Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to The Kochen-Specker Theorem

Proof of VC2

Let Sx, Sy, Sz be the usual angular momentum operators satisfying [Sx, Sy] = i Sz, and define S2 := Sx2 + Sy2 + Sz2. It can be shown that the eigenvalues of S2 are s(s + 1) where s is an integer or half-integer.

Now let s=1. Then it follows (see e.g. Kochen and Specker 1967: 308, Redhead 1987: 37-38) that Sx2, Sy2, Sz2 are all mutually commuting and that:

Sx2 + Sy2 + Sz2 = 2I,

where I is the identity operator. Now, from KS2 (a) (Sum Rule):

v(Sx2) + v(Sy2) + v(Sz2) = 2v(I)

Now, assume an observable R such that v(R) ≠ 0 in state |ψ>. From this assumption and KS2 (b) (Product Rule):

    v(R) = v(I R) = v(I) v(R)
v(I) = 1


(VC2)  v(Sx2) + v(Sy2) + v(Sz2) = 2

where v(Si2) = 1 or 0, for i = x, y, z.

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