Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Transitional Justice

1. Other transitional policies include administrative purges, the opening of archives, reparations and the creation of public monuments. I have decided to concentrate on war crime tribunals and truth commissions both because these are the most frequently used instruments (other policies are most often implemented, if at all, in conjunction with these) and because their employment raises the philosophical dilemmas associated with the aftermath of war in the sharpest, most dramatic fashion.

2. Earlier attempts to conduct war crime trials against the Germans in the aftermath of World War 1 and against the Turks for the massacre of Armenians were mostly abortive: Wilhelm II escaped and found refuge in the Netherlands. The German courts essentially refused to convict or seriously punish those the allies had designated as major war criminals. The British, who started out with a strong commitment to prosecute Turkish war criminals, lost much of their resolve and ended up trading many of the Ottoman killers in their custody for British POW's. For a good survey of these early attempts see Bass (2002, Ch. 2,3,4).

3. For a summary of this debate see Bass (2002, 152-161).

4. The full transcript of Jackson's speech is available online.

5. Commenting on the significance of the trials for international human rights law, John Shuttock (2006) has recently claimed that, “the Genocide Convention, the Universal Declaration of Human Rights and ultimately the international human rights movement—all grew out of the great Nuremberg experiment.”

6. For more detail see: Futamura (2008) and Totani (2008).

7. The Nuremberg trials are documented by special projects at Harvard and Yale law schools. See:

Many materials pertaining to ICTY decisions can be found on its website. Proceedings of the Milosevic trials are available at the Milosevic Trial Public Archive, at Bard College. The ICTR website also contains a great deal of documentary information.

8. For good accounts of the aims and limitations of Hybrid Courts see Higonnet (2006) and Nouwen (2006).

9. Public lecture by Judge Philippe Kirsch, President, International Criminal Court, The Midwest Regional Conference on International Justice: The International Criminal Court 10 Years after the Rome Conference, DePaul University, April 25, 2008. The record is available online.

As Kirsch himself admits, such deterrence is extremely hard to measure.

10. The court's indictment of Bashir has generated both a great deal of excitement and a great deal of skepticism. While enthusiasts characterize the indictment as the most important since the ones issued by prosecutors at Nuremberg, skeptics worry that the proceedings would disrupt ongoing efforts to quell the violence in Sudan. For samples of both types of reaction see:

11. The full text of the statute is available online.

12. It would seem that worries of victors' justice are less relevant when it comes to international tribunals such as the ICTY, ICTR or the ICC which were not set up by victorious parties. However, even when it comes to such “internationalized” judicial bodies, powerful nations still have the wherewithal to make sure their military personnel are not at risk of prosecution by international tribunals. The ICTY will not take up any of NATO's bombing, The ICTR will not directly take up European passivity in the face of escalating Hutu belligerence, and the ICC has not yet considered cases outside of Africa. In so far as the idea behind victor's justice is that the extent of one's political power determines whether they are the dispensers of justice or subject to it, the complaint still holds.

13. See, e.g., interview with McNamara in Errol Morris' documentary The Fog of War (2003).

14. For further discussions of victors' justice see Minow (1998), Chang and Barker (2001), Peskin (2005).

15. I am grateful to Thomas Pogge for this point

16. The conspiracy jurisprudence was borrowed from anti-trust litigation that Stimson had been involved with earlier in his career. Presumably the mens rea requirement is satisfied by the very fact of belonging to such criminal organizations. Such guilt by association is, of course, difficult to square with the basic assumptions of legalism. More on this below.

17. For a comprehensive account see Cryer (2005)

18. The conspiracy jurisprudence developed in Nuremberg certainly brings up the same difficulty: organizations such as the SS and Gestapo were declared criminal and all their members were subjected to conviction solely on this basis, without the need to establish individual mens rea.

19. For an excellent treatment of the tensions between legalism and the use of CR (as well as other doctrines that challenge legalistic assumptions) see Drumbel (2005) and Robinson (forthcoming). Also of interest in this context is Osiel's (1999) defense of “liberal show trials”.

20. There are indications that this is changing with the advent of the ICC. As noted earlier, the jurisprudence regarding the conditions and extent of victims' involvement in the proceedings of the ICC has not yet been crystallized. To the extent that victims are allowed to have a substantial role in influencing punishment or even in the selection of whom to indict, the court will be jettisoning its original commitment to strict, procedural legalism.

21. Reporting on the ICTY for the Financial Times Lloyd (2008) writes: “The trials are often grindingly boring, heavy on detail, challenges, asides, elaborate courtesies. Following an early morning flight, I fell asleep watching the trial of two Macedonians, charged with a murderous attack on the Muslim village of Ljuboten in 2001. I was roused by a stern UN guard, but soon fell asleep again—to be prodded awake by her truncheon. A sole spectator slumbering in the gallery does not enhance the dignity of the court. I claim, in extenuation, some distinguished precedents. Rebecca West, covering Nuremberg for The New Yorker, found the proceedings ‘insufferably tedious’ ”. Similar concerns about tedium prompted a senior member of the prosecution team at Nuremberg to resign when Robert Jackson decided to focus his case on documentary evidence and rely less on dramatic live evidence.

22. Describing her experience of the ICTR, journalist and human rights activist Helena Coben (2004) notes: “You go to this courtroom, set in the middle of a bustling African market town, and here are people enacting these strange rituals of a European-style courtroom. I was looking at this whole thing through a sort of anthropological lens and it seemed so bizarre, so weird, that you have these people here who normally practice in British-style courts and are wearing their little powdered wigs and all the lawyers and judges wear long robes. They all wear little lacy bits at their throat, which is something that happens in French courts. To see them going through all these rituals of people coming into the court in an orderly fashion and standing and rising and sitting, and ”My learned friend“ this, and ”His Honor, the Judge“ that, in the middle of this African market town, it just strikes me as bizarre”

23. For a chilling survey of failures in preventing genocide in the 20th century see Power (2002). It is unclear if the claim is fair given the long break in the practice of international criminal justice during the cold war. In other words, we do not yet have a long enough record to tell whether the practice of international criminal law can lead to deterrence. What we can tell is that Nuremberg didn't prevent Yugoslavia and Rwanda, and that the tribunals set up to account for these atrocities didn't help prevent the genocide in Sudan.

24. See, for example, Michal Ben-Josef Hirsch (2007)

25. Bolivia, Uruguay, Uganda, Zimbabwe and Chad also made use of truth commissions before South Africa did, but these efforts were far less substantial.

26. My summary of the three Latin American truth commissions is based on Hayner (2001). More literature on the Salvadorian commission is available online from the United State Institue of Peace. More information on the Chilean commission is available online from

27. This survey of the circumstances surrounding the creation of the TRC draws on Boraine (2001), Graybill (2002), Hayner (2002), Meredith (1999) and Van der Merwe (2000, 2003, 2005).

28. Postamble to South Africa's Interim Constitution of 1993 as quoted in Meredith (1999, 20-21).

29. Proceedings were published in Boraine et al. (1994).

30. Proceedings were published in Boraine et al. (1995).

31. For good accounts of the legislative process see Krog (1998) and Graybill (2002, ch.1).

32. For a more specific account of the criteria used to determine whether an act was ‘politically motivated’ see Hayner (2002, 274 fn. 32).

33. For more detail see Minow (2002, 56) and Kiss (2000, 68). South Africa's constitutional court rejected a last moment challenge to the legality of the TRC filed by the families of Steven Biko and human rights lawyer Griffith Mxenge. The claimants argued that the commission unconstitutionally blocked them from receiving compensation for the murder of their relatives.

34. The phrase is taken from a BBC news report aired on May 31, 2001. (Available online.) See also Michael Ignatieff's (1997) reportage about the TRC for the New Yorker. He writes: “The reality is that, when you trade amnesty for truth, murderers get away with murder”.

35. This discussion is based on Eisikovits (2004, 2006).

36. For more detail see Kiss (2000, 73).

37. The best, most comprehensive philosophical treatment of forgiveness can be found in Griswold (2007). Griswold rejects the appropriateness of political forgiveness, arguing it should be replaced by political apologies. For a detailed account of the argument against forgiveness in politics see also Eisikovits (2004).

38. It is important to note that politically sanctioned amnesia has its limits. While it may impact school curricula and public spaces, the state has a much harder time reaching the informal mechanisms, which transmit cultural and collective memories. In other words, chances are that a policy of forgetting will not result in enough actual forgetting (given, e.g., what young children are taught at home or what they pick up from older neighbors) to prevent the lingering of resentment.