Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to The Kochen-Specker Theorem

Derivation of STAT FUNC

The result is proved for a pure state and a non-degenerate discrete observable A with eigenvalues ai.

We first rewrite the statistical algorithm for projection operators:

(1) prob(v(A)| ψ> = ak) = Tr(P| ak> · P| ψ>)

For an arbitrary function f: RR (where R is the set of real numbers) we define the function of an observable A as:

f(A) =df Σi f(ai) P| ai>

Moreover, we introduce the characteristic function χa as:

χa(x) = 1 for x = a
  = 0 for xa

As a result, we can rewrite a project operator P| ak> as:

(2) P| ak> = χak(A)

and thus the statistical algorithm as:

prob(v(A)| ψ>=ak) = Tr(χak(A) · P| ψ>)

We also use a simple mathematical property of characteristic functions:

χa(f(x)) = χf−1(a)(x)

whence we can also write:

(3) χa(f(A)) = χf−1(a)(A)


prob(v(f(A))| φ> = b)    =    Tr(P| b> · P| φ>)   (by (1))
     =    Tr(χb(f(A)) · P| φ>)   (by (2))
     =    Tr(χf−1(b)(A) · P| φ>)   (by (3))
     =    Tr(P| f−1(b)> · P| φ>)   (by (2))
     =    prob(v(A)| φ> = f−1(b))   (by (1))


prob(v(f(A))| φ> = b)    =    prob(v(A)| φ> = f−1(b))

Now since

v(A) = f−1(b)    ⇔    f(v(A)) = b,

we have

prob(v(f(A))| φ> = b)    =    prob(f(v(A))| φ> = b)

which is STAT FUNC.

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