Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to The Kochen-Specker Theorem

Proof of VC1

We exploit two mathematical facts about projection operators Pi:

(A) Pi2 = Pi (the Pi are ‘idempotent’);

(B) If H is a Hilbert space of denumerable dimension, and if the Pi are operators projecting on qi, where the set {qi} forms an orthonormal basis of H, then Σi Pi=I (where I is the identity operator) (the Pi form ‘a resolution of the identity’).

Consider now an arbitrary state |ψ> and an arbitrary nondegenerate operator Q on H3, its eigenvectors |q1>, |q2>, |q3>, and projection operators P1, P2, P3 whose ranges are the rays spanned by these vectors. The eigenvectors form an orthonormal basis, thus, by (B):

P1 + P2 + P3 = I

Now, P1, P2, P3 are compatible, so from assumption KS2 (a) (Sum Rule):

v(P1) + v(P2) + v(P3) = v(I)

Now, from KS2 (b) (Product Rule) and (A):

    v(Pi)2 = v(Pi2) = v(Pi)
v(Pi) = 1 or 0

Now, assume an observable R such that v(R) ≠ 0 in state |ψ>. From this assumption and KS2 (b) (Product Rule):

    v(R) = v(I R) = v(Iv(R)
v(I) = 1


(VC1)  v(P1) + v(P2) + v(P3) = 1

where v(Pi) = 1 or 0, for i = 1, 2, 3.

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