the legal rule. The analyst then assumes that the policymaker has chosen the legal rule that best promotes her (imputed) objective. Legal rules are then instrumental to the achievement of the posited goal; call this approach rule instrumentalism.

The political economist, by contrast, generally denies that any purpose can be attributed to the promulgator of a legal rule largely because legal rules are not promulgated by a single individual with power to control unilaterally the content of the rule. Certainly, from the perspective of political economy, legislators have no common purpose and one should not assume or expect that any statute maximizes social welfare. Legislation results from the interplay of interest groups that do not reflect all interests within society. Even if the legislature did reflect all interests within society, each interest does not have an equal (or proportionate) say in the formulation of the statute.[5] Finally, even if each interest did play a “proportionate” role in the formulation of the statute, Arrow's General Possibility Theorem teaches that the aggregation of interests might still not yield a coherent purpose. Political economy thus rejects rule instrumentalism.

Further understanding of the approach of political economy requires acknowledgment of divergent views within political economy. We distinguish two such views: constitutional political economy and radical political economy. Each rejects rule instrumentalism but only the latter rejects instrumentalism altogether.

One might attribute the rejection of rule instrumentalism within political economy to a commitment to an explanatory rather than a normative project. At the level of constitutional political economy, however, the research program usually adopts the perspective of a constitutional designer and this designer arguably has a view of law that includes institutional instrumentalism: i.e., legal institutions, rather than specific legal rules, promote the specific goals of the constitutional designer.[6] The constitutional designer seeks a political structure that promotes her goals. The project of constitutional political economy is thus normative in nature. Indeed the normative nature of the project dominates any explanatory aim. Many within the project — see Brennan and Buchanan [1981, 1985] — argue that one ought to adopt an economic theory of behavior of public officials and private individuals even if that theory is not the best explanatory theory.

Radical political economists reject this reasoning. They carry the logic of the argument about the incoherence of legislative behavior through to the level of institutional and constitutional design. Constitutions are drafted by agents with political and economic interests that they seek to forward when they create the basic social, economic and political institutions of the society. Incoherence may thus infect these institutions as well. The compromises over slavery in the US Constitution, for example, illustrate such incoherence. Radical political economists thus reject the claim that the law is designed and hence reject instrumentalism altogether.

These differences in the level at which law is instrumental, if the law is instrumental at all, suggest that the two strands of economic analysis of law will adopt different approaches to the study of adjudication. These theories are sketched and discussed in section 5 below.

More significantly, for purposes of this entry, however, is the basic similarity between these two strands of economic analysis of law. Both of these strands adopt the standard assumption of neo-classical economics that each individual seeks to maximize her preferences. Moreover, they generally assume that each individual acts in her own self-interest, narrowly defined. This approach presents the single, greatest obstacle to the articulation of a general theory of law that confronts economic analysis: it has no room for the normative aspect of law. It is this denial of the normativity of law that accounts for the vehement resistance that economic analysis provoked within the legal academy.

2. The Concept of Law

The introduction identified claim (I)′ as a claim about the content of the law. As such, it should rely, at least implicitly, on a concept of law. Yet the literature in economic analysis of law has been unusually reticent about the concept of law on which it stands. Though commentators often characterize economic analysis of law as providing a comprehensive theory of law, its narrower ambitions become apparent when one realizes that economic analysis of law has not explicitly addressed the question “What is law?”. Indeed, economic analyses of law generally presuppose a concept of law on which the law is uncontroversially known to all actors.

The next subsection argues that claim (I)′ is a contingent claim about the content of the law and not a claim about the nature of law itself. The second subsection investigates the concept of law that is implicit within the practice of economic analysis of law. Though claim (I)′ itself is compatible both with legal positivism and with a Dworkinian account of law, the instrumentalism of policy analysis suggests an intellectual approach more congenial to legal positivism. These analyses presume the law is known and investigate its causal consequences. The political economy project, however, suggests but has not yet systematically pursued, a distinct, social scientific approach to the concept of law. We discuss this more radical approach in the third subsection

2.1 Efficiency and the Concept of Law

Claim (I)′ asserts that the an efficiency criterion identifies the content of the law. The literature contains arguments that virtually every (common law) legal rule is efficient. As noted in the introduction, this claim has both an empirical interpretation that each legal rule induces efficient behavior and a doctrinal interpretation that the prevailing legal rule is identified by its efficiency. The literature, however, has offered scant explanation or justification for the underlying theoretical claim that efficiency identifies the content of these legal norms. On what theory of law does efficiency become a ground of law?

One might justify claim (I)′ in a variety of ways. A legal positivist might argue that the rule of recognition identifies efficiency as an appropriate ground of judge-made law. Or one might argue, as Dworkin has suggested, that efficiency provides the best interpretation of the practice governing the law of accidents. On either account, the claim that efficiency identifies the content of the law is a contingent claim. For the positivist, the content of the rule of recognition is contingent on the social practice of the relevant public officials; they may, but they need not, adopt an efficiency criterion.[7] Similarly, for Dworkin, the law derives from the best interpretation of the past political decisions of the community. These decisions are of course contingent; a different history of decisions might yield a different account of law. Claim (I)′ thus does not constitute a competing concept of law.

2.2 Legal Positivism and Policy Analysis in Economic Analysis of Law

The policy analysis strand of economic analysis of law often implicitly adopts some variant of legal positivism as its understanding of the concept of law. Recall that the policy analysis treats the behavior of judges in particular (and sometimes public officials generally) differently from the behavior of those subject to the legal rules.

An economic analysis of the behavioral effects of a legal rule generally begins with the assumption that the legal rule is clearly known not only to judges and other public officials but also to those subject to the legal rule. This knowledge of private citizens might amount simply to the knowledge of what consequences follow from each possible action the agent might take. Actions that provoke a response from public officials generally, or judges in particular, have no special character to them; the citizen in her deliberations treats the consequences of rule-following or rule-breaking as she treats any other price. On Hart's account of legal positivism, however, a private citizen may adopt this detached attitude towards legal rules. The concept of law inherent in policy analysis is thus consistent with positivism.

The typical model in economic analysis of law, however, assumes that public officials conscientiously apply the legal rule under study. The public official does not identify the rule that would best promote her own preferences and then apply (or not apply) that rule; rather she “conscientiously” applies the rule that “ought” to govern the event. Conscientious application here simply implies that the official may uncontroversially apply an identified legal rule to the events in question.[8] This assumption might reflect a “partial equilibrium” approach to the analysis of the problem at hand. If the effects of the legal rule are the central focus of inquiry, the incentives and behavior of public officials who enforce that rule may be of less interest. The analysis of the institutional structures and processes that insure the “conscientious” application of law by public officials are left for later analysis.

Other aspects of the economic analysis of law are consistent with this positivist approach to the law. Economic analysis of social norms, for example, often provides a characterization of social norms that largely coincides with Hart's own scheme for distinguishing social rules that are legal rules from social rules that are not. Specifically, economic analysts of law point to the decentralized character of the promulgation and enforcement of legal rules as the properties that distinguish social norms from legal rules.

2.3 Towards a Social Scientific Concept of Law?

Two positions dominate philosophical debates over the concept of law. One set of positions, advanced by legal positivists such as Raz [1994] and Coleman [2001] argues that the articulation of a concept of law is an exercise in self-understanding. They pursue their position through conceptual analysis. Call this approach the self-understanding approach. The second position, advanced in a number of variants that differ significantly in substance, for example, by Dworkin [2004], Murphy [2001], and Perry [2001], contends that we should adopt the concept of law that best advances our political aims. Call this the political approach.

Though the two positions disagree on the methodology for determining the concept of law, they apparently agree that a concept of law should provide a unitary answer to three distinct questions. Two of these questions are internal to any legal practice but the third is not, or, at least, not necessarily internal. The first internal question — the professional or doctrinal question — asks: which public, collectively chosen norms ought public officials and citizens use to guide their actions? The second internal question — the adjudicatory question — asks: how ought (or, occasionally, do) judges decide cases? The third question — the differentiation question — asks: what is the nature of law? What distinctive characteristics of law distinguish it essentially from other social phenomena such as coercion, morality, and politics?

Legal positivists generally have sought to answer the third question. Their answer, however, often connects the first professional question with the third differentiation question. H.L.A. Hart [1961] articulated his project as the differentiation question. The book, though, largely addresses the professional question, arguing that the governing legal rules in the community are identified not by reference to the commands of a sovereign but by reference to rule of recognition used by the legal officials to identify the set of norms that governs their (public) actions. This answer to the professional question provides at least a partial answer to the second, adjudicatory question. After all, legal adjudication must rely at least in part on legal norms and the rule of recognition clearly demarcates legal norms from other norms and grounds of decision. Notice, however, that the the answer to the professional question links it to the differentiation question. What counts as law depends upon the internal perspectives of (some)individuals.

More recently, however, positivists have argued more directly that the answer to the differentiation question rests on law's claim to authority. Raz [1979, 1986], for example, advances this argument. The claim to authority has, as Soper [2002] clearly expresses, two aspects. First, the law claims that it has the right to punish those who violate its prescriptions. Second, the law claims that individuals have a correlative duty to obey the law's prescriptions. Raz argues, somewhat paradoxically, that, though law claims this authority, it generally does not have it.

Characterizing law by its claim to authority does not immediately implicate the content of the law. One need not necessarily answer the professional question in order to answer to the differentiation question.

The Razian answer to the differentiation question may arguably rely on the internal attitudes of individuals and hence provide an internal account. Raz identifies two conditions that the law must meet to make a claim of authority. The second of these, as characterized by Marmor (2011), requires legal authority to be “personal” by which one means that the norm by authored. This reference to authorship apparently implicates the intentional attitudes of individuals within the legal system.

Dworkin, by contrast to the positivists, begins with the second, adjudicatory question. He provides an account of how judges decide cases. He then generalizes this account to an account of law through the recognition that all citizens, not only judges, must apply law. Each must answer the same questions that confront a judge in resolving a case. His theory of adjudication thus also answers the first, professional question; it identifies the legal rules that are in force within the community. Finally, this account distinguishes law from other phenomena because law so identified promotes a distinct political virtue, legality or, as Dworkin terms it, integrity. Dworkin thus offers a fully unitary answer to the three questions. His answer, moreover, adopts an internal perspective on all questions.

Political economy, by contrast, pursues a substantially different project. It seeks to understand the ways in which society structures its political, economic and legal institutions. This project suggests neither a self-conscious nor a political concept of law but a social-scientific one that would help us understand the social world in general, the emergence and persistence of social groups over time and the causes and consequences of different governmental structures. Political economy, or a general sociology, then seeks to answer a question similar to the third, external question of differentiation posed by the philosophical discussion of the concept of law. How do we differentiate structures of social governance from other phenomena within a society such as gangs and games? Similarly, to discover cross cultural and intertemporal regularities, the analyst must identify comparable structures within different societies. That is, our criteria for differentiation must work cross culturally and intertemporally.

An understanding of society and social phenomena, of course, may not require anything akin to the concept of law at issue in the philosophical debates. Two different reasons, however, suggest some relation between the philosophical debate and the social-scientific inquiry. One should recall that Hart [1961] characterized, perhaps off-handedly, his project as one in the descriptive sociology of law. Such a sociological project presumably requires a social scientific concept of law. Moreover, once one had articulated a viable and useful set of social scientific concepts one might ask what relation they bear to the issues at the center of the philosophical inquiries of the value of legality and of articulating the criterion that distinguishes legal from other grounds of decision.

Adopting Hart's discussion as a starting point, we shall in the rest of this subsection, sketch a social-scientific concept of a governance structure and suggest how it might relate both to the project of political economy and to the philosophical debate over the concept of law. (Kornhauser [2004] provides a more extended account.)

One of Hart's rhetorical devices provides a useful starting point for the development of a social scientific concept. To introduce the concept of a secondary rule, Hart [1961 recounts a fable concerning the emergence of a legal system in a small community. He suggests that a small, homogeneous, stable and closely knit society requires no differentiated structures of governance. These structures emerge to resolve problems that arise in societies that are large, heterogeneous, or subject to environmental uncertainty. Though Hart identifies only three such problems, we shall identify four distinct functions that might be distributed across societal structures: (1) the characterization of socially acceptable (or unacceptable) behavior, a task the importance of which grows as the rate of change in society increases. (2) Policing of behavior to identify likely instances of deviant behavior; more anonymous societies may require more institutionalized policing; (3) Definitive adjudication of non-conformity to social norms; again, when society is no longer face-to-face, such adjudication may be necessary to trigger sanctions. And (4) Sanctioning of deviant behavior.

Governance within a society requires that the society somehow accomplish each of these four tasks. A society might do so in a number of different ways. A governance structures is the set of institutional structures within a society that address one or more of the four problems of adaptation, detection, application, and sanction that are the central elements of governance. An institutional structure is a decision-making protocol that specifies procedures relevant to the resolution of one or more of the problems of adaptation, detection, application, and sanction. Clear understanding requires a distinction here between institutional structures, realized institutions, and functioning institutions. This distinction parallels the distinction between game forms, games, and plays of a game in the theory of games. As noted before, an institutional structure is simply the basic rules or protocol for governance; a realized institution is an institutional structure situated in a given society and populated by particular individuals; a functioning institution is a realized institution as it operates in a society in actual conditions.

A crude taxonomy of governance structures might distinguish them along two dimensions: the degree of institutional differentiation in the structure and the mechanism of internal, “bureaucratic” control.

A governance structure may be more or less differentiated from other institutions (such as those governing exchange or reproduction) in a society. Hart considered two extremes: a simple society with no differentiation of governance from other institutions and modern, municipal legal systems that have distinct institutions for adaptation, policing, adjudication, and sanctioning. Indeed, a society such as the United States has multiple legislative, executive and judicial institutions that relate in complex ways.

We may follow Hart in elaborating the second dimension of the mechanism of internal bureaucratic control. Hart contrasted two motivations for compliance with law or legal obligations: incentives that rely on the self-interest of individuals and acceptance of rules as guides to action. For Hart, law required that a core set of public officials had to accept the rule of recognition as an authoritative guide to action.

Political economy, by contrast, aims to explain all legal phenomena in terms of the self-interest of agents. This analytic strategy precludes a Hartian account of law; legal rules cannot play any role in the explanation of behavior of either private individuals or public officials because no agent has the relevant internal attitude towards the rule. An individual faced with a choice considers the costs and benefits that each option presents to her. These costs and benefits will include “legal costs and benefits” but these costs and benefits are not determined by rules; they are the result of the incentives that private and public officials face. Rules are only rules of thumb that express the response of average individuals under normal circumstances to particular events. Which rules of thumb are used, of course, may greatly affect the social equilibrium achieved in a particular jurisdiction.

Political economy thus seeks a concept of governance that relies only on incentives; it consequently denies the existence of legal systems in Hart's sense. It might nonetheless acknowledge a different concept of law. Some political economists, for example, suggest that legality in the sense of an impartial “rule of law” promotes economic growth. The political economist then might identify law or legal systems with governance structures that realize such a rule of law (in given circumstances). The political economist, then, might adopt two related concepts. The first concept of a governance structure is an explanatory one; it characterizes the mechanisms of social governance in terms of the degree of institutional differentiation and the mechanism of bureaucratic control within these institutions. The second related concept is normative. It identifies a value that a governance structure might realize. Call this value legality. The concept of law is thus a normative one; it identifies the value of legality. The social scientist then seeks to identify conditions under which specific governance structures will realize the value of legality.

3. The Obligation to Obey the Law

Both policy analysis and political economy attribute purely economic motivations to private citizens. Typically, the analyst assumes more than rational maximization of abstractly given preferences. The analyst assumes further that the agent's preferences are narrowly self-interested. On that account, the sanctions imposed for non-compliance with the rule provide agents with the sole, prudential reasons to conform to the legal rule.[9] Independent of those sanctions, however, the agent had no non-prudential reason to obey the law.

The political economist adopts an additional, strong assumption that public officials too have only narrowly self-interested reasons for conformity to their public obligations. The public official acts, even in her official capacity, in her own self-interest.[10] The theory thus apparently leaves no room for any non-self-interested reason to obey the law.

This aspect of economic analysis of law appears problematic. Within traditional legal scholarship. the normativity of law is at least controversial. Even those theorists who reject law's normativity, generally acknowledge that they must explain why law appears to be normative. “Normativity” here means minimally that law or legal rules give individuals reasons for action that are distinct from the sanction imposed for non-compliance.

The behavioral theory underlying economic analysis of law thus seems inherently hostile to the claim that law is normative. Nonetheless, we may identify at least three routes through which economic analysis of law might acknowledge a normative dimension to law. First, law might serve to coordinate action on a particular equilibrium. Second, the economic theory of decision making, broadly understood, might accommodate the idea of obligation. This accommodation might be made in one of two ways. The first route to accommodation acknowledges that individual rationality is bounded. This limitation may justify the use of rules to guide behavior. The second route to integration of obligation into the economic model retains the assumption of full rationality. It treats obligation as one concern or set of concerns that the agent integrates into an all-things-considered preference over her set of options.

3.1 Equilibrium Selection

Legal positivism grounds law in social practice. Its difficulty in explaining the normativity of law emerges directly from this attention to the social nature of law; social facts themselves, it would seem, cannot give rise to any obligation. Various authors (e.g., Postema [1982]) have tried to resolve this conundrum through an analysis of convention as a coordination game.

In a coordination game, the interests of all players are coincident; each player ranks the possible outcomes of the game identically. The difficulty for the players arises because they do not know which of the multiple equilibria of the game to play. Consider, for example, an island in a pristine legal state-there are no legal rules. The individuals must decide on which side of the road to drive. Formulated as a game, each individual has two strategies: drive on the right (R) and drive on the left (L). Each has an identical evaluation of the outcomes of the strategy choices of everyone. Each ranks the outcomes in which everyone chooses the same side of the road — all R or all L — highest and each ranks the outcome in which half choose R and half choose L worst.[11] This game has two equilibria: all choose R and all choose L. Unfortunately, knowledge that two equilibria exist does not help agents determine which strategy to adopt, or, alternatively which equilibrium to play.

Announcement of a legal rule in this context can coordinate the players' actions. It gives each a reason to choose as the rule dictates if it affects the individual's beliefs concerning which strategy the other agents will adopt. On this account, the social fact that individuals accept the law provides each individual with a reason to act. This reason is independent of any sanction that the law might impose for non-compliance. Moreover, this reason is prudential in that it best promotes the agent's own welfare and moral, in the sense that it best promotes the well-being of all. This coincidence results from the coincidence of interests of all agents.

Law understood as a coordination device at best provides a partial account of the grounds of normativity. Obviously, many if not most laws concern conduct in which the interests of agents do not coincide. Coordination cannot provide agents with a reason to act in this case. Moreover, it is not clear that the acceptance of a rule of recognition by public officials constitutes a coordination game. Consider a specific judge J. That judge may think rule R is the best rule of recognition. Consistent with that belief she considers a world in which all judges accept R as best. Nothing guarantees that a second judge J′ consider R best. He may think R′ better. J′ will also believe that a world in which all judges accept R′ is best. But it is not obvious that J must consider a world in which all accept R′ as preferable to one in which a majority accept R.

Finally, note that the argument is incomplete. It requires that individuals have sufficient common knowledge of the law and that others know the law for it to have any plausibility. Even under these circumstances, however, the argument still requires that each infer from this common knowledge that each individual will comply.

3.2 Bounded Rationality and the Conservation of Decision Resources.

A second route to the accommodation of normativity within the economic model acknowledges that individuals are boundedly rational. The assumption of bounded rationality admits the possibility that agents should follow rules. A legal rule would then be justified, in a manner consistent with Raz's [1979, 1986] account of authority, when adherence to the rule improved the decision making of the agent.

In the simplest model in which such an account exists, agents face a cost to deliberation. The more complex the deliberative calculation, the more costs the agent incurs. When the marginal cost of deliberation is sufficiently high, the agent might do better to follow a rule of thumb that quickly, and cheaply, identifies a good but not optimal, action.[12] If the expected benefit from choosing the optimal action (relative to the good action) is less than the cost, it is prudent for the agent to adopt the rule of thumb. More sophisticated accounts of an economic rationale for rule-following rely on more complex models of bounded rationality.

To complete an economic account of the authority of law requires that one explain why the agent should consider legal rules as the relevant rules to which she should defer. One might argue that those who promulgate legal rules have special expertise that makes it likely that they will enact rules that are better than the rules that the agent herself would formulate. For some legal rules-technical rules concerning health and safety promulgated by administrative agencies-this argument may have merit. After all the decision at issue depends on a mass of technical data that is not easily assimilable or manipulable. For many other legal rules promulgated by legislatures and courts, however, this argument may not apply.

Several other features of this argument merit attention. First, it parallels the argument for authority offered by Joseph Raz.[13] Moreover, as in Raz's argument, authority is specific to legal rules rather than to law in general. An agent might believe the law more expert than she with respect to some decisions than to others. In fact agents with different expertise themselves would find different legal rules authoritative.

Second, on this account of authority, the legal rule affects the agent's deliberation not because of the sanction for non-compliance-as in the view of legal rules as incentives—but because compliance with the legal rule even in the absence of a sanction is in the agent's interest. This feature of the account of authority conforms to notions, developed further below, of the way in which rules enter the deliberative process. But this feature also limits the applicability of the account to those legal rules that bear on the agent's immediate interest. Many legal rules direct the agent to adopt actions that raise her own costs; in the absence of a sanction for non-compliance her own interest would dictate non-compliance. So, for example, a rule requiring that an agent adopt due care in certain activities may raise the agent's costs.[14]

The prudential account of authority outlined above primarily addresses private individuals. One might ask the parallel question concerning the obligation to obey the law of public officials. In some respects, this question has greater significance than the question concerning private individuals because many acknowledge that the motivation of private individuals to obey the law is usually prudential, the desire to avoid sanction. Moreover, on some jurisprudential accounts, most notably H.L.A. Hart's version of legal positivism, the attitudes and behavior of public officials determine the existence and nature of law.

The economic account of authority, however, does not provide a compelling explanation of official behavior. Consider how the economic account applies to public officials. The relevant obligations here are the official obligations of the individual: the judicial obligation to decide cases according to the dictates of stare decisis and other obligatory practices; the executive official's obligation to apply the law. Two difficulties arise immediately. How is compliance with these official obligations in the individual's interest? Why must the agent follow a rule rather than optimize in each instance? This second difficulty is less troublesome than the first; Ronald Heiner [1986], for example, has offered a prudential account, grounded in bounded rationality, of the judicial obligation to adhere to stare decisis.[15]

One might attempt to resolve the first difficulty concerning the agent's interest by arguing that compliance with official obligation is in the individual's interest because she desires to maintain her employment. But this explanation rests on an incentive argument. The sanction of dismissal induces compliance rather than a normative motivation to comply with one's obligation; it is another prudential account. The prudential account of authority thus fails to overcome this first difficulty. It is not clear then that the prudential account of authority can ground a positivist conception of law.

3.3 Obligation within Preference.

Economic theorists offer a highly abstract account of individual decision making. Its abstract nature renders the theory remarkably flexible. As it is an account of instrumental rationality, it can accommodate many different substantive accounts that differ in their apecification of what ends are rational or more simply whatever ends the agent happens to have.

Briefly, the economic explanation of decisions states simply that the agent chooses the feasible option that she ranks most highly according to her “preferences.” “Preference” is a technical term, not a psychological concept. By definition, a preference is a linear order over some domain of objects. A linear order is complete, asymmetric, and transitive. Less formally, we may understand preference as a relation “at least as preferred as” over the relevant domain. Completeness requires that, for any two objects a, b, either a at least as preferred as b or b at least as preferred as a. Asymmetry states that if a at least as preferred as b and b at least as preferred as a then a indifferent to b. Finally transitivity requires that if a at least as preferred as b and b at least as preferred as c then a at least as preferred as c.

An agent typically has a number of competing ends. One can interpret the agent's preferences as her all things considered ranking of all possible outcomes. One might then consider the obligations under which the agent finds herself as among the agent's competing “ends”. The question of compatibility between economic rationality as preference and obligation then reduces to the question of whether obligations may be integrated with the other concerns of the agent into an all-things-considered ranking that satisfies the preference axioms.

Integrability presents a serious challenge to the economic account of rationality. Nevertheless, the theory has substantial resources to meet this challenge. To illustrate, consider Neumann's [2007] analysis of the famous example used by Anand [1993] and Sen [1993]. In this example, they consider an agent whom we shall call Freddie. Freddie is Liza's guest for dinner and he has been offered a plate with three slices of cake on it. One slice is small, one medium, and one large. Freddie has two concerns: he wants the largest piece of cake available and he wants to conform to the social norm “never take the largest piece.”. In Sen's and Anand's account, Freddie cannot integrate these two concerns into a preference because his choices violate a condition of contraction consistency which is necessary for transitivity. That is, from the pair (small slice, medium slice), Freddie chooses the small slice but from the triple (small slice, medium slice, large slice), Freddie chooses the medium slice. These choices, however, are inconsistent only under the description give.

Sen and Anand use the absolute size of the pieces of cake to describe Freddie's options. As Neumann points out, this description ignores a decision relevant aspect of Freddie's choice situation; Freddie cares about the relative size of the pieces of cake. Freddie's choices under a description using relative sizes conform to the axioms defining a preference.

Will appropriate redescription resolve all conflicts between “preference” and “obligation”? A related approach to this problem suggests that the answer to this question depends on the structure of the norm. Baigent [2007} and Xu [2007] consider the rationalizability of choice when the agent faces normative constraints. In these situations, the agent, facing a set of feasible options, first eliminates those acts that are normatively prohibited. He then chooses the best available option from this restricted set of feasible options. Whether we can attribute an all-things-considered preference to the agent depends on the structure of the obligation and the detail of the agent's preferences.

4. Theories of Adjudication

Adjudication plays a central role in legal institutions and in legal philosophy. This centrality extends beyond the articulation of theories of adjudication. Debates about the concept of law, for instance, generally highlight the role of the judge. For Hart, judges are an important subset of those public officials whose social acceptance of a rule of recognition constitutes the communities legal system. For Dworkin, the theory of adjudication itself determines the content of the law.

Each strand of economic analysis of law has, at least implicitly, articulated a theory of adjudication. Each theory occurs at the level at which the strand finds the law instrumental. Policy analysis offers a normative theory of adjudication that addresses the judge; it specifies that she should decide cases to maximize social welfare. Constitutional political economy, by contrast, offers a normative theory of court structure. It specifies the design of adjudicatory structures within which judges will, of necessity, act in a self-interested fashion. We briefly discuss each theory in the following subsections.

4.1 Adjudication in Political Economy

As noted earlier the political economy strand of economic analysis of law itself contains two strands that are in tension with each other. On the one hand, the political economy strand seeks only to explain legal phenomena rather than to prescribe either the structure of legal institutions or the content of particular legal rules. One might find within this strand of political economy a positive theory of adjudication but not a normative theory. Indeed, the positive theory advanced argues that judges seek to promote their interests. Usually, these interests are defined as policy interests, that is, an interest to promote particular policies.

The second strand of political economy, constitutional political economy, does have normative aims. It assumes that political actors will act in a self-interested fashion within existing political institutions but that agents will act more impartially in the design of the political institutions within which they will work.[16] A normative theory of adjudication does emerge from this strand of political economy but it differs significantly from the normative theory endorsed by the policy analysis strand of economic analysis of law. For constitutional political economy, a normative theory of adjudication must be a structural one; it should describe the structure of adjudication. The theory thus cannot dictate directly judicial motivation because, according to political economy, judges will always act self-interestedly. Adjudicative institutions, however, can be designed to align better the interests of judges with the interests of the designer of the constitution.

In 1975, Landes and Posner offered a justification for the independence of the judiciary that is often understood as a normative theory of adjudication within the tradition of constitutional political economy. On the account of Landes and Posner, an independent judiciary serves the interest of legislators who seek to impose their policies on the jurisdiction for periods that exceed the length of their majority in the legislature. As a consequence, they find it in their interest to have the judiciary enforce the original bargain struck in all legislation.

This argument contains a normative theory of statutory interpretation. Judges ought to enforce the bargains reached by the legislature that enacted the statute. On this account, a judge ignores the views of the current legislative majority. She also eschews interpretation of the statute in terms of her own policy preferences.

One should note that, from the perspective of constitutional political economy, the argument of Landes and Posner is incomplete. They ground their theory of judicial independence in the interests of legislators. The interests of legislators within extant legislative institutions may not coincide with the interests of the constitutional designer.

4.2 Adjudication in Policy Analysis

A normative theory of adjudication was among the earliest claims advanced in the economic analysis of law. Posner [1973, 1979, 1980, 1985, 1990, 1995] asserted claim II in the introduction: the common law ought to be efficient. He interpreted efficiency as “wealth maximization” but then interpreted wealth maximization as “willingness to pay.” This interpretive stance yielded an argument that judges in (common law) cases ought to choose the legal rule that maximized the ratio of benefits to costs as measured by the sum of individual willingnesses to pay.

Posner's claim evoked great controversy in the late 1970s and early 1980s. (See, e.g., Symposium [1980]). Twenty years later, Kaplow and Shavell [2001] revived and revised Posner's claim. The revision had two components. First, and most important, they chose welfarism generally rather than cost-benefit analysis in particular as the normative basis for adjudication. Welfarism requires that evaluation depend solely on the well-being of individuals. Cost-benefit analysis is thus a form of welfarist evaluation; but Kaplow and Shavell's argument allows them to avoid various criticisms of cost-benefit analysis. Second, Kaplow and Shavell do not argue primarily for a normative theory of adjudication. Rather they contend that evaluation of legal rules and institutions by scholars ought to be welfarist. They suggest however that judges by and large have the same evaluative obligation as the third party analyst.

4.21 A brief critique of cost-benefit analysis as a theory of adjudication

Cost-benefit analysis attempts to implement a Kaldor-Hicks evaluative criterion. According to the Kaldor-Hicks criterion, a distribution of goods (broadly understood) X is superior to a distribution of goods Y if and only if there exists a third distribution of goods Z such that (a) Z is a redistribution of the distribution X; and (b) Z is Pareto preferred to Y.[17]

Cost-benefit analysis proceeds in two steps. First, for each individual, it identifies a particular representation of the individual's ordinal ranking of the options open to the policy maker. Second, it aggregates these representations of each individual's preferences into a social ranking.

The first step is unproblematic. Consider agent K. K has preferences over states of the world. A representation of these preferences assigns a number to each state of the world such that K prefers state X to state Y if and only if the number assigned to state X is higher than the number assigned to state Y. Cost-benefit analysis assigns as numbers the agent's willingness to pay. This procedure thus links the range of numbers that the agent may assign to the agent's wealth as willingness to pay is defined in part in terms of the agent's ability to pay.[18] The procedure for assigning numbers on the basis of an individual's willingness to pay in fact yields a representation of that agent's preferences. Willingness to pay is a utility function that accurately represents the agent's (ordinal) preferences over states.

The second step of cost-benefit analysis is more problematic. To aggregates the individual willingnesses to pay, cost-benefit analysis simply sums the individual willingnesses to pay. One can see immediately several difficulties with this procedure. First, each ranking is ordinal; the numbers have no significance beyond the order. If K assigns a number 2 to state X, a number 4 to state Y and a number 16 to state Z, we cannot conclude anything about K's intensity of preference; she does not prefer Z to Y six times as much as she prefers Y to X. It therefore seems odd that one can add agent K's willingness to pay to agent J's willingness to pay.

Second, cost-benefit analysis adopts a method of interpersonal comparisons of well-being that is particularly unconvincing. Interpersonal comparison of well-being requires that one identify the appropriate representation of each individual's preference ordering and compare those representations. Cost-benefit analysis however does not identify representations on moral or political grounds; rather it chooses the representations that contingently arise from the actual distribution of wealth and income in the society.[19] If Tom is poor while Bill is wealthy, it is unclear why the representations of the well-being of each that derives from willingness to pay provide interpersonally comparable measures. Equally, if Tom and Bill are equally wealthy but Tom is disabled and Bill is not, the willingness to pay of each may still not be interpersonally comparable.

4.22 A Structural Critique of Welfarist theories of adjudication

One might construct a normative theory of adjudication at either of two levels. First, one might take as given the general structure of adjudication within a particular judicial system and ask what obligations the judges within that system ought to have. Second, one might more fundamentally design the judicial system from scratch. On this second account, the institutional environment in which judges act as well as the obligations of judges within that institutional environment would be subject to evaluation.

Most normative theories of adjudication are of the first type. They take the institutional structure in which adjudication occurs largely as given and then identify the obligations of judges within that system. Phrased differently, normative theories of adjudication are interpretive of an ongoing practice rather than efforts to design a practice from scratch. Welfarist theories of adjudication face several difficulties when understood as interpretive theories of existing (common law) practice.[20]

First, the structure of adjudication does not generally provide adequate or appropriate information for the selection of rules that maximize social welfare. Adjudication in a common law system usually focuses on a past transaction between particular parties. This transaction may not be typical of transactions that were litigated; it certainly will not be typical of the entire population of transactions that a rule would govern. Under a given rule, for instance, the set of transactions that do not lead to litigation are likely to differ systematically from the set of transactions that do give rise to litigation. Equally important, different legal rules are apt to generate different sets of transactions. The current structure of adjudication does not provide any information that would help a decision maker assess these differences across potential legal rules.

Second, the selection procedure for judges does not identify individuals with the appropriate training and background to make accurate calculations of social welfare. Judges in common law countries have generally not been trained systematically in economics and statistics, two disciplines necessary (but not sufficient) for the determination of social welfare under alternative legal rules.

Third, and related, judges usually face severe constraints in the set of legal rules they may consider in any adjudication. When confronted by a tort case, for example, the court usually considers a limited number of legal regimes; perhaps it will reformulate the standard of care or shift from a regime of negligence to one of strict liability. A court, however, is unlikely to adopt a complex scheme of no-fault insurance or to impose a different insurance scheme even though these more radical transformations of social institutions would provide higher overall welfare.

5. Evaluation of Legal Rules and Institutions

The evaluative tradition in economics is resolutely welfarist. That tradition extends to the policy analysis branch of economic analysis of law. In the prior section, we considered the manifestation of this tradition in the advocacy of cost-benefit analysis as a normative theory of adjudication. In this section, we consider arguments for welfarism as the sole evaluative standard against which to appraise legal rules and institutions.

The arguments in section 4.21 were directed against cost-benefit analysis, a specific and concrete form of welfarism developed to implement the more abstract evaluative ideas underlying welfarism. Objections to the specific instantiation of welfarism do not necessarily run against the more general class of evaluative criteria. Similarly, the argument in section 4.22 focused on the institutional structure of adjudication; we argued that this structure was hostile to an implementation of a welfarist theory of adjudication.

The arguments in this section address the claim that we evaluate legal rules and institutions only against welfarist criteria. This argument has several elements.[21] The first element identifies an individual's well-being with her preferences. Thus, an individual K has greater well-being in state X than in state Y, if and only if she prefers state X to state Y. The second, key element of the argument welfarism interprets the agent's preferences as her all-things-considered ranking of alternatives. This step thus incorporates within the agent's preference ordering anything that the agent considers relevant to her decisions. Consequently, the claim about an agent's well being now becomes: K prefers state X to state Y if and only if K believes, all things considered, that state X is better than (or ought to be promoted rather than) state B.

K's all-things-considered judgments, of course, will included many considerations that, in ordinary language, are not usually considered as in K's self-interest or even as contributing to her well-being. So, for example, her all-things-considered judgments will incorporate concerns for the well-being of others as well as considerations of justice and deontological constraints on action. Subsection 1 argues that an individual's concerns for justice and her endorsement of deontological constraints cannot be integrated into an adequate concept of well-being.

The argument for the exclusivity of welfarism as an evaluative criterion rests on a third leg. The argument contends that use of any non-welfarist criterion is incompatible with the Pareto criterion. Section 5.2 accepts this claim for purposes of argument. We then point out that the Pareto criterion conflicts with principles of rationality, valuation, liberty and responsibility that have an equally strong appeal.[22] It is thus not clear that we should accept the Pareto criterion and reject these others principles.

5.1 Preference and Well-being

Call an ordering that incorporates every consideration that the agent views as relevant to her decision “an extended preference ordering”. Kaplow and Shavell include the agent's moral concerns in this extended preference ordering. We shall call this approach the “strategy of incorporation.”

A complete argument that the extended preference ordering does not correspond to a morally compelling conception of well-being would require articulation of the concept of well-being, a task well beyond the scope of this entry. Here we outline two formal arguments against the strategy of incorporation that treats the agent's moral concerns, her views about equality, fairness and distributive and corrective justice more generally, as elements of well-being.

We broached the first formal argument in section 3. There we noted that not every norm could be integrated with self-interested concerns into an all-things-considered set of judgments that satisfied the formal conditions of a preference. To succeed, the strategy of incorporation must show that each of the agent's moral “tastes” or concerns have a normative structure that is compatible with her underlying, self-interested preferences. The strategy of incorporation thus might fail because of the structure of the obligations that the agent endorses.

Second, a welfarist theory distinguishes between the well-being of each agent and the criteria that determine the structure of the social welfare function.[23] The theory, that is, distinguishes what makes an individual's life go better and the concerns that determine how one integrates the well-being of individuals into “social welfare.” These latter concerns weigh the well-being of individual J against the well-being of individual K. Consider two states of the world s and t. Agent J's well-being is higher in state s than in state t while agent K's well-being is higher in state t than in state s. To rank the two states, society must determine the relative importance of the well-being of the two individuals.

Moral norms perform precisely this function. A moral norm determines when the well-being of agent J should take precedence over the well-being of agent K. Indeed, we say that agent J has a right against agent K precisely when we think that the decisions or choices of agent J should prevail over the decisions or choices of agent K. The moral concerns of each agent thus reflect the agent's views about the structure of the social choice function not (necessarily) her views about what constitutes her own well-being.

Of course, an agent might believe that her life goes better if she lives in a more egalitarian society. But she might also believe to the contrary that her life would go better if she lived in a more hierarchical society. Then, the social structure would affect the agent's well-being. The choice of social structure, however, is not dependent on the agent's well-being. The structure of the social choice function rather determines the social structure. Thus, an agent may believe that an egalitarian social welfare function is appropriate (or perhaps even “better than” a hierarchical social welfare function) but she may nonetheless believe that her own well-being would be higher in a hierarchical society than in an egalitarian one.

The social welfare function resolves conflicts of “interest” between individuals. Moral disagreements, however, reflect not conflicts of interest but a dispute over how such conflicts should be resolved. The resolution of a moral conflict determines whose well-being counts not how much well-being the agent has. The strategy of incorporation confuses these two concepts.[24]

Many of the concerns that, under the strategy of incorporation, are included in an individual's extended preference ordering thus bear on the structure of the social choice function; they do not necessarily make the agent's life go better. Concerns for distributive justice, for example, reflect moral judgments about how to integrate different distributions of well-being. They do not reflect judgments about how well-off each agent is.[25] Similarly, respect for deontological constraints on action reflect the judgment that the effects on the well-being of the constrained agent do not bear on our assessment of the social state.

The social welfare function aggregates or integrates the well-being of each individual in society into a social ranking of states. It does not integrate or aggregate the differing views of the individuals concerning the appropriate social welfare function. Conflicts over the appropriate social welfare function must be resolved through some separate process. Society for example might vote on which social welfare function to adopt. Such a vote might be justified on epistemic grounds; it cannot be justified on social welfare grounds. We do not choose our social welfare function in order to maximize social welfare.[26]

5.2 The Pareto Criterion

Let us first define the Pareto Criterion. Consider a society of n individuals, each of whom has a well-defined preference over all possible states of the world. The Pareto criterion states that a state of the world x is socially better than a state of the world y if and only if each individual considers state x at least as preferred as state y and at least one person strictly prefers x to y. It follows from this definition, of course, that, if each individual prefers x to y then x is socially better than y.

The Pareto criterion has the strong intuitive appeal. If everyone agrees that a state x is preferred to a state y, certainly the collective assessment must rank x more highly than y. The Pareto criterion moreover appears to be weak, i.e. to impose few constraints on social choice. After all, each member of the society will only rarely rank two alternatives as every other member of the society. Nevertheless, the Pareto criterion has strong implications for the aggregation of individual judgments. Indeed, as summarized below, the Pareto criterion is inconsistent with a large number of other principles, each of which also has strong intuitive appeal.

Perhaps the inconsistency that would most disconcert an economist arises between the Pareto criterion and the demand for aggregate rationality under uncertainty. Consider again our society of n individuals. Assume now though that society must choose among a number of policies, the consequences of which will depend on the underlying but unknown state of the world. Each individual has preferences over these policies that satisfy the axioms of subjective expected utility theory. Consequently, one may represent each individual's preference over actions by a set of preferences over consequences and a set of beliefs (that satisfy the probability axioms) over states of the world; moreover, the individual prefers policy p to policy q if and only if the expected utility from policy p exceeds the expected utility from policy q.

Aggregate rationality demands the construction of a collective preference over policies that also satisfies the axioms of subjective expected utility theory. Suppose, in addition, that we demand that the collective preference satisfy the Pareto criterion. That is, if each individual in society prefers policy p to policy q then society collectively must prefer p to q. Unfortunately, Seidenfeld, Kadane, and Schervish [1989] have proven that, if at least two individuals both rank two consequences differently and assess the likelihood of some state of the world differently, then society cannot simultaneously satisfy the Pareto criterion and the demands of aggregate rationality.

The Pareto criterion also conflicts with substantive moral claims. Larry Temkin [1993], for example, has argued that the Pareto criterion is inconsistent with the existence of communal goods. A communal good is one that provides social value but does not improve the well-being of any individual. A communal good, that is, is good for us even though it is good for no individual. He offers equality as an example. A society with equality of well-being, for instance, might be better than a society in which individuals have highly unequal levels of well-being even if each person in the unequal society has higher well-being than she has in the more equal society.

Communal goods often seem scarce or improbable; how could something that is good for us be good for none of us in particular? Many people, for example, reject either the claim that equality is a communal good or that it is valuable at all. Our prior discussion in section 5.1, however, suggests a host of potential other communal “goods”. There is a sense in which each of the determinants of the structure of the social welfare function is good for us without necessarily being good for anyone. At least for a welfarist, the structure of the social welfare function is constitutive of the good. Everyone might be “better off” under a regime of slavery but that regime would nevertheless remain worse than a free society.

The Pareto criterion is also inconsistent with three different aspects of the value of autonomy: liberty, responsibility, and self-governance. A formal argument underlies each of these claims. Amartya Sen [1971] first articulated the conflict between the Pareto criterion and liberty. He began from the standard social choice framework developed by Arrow [1963] in which each agent has preferences over final states of the world. He imposed two of the Arrovian conditions, universal domain and the Pareto criterion, but substituted the condition of minimal liberty for the other two (non-dictatorship and independence of irrelevant alternatives). Minimal liberty is indeed minimal; Sen required only that each member in society was decisive over two alternatives. He then proved that one could not construct a social preference that satisfied all three axioms; the Pareto criterion and minimal liberty conflict.

The Arrovian framework, however, does not present the ideal environment in which to study minimal liberty. An agent may have the right (or in Hohfeldian terms a privilege) to determine a social decision. Typically, though, he need not exercise his right. Or the agent may be willing to trade or waive his right in exchange for some benefit. Gibbard [1974] argued that the power to waive one's rights undermined Sen's claim. Subsequent authors then reformulated Sen's argument within a more suitable, game theoretic framework. See, e.g., Deb, Pattanaik and Razzolini [1997]. The conflict thus persists in a more plausible and appealing formal framework.

In Hohfeld's taxonomy of legal rights, a legal duty is the jural correlate of a legal right. We might similarly consider responsibility the ethical correlate of liberty within the conceptual framework of autonomy. Recent formal work has shown that this aspect of autonomy also conflicts with the Pareto criterion.

Sen defined autonomy as liberty understood as freedom to choose. Autonomy as responsibility for one's choices and actions represents the obverse side of this freedom to choose. Political philosophers have examined this issue in their study of distributive justice. Rawls [1971] famously argued that individuals were not responsible for their innate talents. Dworkin [1981] extended this argument through his distinction between “brute luck” and “option luck”. Distributive justice in both arguments required insurance against bad realization of risks of “brute luck” but responsibility for the bad realizations of option luck.

Within economics, the study of responsibility has emerged from the literature initiated by Duncan Foley [1967] and Hal Varian [1974] on fairness. An allocation is fair if and only if it is Pareto efficient and envy-free. An allocation is envy-free if no individual would prefer the outcome assigned to another individual to the outcome assigned to her. In an exchange economy, a competitive equilibrium that results from an initial, equal allocation of resources is both Pareto efficient and envy-free because each individual has the same set of options available to her. The competitive equilibrium is thus fair.

In a production economy, however, a similar argument will fail if individuals have different talents. The argument fails for two reasons. First, talents are not transferable though, of course, we may transfer money between agents. Second, when two individuals have unequal talents, they face different sets of feasible options. The more talented have better options and hence do better. The less talented may envy them. As a consequence, no efficient and envy-free equilibrium exists.

These arguments apply to the more abstract concerns of distributive justice and responsibility. The no-envy test outlined above combines two distinct ideas. First, individuals with identical attributes for which they are responsible should have identical well-being. Second, individuals with identical characteristics for which they are not responsible should receive identical compensation for their losses. The first condition addresses option luck; the second brute luck.

Fleurbaey [2008] comprehensively explores the tensions between these two aspects of the no-envy test and between the no-envy test and the Pareto criterion. The compatibility of these two conditions depends on the nature of the correlation of these effects of brute and option luck on the agent's well-being. If the well-being of agents with bad luck is unusually responsive to their bad luck, no fair allocation exists. The requirements of no-envy and Pareto again conflict.

We now turn to a third aspect of autonomy, self-governance. In the context of collective action, self-governance refers to democratic governance. The vast literature on social choice theory investigates the relation of self-governance to the Pareto criterion in this context.

Various assumptions reflect the value of democratic governance in this literature. The most minimal assumption is non-dictatorship. We may interpret Arrow's initial result as demonstrating, for direct democracy, a complex incompatibility between the Pareto criterion and several other axioms including non-dictatorship, the axiom of minimal self-governance. The complexity arises because we cannot easily determine which of the several axioms is most fundamental. The literature, for example, has investigated the importance of the axiom of independence of irrelevant alternatives more thoroughly than the Pareto criterion. This emphasis perhaps reflects the strong appeal of the Pareto criterion.

Representative democracy, however, presents the conflict more starkly. In modern society, communal self-governance generally operates through representative institutions. Individuals do not directly enact substantive legislative programs. Rather, they elect representatives to legislatures that then enact substantive legislative programs. Phrased differently, election procedures are candidate-based rather than assembly-based or program based. Notice that this distinction persists even in those states that have adopted party-list proportional representation schemes. In these schemes, an individual votes for a party rather than an individual candidate that has endorsed a specific program. The election determines the party composition of the legislature. Each contesting party then constitutes a candidate.

These candidate-based procedures, however, are inconsistent with the minimal demands of communal self-governance. Benoit and Kornhauser [2010] have proven that the only Pareto efficient, candidate-based procedure is a dictatorship. Again the Pareto criterion conflicts with a (minimal) requirement of communal self-governance or autonomy.

5.3 The Argument for Welfarism Revisted

The discussion in the previous section has not decisively demonstrated that we should reject welfarism as the sole evaluative criterion for legal rules and institutions. We have argued only that arguments that rest on the intuitive appeal of the Pareto criterion are insufficient to establish the welfarist claim. The Pareto criterion has great intuitive appeal but it also has strong implications that bring it into conflict with other principles that also have strong intuitive appeal.

Legal rules and institutions offer a comprehensive guide to and regulation of social life. The intuitive appeal of various principles may vary with the range of activity governed by the legal rule or institution. The intuitive appeal of the Pareto criterion is strongest in those areas of law that regulate corporate and commercial behavior. Perhaps here indeed welfarist considerations should provide the sole guide to the structure of legal rules and institutions. Election law and laws regulating political speech, by contrast, may be legal domains in which the appeal of principles of communal self-governance dominate. In these areas, evaluation based exclusively on welfarist considerations seems less appropriate.

Controversies in many areas of law, however, implicate many of our values. Environmental regulation, for example, clearly implicates welfarist concerns. Regulation determines in part the relative costs of production of various goods and services that contribute to individual well-being. Environmental regulation, however, also clearly implicates questions of autonomy. Productive activities may impose unwanted risks on individuals that limit the exercise of the individual's autonomy. Tort law perhaps raises these issues more starkly.

Similarly, we may understand conflicts over the appropriate tax and social welfare policy as raising questions not only of efficiency but also of autonomy as responsibility. Exclusive focus on welfarist concerns distorts these policy debates by ignoring fundamental issues that divide us.

6. Concluding Remarks

Though the controversy over economic analysis of law has waned, its project continues to disquiet many scholars who study legal phenomena. The prior discussion identifies two distinct sources for that disquiet.

Many legal scholars object to the normative theory of adjudication advanced by policy analysts. These scholars generally reject the welfarism to which policy analysis is committed. The prior discussion suggests, however, that a rejection of welfarism as a moral theory is neither necessary nor sufficient for the rejection of the normative theory of adjudication advanced by policy analysts.

The methodology of economic analysis of law poses a more significant challenge to traditional accounts of law. Economic analysis of law provokes disquiet because the model of self-interested maximization of preferences apparently does not admit a concept of normativity but explaining the normativity of law is a central pre-occupation of philosophy of law. The logic of this commitment to self-interested maximization of preferences would appear to lead to a denial of the need for a distinct concept of law in the explanation and evaluation of social institutions. As section 3 suggested, this denial of normativity may only be apparent as the methodological resources of economic analysis of law allow for at least some accommodation for the incorporation of some normative reasons into the explanation of behavior.

Economic analysis of law seeks primarily to explain how people behave in response to legal rules and institutions. This core project of economic analysis of law complements traditional legal theory with its emphasis on the nature of law and its normative claims. Within economic analysis of law, however, lies a more ambitious project that would radically reconstruct the debate over the concept of law. It replaces the debate over the concept of law with two related inquiries.

The first inquiry is explanatory. It requires a concept of governance that facilitates our understanding of how societies resolve problems of adaptation, monitoring, application and sanction. Governance regimes include purely coercive regimes as well as regimes with some normative aspect to them. It regards the debate over which of these systems should be called “legal systems” as fruitless and uninteresting.

The second inquiry is normative and treats the term “law” as an honorific or a term of commendation that we apply to some governance structures. The value of legality, of course, is neither clear nor uncontroversial. It requires much elaboration.

These two conceptual inquiries intersect. An analogy with economics may clarify the intersection. Economics at its core studies resource allocation mechanisms. In so doing, economists have identified a particular value, efficiency, that good resource allocation mechanisms achieve or manifest. Economists then seek to identify the conditions under which specific resource allocation mechanisms such as competitive markets will realize efficiency.

Economic analysis of law suggests a similar research project. First, characterize governance structures. Next, specify the value of legality. Finally, identify the conditions under which specific governance structures realize the value of legality. This project thus transforms the project of legal theory as currently understood while nonetheless leaving past legal theory both comprehensible and fertile. Traditional legal theory suggests how we might articulate both the concept of governance and the concept of legality that economic analysis seeks to develop and elaborate.


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Research for this entry was supported by the Filomen d'Agostino and Max E. Greenberg Research Fund of New York University School of Law.