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Japanese Pure Land Philosophy

First published Mon Nov 19, 2012

Pure Land Buddhist teachings have played a major role in Japanese intellectual and social life from the sixth century CE, when emissaries from the Korean peninsula first officially introduced Buddhist images and texts to the Japanese court, down to the present. While the influence of the Zen tradition on Japanese thought and culture is widely acknowledged, the role of Pure Land Buddhist concepts and sensibilities have tended to receive only marginal recognition in the West; nevertheless, it is impossible to ignore their perhaps even more pervasive force. Moreover, as D. T. Suzuki (1870–1966) has noted,

The Japanese may not have offered very many original ideas to world thought or world culture, but in Shin we find a major contribution the Japanese can make to the outside world and to all other Buddhist schools. (Suzuki 1970, pp. 13–14)

Although Suzuki does not define what ideas he has in mind, he indicates that it is specifically in relation to the Pure Land tradition that we find a significant, innovative development in Buddhist philosophy that has taken place in Japan.

In brief, the Japanese Pure Land contribution to Buddhist philosophy may be said to lie in its fusion of two fundamental attitudes. On the one hand, it stands squarely upon a Mahayana Buddhist conception of enlightened wisdom as radically nondichotomous and nondual with reality, indicated with such terms as thusness, buddha-nature, and emptiness. On the other hand, it directly confronts the nature of human existence in its ineluctable finitude: karmically conditioned, discriminative and reifying in awareness, and given to the afflicting passions of attachment to a falsely conceived self surrounded by substantial objects. Through its probing religious anthropology, Japanese Pure Land thought explores the paradoxical issues of how transformative awakening can be possible for the ignorant self, how attainment as liberation from defiled self-will can occur, and the nature of the world of religious realization that unfolds within the locus of a person's samsaric existence.

1. Introduction

Before proceeding to a consideration of Japanese Pure Land Buddhist thought, it may be useful to note two intertwined difficulties that it presents for modern Western readers in particular: an extensive scriptural and commentarial tradition, and apparent resemblances to familiar forms of Christian thought.

1.1 The Scriptural and Commentarial Tradition

The Pure Land teachings are often regarded as popularized, devotional extensions of a more philosophically demanding contemplative tradition based on a core doctrine of emptiness or voidness. In fact, the concepts of multitudes of celestial buddhas and their buddha-fields throughout the cosmos are already in evidence in the earliest strata of extant texts produced by the Mahayana movement, and sutras expounding distant buddha-fields, such as that of Akṣobhya Buddha in the east, are among the first to be translated into Chinese already in the second century CE, with sutras teaching Amida Buddha soon to follow. Thus, sutras teaching methods of achieving liberation from samsaric existence through attaining birth in buddha-fields in other regions of the cosmos—particularly Amida Buddha's Pure Land—were among the earliest Buddhist scriptures transmitted to China. Further, the teaching of birth into Amida's buddha-field became the focus of a continuous commentarial tradition that began among such major Indian Mahayana thinkers as Nāgārjuna (c. 150–250) and Vasubandhu (c. 320–400) in India, was transmitted to China as early as the third century CE, and is maintained today in Japan. Thus, it may be said that Pure Land concepts and ideas emerged directly out of elemental strains of Mahayana Buddhist thought at an early stage and underwent continual development in East Asia.

The Pure Land path based on Amida is expounded in the Larger and Smaller Sutras of the Adornments of [the Buddha-field Named] Bliss (Sukhāvatīvyūha-sūtra), which trace their origins back to northwestern India in about the first century CE, the period of the redaction of the Prajñāpāramitā in 8000 Lines, Garland, Lotus, Vimalakīrti, and other major Mahayana sutras. These two sutras, along with the later Sutra of Contemplation on the Buddha of Immeasurable Life (Jp. Kanmuryōjukyō), form the foundation for the East Asian Pure Land tradition.

The Larger Sutra is the only extant sutra that relates the narrative of how the bodhisattva Dharma-Storehouse (Dharmākara) established and fulfilled vows to become Amida (“immeasurable [light and life]”), the buddha of compassion who leads all beings to enlightenment by enabling them to be born into his buddha-field. It was first translated into Chinese in the third century and was reputedly retranslated eleven more times over the following seven hundred years, attesting to its enduring importance in Chinese Buddhist tradition. The Pure Land tradition developed for over a thousand years in China, accumulating an extensive body of scriptural and commentarial writings, before undergoing the radical reinterpretation in Japan that Suzuki refers to.

Thus, the Pure Land Buddhist heritage in Japan stands today upon the selective use of a continuous textual tradition stretching back nearly two millennia. Terms from the Chinese of the sutras in their various renditions and evolving commentaries on the Pure Land path became the standard medium of Pure Land Buddhist discourse in Japan, so that a full grasp of the Japanese tradition requires familiarity with these terms, their relationship to the broader Buddhist tradition, and the historical changes in their understandings and emphases in the course of their long development in various cultural spheres and sectarian settings. Japanese Buddhists have been, throughout their history, fully aware of their geographical position at the easternmost reach of the spread of Buddhism in Asia and of their indebtedness to the transmission of Buddhist tradition across the various ethnic locales and political boundaries of the Asian continent.

1.2 Comparative Frameworks

A further difficulty in grasping Japanese Pure Land thought involves the pitfalls of a comparative approach in relation to Western religious traditions. When, for his own polemical purposes, Karl Barth (1886–1968) surveyed the religious traditions of the world in search of doctrinal parallels to Christianity, he concluded that it was the Japanese Pure Land tradition that provided “the most exact, comprehensive, and plausible ‘pagan’ parallel to Christianity” (Barth 1961, 1,2: 342). He expresses some shock at the depth and specificity of resemblance, commenting that the Pure Land thought of Hōnen (1133–1212) and Shinran (1173–1263) in particular

parallels not so much Roman or Greek Catholicism but rather of all things the Christianity of the Reformation, and therefore confronts Christianity with the question of its truth precisely in its form as a consistent religion of grace. (Barth 1961, 1,2: 342; for a discussion on Barth's comparative comments, see Hirota 2000a, especially pp. 35–38)

Barth insightfully discusses specific doctrinal analogues in a long note in Church Dogmatics, and these parallels have indeed tended to form the foundations for the understanding of Japanese Pure Land Buddhism in much of Western scholarly literature. Unfortunately, to the extent that Pure Land Buddhism has seemed to resemble Protestant Christianity, it has also been assumed to be divorced from “genuine” or “original” Mahayana Buddhist thought and practices and devoid of any intellectual interest. Any comparative considerations of Japanese Pure Land Buddhist thought, therefore, require caution, even in the face of seemingly evident resemblance.

1.3 A Japanese Pure Land Philosophy

As mentioned before, the Pure Land Buddhist teachings have taken on a highly distinctive shape in Japan, generating new determinations of the central canonical texts and multiple strands of scholastic and commentarial tradition. It is in relation to these latter developments that we can best speak of a specifically “Japanese Pure Land Buddhist philosophy,” for the creative construals of a practicable Buddhist path to transformed awareness involved, in the forces for their evolution and in the articulation of their implications, deliberation on such matters as the nature of human existence, self and other, language, reality, and truth. Further, the disparate streams of Japanese Pure Land thought stand as distinctive understandings, often employing their own characteristic terminology, of an already highly evolved Buddhist tradition, and a grasp of them often requires a recognition of the tensions between received tradition and reinterpretation that they manifest.

In order to treat Pure Land Buddhist tradition while keeping within the parameters of “Japan” and “philosophy,” this entry will divide the discussion into three sections. In the first, there is a brief sketch of several broad trajectories of thought that stem from central Mahayana concerns and that shape the Pure Land outlook, coming to hold particular significance in the Japanese Pure Land tradition. The second section identifies the central issues involved in Hōnen's seminal reformulation of the Pure Land path. The third section will then treat several fundamental philosophical issues in Japanese Pure Land thought, focusing upon Pure Land thought as one distinctive stream of a path to religious awakening within the Mahayana traditions of praxis, and further upon the major developments that occurred specifically in Japan. The point will not be to suggest that medieval Japanese thinkers speak directly to Western philosophical issues, but rather to investigate how their thinking might be understood to take up topics commonly considered philosophical in Western intellectual tradition and to illuminate perspectives relevant to current intellectual concerns.

2. Contours of Pure Land Buddhist Thought

Two fundamental elements of early Mahayana practice contributed significantly to the development of the Pure Land path. First, the animating force that initially gave rise to the Mahayana movement as a whole—the critical reflection on obdurate self-attachment that attended even religious endeavor—was pursued to a culmination in Pure Land aspiration. Second, the Mahayana movement's formulation of genuine practice as the career of the bodhisattva-practitioner provided the principal framework and symbols for the articulation of Pure Land practice. In particular, the stage in the bodhisattva's progress of nonretrogression from perfect enlightenment, which was regarded as holding decisive significance, served to shape the Pure Land path by becoming its goal.

2.1 Critical Self-Reflection

Mahayana tradition appears to have arisen when, around the beginning of the common era, groups of Buddhists emerged who, reflecting on their own experience in practice, assumed a critical stance toward the immediately preceding tradition. They viewed the existing institutions as having declined, during five centuries of transmission since the time of the Buddha, into monastic formalism and scholasticism, sectarian disputation, and an erroneous notion of the nature of the wisdom that was the aim of Buddhist practice. They declared that the established view of training, directed to merely personal emancipation from painful existence, was narrow and finally inadequate, and that in their aspiration to attain the actual realization Śākyamuni had transmitted, they had sought and discovered a method by which genuine attainment was possible. They called this new path the “great vehicle” (Mahayana), because it holds as its goal the attainment of authentic enlightenment by all beings, and asserted that it was superior to the existing institutions, which they labeled the “lesser vehicle” (Hinayana).

According to Mahayanists, the Hinayana sages withdrew from ordinary life in society and performed practices and disciplines, seeking their own extinction of passions and emancipation from samsaric existence by realizing the nonsubstantiality of their own person—the fact that the ego-self is no more than a delusional construct. Mahayana Buddhists asserted that such praxis did not free practitioners from a final residue of self-attachment manifested in the desertion of the beings of samsara in favor of personal liberation and in an attachment to the goal of nirvana itself. Instead, the Mahayanists taught the thorough relinquishment of all attachments through the realization or “seeing” of the nonsubstantiality or emptiness that pervades not only the self, but all things and all persons. Such seeing is established by eradicating the discriminative thinking arising from the perspective of the reified, delusional self. One thus transcends even the dichotomies of self and other, blind passions and enlightenment, and samsara and nirvana, and realizes nondiscriminative wisdom that “sees suchness” or things just as they are. Here, practice to attain enlightenment oneself and to liberate all beings is understood to be one.

The rigorous scrutiny of even religious praxis for vestiges of self-attachment and discriminative thinking, which informed the origins of the Mahayana movement, also provided impetus for its development as the Pure Land path.

2.2 Seeds of Pure Land Thought in the Bodhisattva Path

The path of realization based on the Mahayana conception of genuine wisdom was elaborated as the career of the bodhisattva. As described in Mahayana sutras, it begins with the profound awakening of the mind aspiring for enlightenment (bodhicitta), the determination to become a buddha whatever hardships one may encounter over the course of many lifetimes of endeavor. This unshakable resolution is declared in the presence of a buddha in formal vows, and typically, the bodhisattva receives from the buddha a prophesy foretelling eventual fulfillment of those vows. A standard element of such individual vows is the establishment, through their vast accumulation of merit through praxis, of a buddha land or field of influence (buddhakṣetra), which is understood as giving concrete manifestation both to the splendor of their attainment and to their activity to bring beings to enlightenment.

The bodhisattva then embarks upon the practices and disciplines, to be continued through countless lifetimes, that will finally result in fulfillment. It is said that vast aeons—“three great innumerable kalpas”—are required for the completion of a bodhisattva's practices (the inconceivable stretches of time may be understood as expressing the depths of a being's evil karma to be eradicated and the preciousness of enlightenment). The process of practice has been formulated in a scheme of ten stages, in which the most crucial is the stage of nonretrogression, the first (or in some formats, the seventh). While prior to reaching this stage, they will fall back into samsaric existence if they discontinue their practice, once they have attained nonretrogression through stilling their discriminative thought and seeing suchness, they will never regress but steadily advance in their practice to supreme awakening.

Although Pure Land Buddhism is sometimes understood to teach a paradisial afterlife, in fact it developed as a method for achieving nonretrogression, one that provided an alternative to the arduous endeavor through numerous lifetimes required for reaching this stage in the earlier formulations of the bodhisattva path. As practitioners found themselves without enlightened guidance in a world increasingly distant from the benign influence of a buddha's presence, the obstacles to successful practice loomed ever larger and practitioners came to seek a practicable way to advance. The possibility of entrance into an environment that would support one's efforts in bodhisattva practices emerged, and on the basis of the Pure Land sutras, the concepts of the bodhisattva path were recast to render a new understanding of the nature of practice.

2.3 Merit Transference

There are several aspects of the bodhisattva's career of particular note when approaching Pure Land Buddhist thought. First, an essential element of the bodhisattva path is the transference to other beings of the merit that accrues from performance of praxis. All Buddhists have accepted that, by the principle of karmic causation, good acts hold the power to counteract the effects of evil deeds and lead to better conditions in the next birth. In the earlier Buddhism, it was generally assumed that only one's own thoughts and acts could exert their influence on one's future conditions, although the evidence of inscriptions suggests that sharing merit with one's parents or teacher was also recognized. In the Mahayana tradition, however, bodhisattvas perform good acts and practices for long aeons and thus accumulate vast stores of merit, but their practice is invariably undertaken with the liberation of all beings foremost in their minds. Thus, their merit is always freely and selflessly given to beings in samsaric existence. This concept of giving or transferring merit (Jp. ekō) is a direct expression of the nature of bodhisattvas, for they undertake their practice in nondichotomous wisdom.

2.4 Cosmic Buddhas and Buddha-fields

Even in the early Buddhist tradition, Sakyamuni's attainment of awakening was not regarded as an utterly unique event or even the first occurrence of buddhahood. Nevertheless, the appearance of a buddha, who bears the epochal role of bringing liberation to beings through teaching, was regarded as a momentous event in the history of the world. The early tradition had taught instead the ideal of the arhat, who would enter into nirvana upon death, having completely eradicated blind passions and attained emancipation from further rebirth within the world of samsaric existence.

The Mahayana tradition, however, recognized the attainment of buddhahood itself—not merely deliverance from afflicting passions and samsaric existence—as the genuine goal of religious practice and proclaimed it, along with the engagement with beings in samsara that it implied, as the supreme fulfillment for all sentient beings since the beginningless past. It is natural, therefore, that Mahayana Buddhists recognize the present existence of vast numbers of celestial buddhas and bodhisattvas who had already reached attainment.

Further, it was assumed in Indian Buddhism that two buddhas could not appear in a single epoch of a world system, any more than two “universal monarchs” (cakravartin) could rule simultaneously. Thus, the existence of innumerable buddhas implied that there are myriads of purified buddha-fields over which they preside, for it may be expected that, through aeons of history in numberless worlds, countless beings will have attained supreme awakening by following the bodhisattva path, and these beings all work for the liberation of others in their own spheres of realization. Mahayana writings often refer to the concept of the “great chiliocosm,” which is made up of one billion universes. In the Mahayana cosmology, there are great chiliocosms countless as the sands of the Ganges throughout the ten quarters, and most are buddha-fields, or parts of buddha-fields, in which a buddha teaches dharma for the benefit of its inhabitants. Our own universe—called the Sahā world, or “world in which pain must be endured”—is the buddha-field of Sakyamuni, the sphere in which he appeared in order to save the beings within it. Thus, the entire cosmos is a panoply of countless buddha-fields in which the drama of the salvation of all beings is carried out, with buddhas and bodhisattvas radiating the light of wisdom-compassion for all living things.

2.5 Monastic and Lay

A third aspect of notable relevance to the Pure Land tradition is the transcendence of the dichotomy of monastic and lay in Mahayana thought. Monastic life had developed as the practical norm for Buddhist life in the early tradition, for the end was personal emancipation from samsaric existence. Practice was construed as observance of the monastic code and meditative practices, and withdrawal from ordinary lay life was itself seen as a crucial step in breaking the bonds of samsaric existence. Mahayanists, however, sought to realize a fully nondichotomous wisdom; hence, while in actual practice they continued to recognize the efficacy of monastic life as a means to the goal, renunciation of lay life was not in itself an intrinsic or requisite aspect of emancipation. They therefore reformulated the central elements of the path—traditionally given as the “three learnings” of precepts, meditation, and wisdom—as the six paramitas—giving, moral action, patience, effort, meditation, and wisdom. In this enumeration of virtues, we find selfless giving understood not simply as alms-giving or “charity,” but as the total, compassionate activity of bodhisattvas for whom meritorious action leading to enlightenment and the giving of their own merit to others are interfused. Other paramitas also emphasize the resolution to fulfill the bodhisattva vows for the enlightenment of all beings. Moreover, precepts or morality was not necessarily construed as the rigid monastic rule governing sequestered life apart from normal society, but as a more general code of proper action observable in varying degrees in lay life also. Thus, true practice and attainment transcends the dualism of monk and lay, and the arena of the bodhisattva's practice is precisely the realm of samsara in which unenlightened beings wander. This insight rooted in Mahayana thought from its beginnings underlies the evolution of Pure Land Buddhism in Japan in particular, which during the period of its most dynamic development evinces precisely the shift of the center of praxis from assumptions of monastic efficacy to an emphasis on everyday life as the domain of in which genuine practice is manifested.

3. Japanese Pure Land Buddhist Thought

3.1 Hōnen's Revolutionary Understanding of Nembutsu as Praxis

Since our fundamental concern is with characteristically Japanese developments of Pure Land thought, I will focus in particular on the stream of Hōnen. It was Hōnen who achieved perhaps the radical doctrinal innovation of his seminal period in Japanese Buddhist history by establishing the practice of vocal nembutsu as an independent, self-sufficient path of Buddhist praxis. Despite widespread esteem for his priestly and scholarly attainments and the purity of his religious aspirations, Hōnen himself, in his penetrating self-reflection, expressed a profound awareness of his incapacity to fulfill any Buddhist practice and thereby advance himself toward enlightenment. He therefore searched throughout Buddhist tradition for an accessible path, and at length found the exposition of the nembutsu.

Nembutsu practices in early Buddhist tradition centered on mindfulness exercises conducted in veneration of Sakyamuni Buddha, and included elements of bodily worship and the reverent repetition of the name of the Buddha. Later, it developed into a core practice of monastics involving ritual prostrations with the body, contemplation on the features of enlightened beings and vocal recitation of their names, conducted with long lists of Buddhas and bodhisattvas. Such nembutsu practice was and remains a basic practice in the Tendai monastery of Enryaku-ji on Mount Hiei, where Hōnen originally trained and lived. In addition, the Chinese Tientai practice of “constant walking samadhi” (jōgyō zammai), in which a monk circumambulates a large statue of Amida, intoning the nembutsu and meditating on Amida Buddha and features of the Pure Land continuously for ninety days, had been transmitted to Mount Hiei during the Heian period, and the group practice of “constant nembutsu” (fudan nembutsu) in which the nembutsu was chanted continuously for a set number of days—three or seven—interspersed with the chanting of sutra passages and hymns at the “six hours” of the day, was frequently conducted. Although deeply familiar with such comprehensive modes of practice embracing physical, mental, and verbal discipline, and although widely revered for his own contemplative and scholarly attainments, Hōnen taught that simply uttering the Name of Amida Buddha, “Namu-amida-butsu,” entrusting oneself to his vow to save all beings, results in birth into Amida's buddha-field of enlightened activity. No intellectual command of Buddhist teachings, accumulation of merit, moral rectitude, or any act of practice other than the vocal nembutsu is necessary.

The Pure Land Buddhist path based on the working of Amida's Vow is therefore an effective means toward emancipation from birth-and-death and attainment of Buddhahood—for Hōnen, the only viable way for people at present—and it can be practiced independently of any other Buddhist teaching or method of praxis. While traditionally the nembutsu practice involved mental concentration and the accumulation of numerous recitations, Hōnen taught that in the Pure Land path only the simple saying of “Namu-amida-butsu” with complete trust was involved. There was no specified manner of utterance, no necessity for any accompanying ritual or meditative endeavor, and no stipulation of the length of the period of practice or number of repetitions.

The question, of course, is why mere vocalization of Amida's Name should hold the power to bring about birth into a buddha-field and eventual enlightenment, which in our present condition are virtually impossible to accomplish, even through the achievement of extensive learning, deep meditative states, heroic discipline, and compassionate action. Without an adequate demonstration that vocal nembutsu held such power, Pure Land praxis would remain an supplementary discipline within the existing schools of Buddhist tradition, one supportive practice to be performed in combination with a range of other methods.

Hōnen promulgated his teaching by adopting an innovative perspective on the nature of the practices taught in Buddhist tradition. He reasoned that, although the utterance of the Buddha's name had long been transmitted in various Buddhist schools as one among countless different kinds of practice useful for attainment of enlightenment, the vocal nembutsu designated in Amida's vow as the act leading to birth into the Pure Land was qualitatively distinct from every one of the thousands of other techniques found in the Buddhist teachings. While the physical act of voicing the Name of Amida in itself might be identical, in other forms of Buddhism it was performed in conjunction with various other practices, including the awakening of the aspiration for enlightenment (bodhicitta) and the selfless transference of merits, and like other practices, its fulfillment as praxis genuinely leading toward Buddhahood turned on the practitioner's own purity of motive and powers of concentration and discipline.

The nembutsu taught in Amida's vow, however, as the simple voicing of “Namu-amida-butsu” accessible to all beings regardless of their moral qualities or spiritual capacities, was specifically selected by Amida Buddha as the means by which he could bring to fruition his compassionate vow to liberate all living things from samsaric existence. In other words, Amida, through his vow and the salvific virtue of his own already completed performance of endless aeons of bodhisattva practices, established the saying of the Name as the medium by which his own compassionate working actively reaches each being. Thus, the nembutsu has been prepared for beings as effective practice—already fulfilled by Amida as the act resulting in birth in the Pure Land. This salvific activity is particularly appropriate in the present age, when the accomplishment of praxis as ordinarily understood in Buddhist tradition has receded beyond the reach of beings. Anticipating this situation, Amida's vow teaches that one should relinquish the illusions and attachments focused on the self and its capacities and set aside the extensive body of traditional methods of praxis as no longer effective, since they require a purity of performance no longer achievable. The Pure Land tradition characterizes such practices as “self-power” and advocates instead a turn to the saying the nembutsu as the act that embodies “Other Power,” Amida Buddha's wisdom-compassion functioning in the world.

Two aspects of Hōnen historical role relate directly to our concerns here with philosophical aspects of interpreting and articulating his religious awareness: the means by which Hōnen effected his ground-breaking contribution to Buddhist tradition, and Hōnen's legacy as inherited by his disciples. Regarding the first, Hōnen is recognized as the first and perhaps most revolutionary “founder” of a native Japanese Buddhist tradition. Based on his principle of “the nembutsu selected in Amida's primal vow” (senjaku hongan nembutsu) as the practice embodying the Buddha's Other Power, he established the Pure Land school (Jōdoshū) as an authentic Buddhist path, effective in itself and independent from the traditionally recognized schools that had been transmitted to Japan from the Asian continent over the preceding centuries. Hōnen set about to accomplish this in his major writing, Collection on the Nembutsu Selected in the Primal Vow (Senchaku hongan nembutsu-shū), composed in kanbun (Chinese) and addressed to an audience versed in Buddhist erudition and its methods of discourse. Here, Hōnen systematically raises the traditional issues involved in recognizing the Pure Land teaching as a legitimate school of Buddhism, such as the identification of foundational sutras, the delineation of the historical lineage of masters by which the Pure Land path has been transmitted down to the present, and its doctrinal orthodoxy, demonstrated with reference to the sutras and the commentarial tradition. In his work, Hōnen argues logically and cogently on the basis of scriptural evidence, including extended citations from the recognized Chinese canon.

Hōnen allowed his work to be copied only by disciples during his lifetime, but it was published shortly after his death. It immediately garnered vehement censure and counter-argument from scholar-monks of traditional schools, attesting to the impact Hōnen's nembutsu teaching was already having in Japanese society, but also to the recognition of the forms of scholastic discourse and rational argument into which his thought had been cast. From the accounts of his followers and records of his spoken words and letters, it appears that Hōnen was an immensely charismatic figure, communicating his teaching to both the ordained and lay and persuasively responding to the questions of his many listeners from all walks of life. Nevertheless, the major formulation of his religious thought followed customary models, dictated by his formidable role in Buddhist history.

3.2 The Problematic of Hōnen's Nembutsu Teaching

As we have seen, Hōnen asserted that the nembutsu as imparted to beings in Amida's vow differs profoundly from all other practices handed down in Buddhist tradition. Persons might, therefore, perform the utterance of the Buddha's name as another means of healing the mind and gaining merit, in continuous recitation or as an element of ritual worship or contemplative practice, or they might say the name as the act prescribed in Amida's vow, entrusting themselves wholly to the working of the Buddha's compassion and abandoning any notion of their own goodness or effort as contributing to realization. The former manifests self-power, the latter Other Power. Hōnen taught that it is only the latter that remains operative now for us. However, a serious difficulty in understanding this teaching arose among Hōnen's following, one Hōnen struggled to deal with but was unable to resolve doctrinally.

Disciples found that the nembutsu of Amida's vow as proclaimed by Hōnen in fact involves two elements, both of which are essential: on the one hand, the actual saying of Amida's Name, “Namu-amida-butsu,” and on the other, the wholehearted entrusting of oneself to Amida's vow, which, as we have seen, is precisely what qualitatively distinguishes vocal nembutsu from all other methods of practice and makes one's performance of it the practice selected for beings and already fulfilled by Amida. For Hōnen, these two elements of practice and faith—utterance of the nembutsu and the entrusting of oneself to Amida's vow—were mutually and unproblematically interfused, but many who sought to follow his teaching found that in actual engagement, the path appeared to be defined by emphasis on one element or the other. The question became for many followers: which is central in the life lived in genuine accord with Amida's vow, practice or faith? In other words, concretely, how should persons of the nembutsu carry on their lives?

Those who emphasized practice tended to assume that since the nembutsu was devised and provided out of Amida's wisdom-compassion, those who entrust themselves to the Buddha's vow will spontaneously, out of joy and gratitude, seek to live in mindfulness of Amida and to recite the name as often as possible throughout the remainder of their lives. This view, however, sometimes shaded into ethical and eschatological concerns. Some assumed that practitioners of the nembutsu should seek to live lives appropriate for birth into Amida's buddha-field, lives of diligent recitation and moral rectitude; those who failed to display such dedication were viewed as negligent in their practice. Further, many adopted older views rooted in the Contemplation Sutra, in which nembutsu recitation was seen pragmatically, as a means of cancelling the karmic effects of one's past evil. This latter belief gave decisive weight to the nembutsu uttered at the moment of death, when the nullification of one's final defilements of karmic evil made birth in the Pure Land possible.

By contrast, those who emphasized trust tended toward a more relaxed view of nembutsu recitation and other forms of religious observance or moral rigor, insisting instead on a total trust in Amida's compassion. The Pure Land sutras speak of ten or even a single utterance as adequate, and Hōnen affirms this teaching, since the name as prepared for beings by Amida holds the resultant virtues of his inconceivably long and perfect practice. When one takes refuge in the vow and utters the nembutsu, one's salvation is promised by Amida and one should have no misgivings. At an extreme, however, insistence on leaving all to Amida's salvific activity led to forms of antinomianism, in which even moral restraint was viewed as the impulse to deny the fact of one's cravings and affirm one's own goodness. In more benign forms, emphasis on trust led to a denigration of continued utterance as evidence of doubt of the vow's power and as a residue of attachment to one's own action in bringing about attainment.

Hōnen sought to maintain a tenuous balance between these two, mutually disparaging positions of emphasis on praxis and emphasis on faith:

If, because it is taught [in the Larger Sutra] that birth is attained with but one or ten utterances, you say the nembutsu heedlessly, then faith is hindering practice. If, because it is taught [in Shandao's commentaries] that you should say the Name “without abandoning it from moment to moment,” you believe one or ten utterances to be indecisive, then practice is hindering faith. As your faith, accept that birth is attained with a single utterance; as your practice, endeavor in the nembutsu throughout life. (recorded in “Zenshō-bō ni shimesu on-kotoba,” in Kyōdō 1987, p. 464 and in Hirota 1989, pp. 12–13)

Historically, however, we find that while Hōnen was able to transmit his insights through his own compelling presence, after his death, his disciples developed their individual interpretations of his nembutsu teaching in diverse directions, with some tending toward emphasis on nembutsu practice and other toward trust in the vow. The master, in short, failed to achieve a clear doctrinal resolution of this issue of religious life. In other words, he was unable to give a persuasive account of the nexus between sentient being and Other Power, and appears finally to affirm anew the efficacy of human action, as either recitation of the name of Amida or entrusting of oneself to Amida's vow, or as a combination of both.

4. Philosophical Issues in Japanese Pure Land Buddhist Thought

The question of the relationship between a person's act of nembutsu and Amida Buddha's Other Power—or between trust in Amida's vow, which infuses each human act of nembutsu with Other Power, and the practice of the nembutsu, which has been devised and made efficacious for beings by the Buddha—raises profound questions concerning the sources and significance of human subjectivity and agency. Above all, the emergence of such issues within the context of a thoroughgoing application of the general Mahayana critique of self-attachment in religious praxis gave rise to the most innovative philosophical reflection in the Japanese Pure Land tradition. Thus, it is among disciples of Hōnen who tended toward the pole of emphasis on trust or on the adequacy of a single utterance an engagement with issues that have a distinct resonance with intellectual concerns today. This is because such disciples found it necessary to take up questions of one's self-awareness in the relationship between being and Buddha in the immediate present and to delineate a groundwork for deconstructing commonsense subject-object dualisms applied to this relationship without recourse to abstract conceptions of mystical transcendence.

At the same time, all of Hōnen's disciples found it necessary to formulate responses to the relentless criticisms of the traditional schools, which led periodically to state suppression of the nembutsu teaching, and some resorted to adjustment of various positions Hōnen's logic led him to. For example, one of the leading disciples, Shōkō (1162–1238), founder of the dominant Chinzei branch of the Jōdo school, abandoned Hōnen's view that only the nembutsu could lead to birth in the Pure Land and recognized the efficacy of the traditional practices. Others, however, such as Shinran, Shōkū (1177–1247), and Ippen (1239–1289), pursued the development of Hōnen's radical teaching, each in his own distinctive way, and it is among such figures that we find the more philosophical strains of thinking.

Let us turn here to several basic issues in Pure Land Buddhist thought that (1) emerged from problems of practical engagement but were given characteristic treatment specifically in Japan, and (2) may be considered to have received philosophical attention in the sense that, regarding them, Japanese Pure Land Buddhists were forced, by intra-sectarian debate, to seek a degree of intellectual self-understanding distinct both from scholastic Buddhist discourse and from the kind of realization achieved through religious engagement.

In addition, for convenience, I will discuss these issues under the headings of metaphysics, anthropology, hermeneutics, and ethics. It should be borne in mind, however, that these Western categories, while helpful in establishing a starting point and pursuing the comparative concerns implied in a “philosophical” approach to Buddhist thought, suggest conceptual contours that must in fact be continually breached in seeking to accommodate the fundamentally pragmatic orientation of the Japanese Pure Land tradition and its roots in Mahayana Buddhist thought. In fact, the four headings are best understood as slightly differing perspectives on essentially the same central problem: the apprehension of what is true and real from within a stance of radical conditionedness. What enables such apprehension? What is its significance for human existence? How does it come about? And what implications does it hold for the conduct of life?

4.1 Pure Land Buddhist Metaphysics: Reflection on Reality

The principal metaphysical question occasioned by Japanese Pure Land Buddhism arises most naturally concerning the meaning of a being's birth in the Pure Land and the ontological status of Amida Buddha. Although Western researchers have often been confident in imposing substantialist assumptions on Pure Land thought, asserting, for example, that Hōnen and his followers thought of the Pure Land as a geographical place, and although many Pure Land Buddhists assume that past thinkers regarded the Dharmakara-Amida narrative as historical in a modern sense, in fact the dominant traditional motif in treating questions of the reality of Amida and the Pure Land reflects, not such notions as substance, identity, autonomy, and permanence, but an interactive, dynamic movement across provisional dichotomies of formless reality and form, enlightened wisdom and ignorance, transtemporality and time, buddha and sentient being. This thinking characterized by the discriminative perception of the world of beings rooted in the nondiscriminative apprehension of reality may be seen in relation to the question of the real existence of beings born in the Pure Land in the following passage from the sixth century Chinese Pure Land thinker Tanluan (476–542):

The “birth” to which Bodhisattva Vasubandhu aspires refers to being born through causal conditions. Hence it is provisionally termed “birth.” This does not mean that there are real beings or that being born and dying is real, as ordinary people imagine.

We see that from very early in the East Asian tradition, as well known in Japan, Pure Land thinkers applied the Mahayana logic of the nonduality and interpenetration of discriminative and nondiscriminative realms to Pure Land concepts.

Regarding the nature of Amida Buddha, perhaps the most natural approach for the modern mind is to focus on the relationship between Amida and Sakyamuni. While Amida, Buddha of infinite light and eternal life, may be regarded as the “celestial” personification of perfect wisdom-compassion, and the narrative of his attainment in the inconceivable past as “mythic,” Gotama, known by his honorific title Sakyamuni Buddha, is recognized as a historical figure, a mendicant wanderer and religious teacher of India in the fifth century BCE. It is common to say, therefore, that Sakyamuni belongs to the realm of historical fact and actual existence, while Amida is fictive. This view is supported by the modern understanding of the relationship between the two buddhas. Sakyamuni, having become the “awakened one” through meditative practices, taught his realization to others, and among the teachings attributed to him is the story of Amida Buddha. Although historical evidence now suggests that the teaching of Amida gradually emerged around the beginning of the common era—five centuries after Sakyamuni's death—even if it appeared later in the tradition stemming from Sakyamuni, the fundamental question of the relationship between Amida and the person(s) who first taught him remains unchanged. Amida Buddha has never appeared directly as a historical personage, and there are no teachings or words that can be attributed to him. Thus, it is common to view the story of Amida as a narrative fashioned by Sakyamuni (or a later figure) to express the content of his own religious insight. Since his awakening could not be conveyed directly, he resorted to the use of parables and myths, and the story of Amida is considered such a “skillful means” (hōben) or mythic device for teaching. In this view, Amida is a fiction whose origins lie in the experience of Sakyamuni. Further, it is often assumed that while unlettered Pure Land adherents may have clung to the notion of Amida and his vows as real, taking them as objects of faith, more sophisticated Buddhists such as those of the Tendai, Shingon, and Zen schools recognized all along that Amida is merely a skillful “metaphor” or “symbol” for the historical realization of Sakyamuni.

In fact, there is basic continuity in the perspective on Amida among the Mahayana schools, and it stands diametrically opposed to modernist assumptions. For Mahayana Buddhists, reality resides not fundamentally with the historical existence of Sakyamuni as such, but rather with that for which he is recognized as buddha, or that which is the motive-force for his appearance in the world, his attainment of buddhahood, and his teaching of dharma. Reality assumes form in order to emerge into the consciousness of sentient beings and thereby guide beings beyond the attachments and compulsions of their discriminative, reifying, conceptual grasp of their own existence and the things of the world around them.

This circular dynamic moving between formless reality and the world of forms may be seen with regard to the relationship between Sakaymuni and Amida in Hōnen's exposition. He states:

Concerning the central purport [of the Larger Sutra]: Sakyamuni discarded the supreme Pure Land and appeared in this defiled world; this was to expound the teaching of the Pure land and, by encouraging sentient beings, to bring them to birth in the Pure Land. Amida Tathagata discarded this defiled world and emerged in the Pure Land; this was to guide sentient beings of this defiled world and bring them to birth in the Pure Land. This is none other than the fundamental intent with which all buddhas go out to the Pure Land and emerge in the defiled world. (Muryōjukyō shaku in Kyōdō 1987, p. 67)

In Hōnen's view, Sakyamuni and Amida function as paired aspects of a movement of compassionate activity in teaching and guiding, out of true reality into the defiled world, and out from the defiled world into “the supreme Pure Land” that is the abode of all buddhas. We see here that Hōnen transforms the framework of historical sequence by beginning with Sakyamuni, even though Amida's attainment of buddhahood occurred aeons prior to Sakyamuni's appearance. Without Sakyamuni, Amida would remain unknown to beings in this world and his work of leading all to his buddha-field would go unapprehended; without Amida, Sakyamuni would have no effective means of liberating beings and his teaching mission would be futile. In place of a linear chronology, we have a motif of movement between the timeless and mundane time, by which the temporality of karmic causation and discriminative thinking is broken.

Shinran develops the reciprocity between Amida and Sakyamuni seen in Hōnen into an asymmetric relationship, and by thus giving priority to Amida, moves even further from a modern orientation that would emphasize the historical reality of Sakyamuni. For Shinran, it is the motive-force of wisdom-compassion that underlies the historical existence of Sakyamuni—that in fact made him buddha—and this wisdom-compassion is itself the life of Amida Buddha. Hence, Sakyamuni's historical existence may be understood as a manifestation of Amida, perhaps one among countless others.

This understanding may be seen in Shinran's demonstration that the Larger Sutra, among all the sutras, expresses the true teaching for which Sakyamuni appeared in the world. Shinran focuses on the pattern in the sutras by which, prior to expounding dharma, the Buddha enters a profound samadhi and delves to the nondiscriminative wisdom that transcends words and concepts. On emerging from the samadhi, he reemerges into the realm of words and responds to questions from his disciples. While his words are those of ordinary human discourse, they give expression to the samadhi he attained. Thus, the source of Sakyamuni's teaching is the samadhi he entered, the transcendent reality or wisdom itself.

At the beginning of the Larger Sutra, Sakyamuni's disciple Ānanda observes, from the splendor and serenity apparent in the Buddha's countenance, that the Buddha has entered the samadhi of great tranquility (Jp. daijakujō, in the Tang translation titled Sutra of the Tathagata of Immeasurable Life) and requests him to explain its significance. Sakyamuni proceeds to deliver the teaching of Amida Buddha. In other words, Sakyamuni has attained the reality that is the essential quality of all Buddhas—in a commentary on the Larger Sutra it is called the “place where all Buddhas abide”—and on this basis he reveals the story of Amida, for Amida is the primordial Buddha who embodies the essence of all Buddhas. From the perspective of this sutra, were it not for Amida, whose Buddhahood lies at the heart of the samadhi of great tranquility, Sakyamuni himself would not be Buddha. At the same time, were it not for Sakyamuni, the teaching of Amida would not be disclosed to the world.

Thus, the relationship between Amida and Sakyamuni is not that between two distinct figures, or between the religious symbol taught and the teacher. Rather, it is viewed in a broader framework of Amida's characteristic as standing both in formless reality and the world of forms, in the eternal and in history. Sakyamuni is not separate from Amida, and in teaching dharma he manifests the activity or movement towards beings that is Amida's essential quality.

It may be said that while meditative traditions in Buddhism tend to emphasize the elimination of delusional thinking and the apprehension of formless reality free of the imposition of egocentric discrimination, the Pure Land tradition is attentive to the compassionate working of reality to awaken beings incapable of eradicating conceptual thought. It does so by manifesting itself in forms and approaching beings. Late in life, Shinran adopted the term jinen, “naturalness” or “being made to become so of itself,” for the spontaneous working of reality in the liberative process by which beings of afflicting passions reach enlightenment. In this process, the Mahayana assertion that “samsara is none other than nirvana” or “afflicting passions are none other than awakening” is affirmed, so that the end of the Pure Land path lies in this world, in the compassionate working for the liberation of all beings.

In relation to beings of the world, Pure Land thinkers such as Shōkū and Shinran asserted that the real, as itself nondiscriminative and nondualistic wisdom or suchness, pervades all things. Since beings cannot attain such wisdom, reality as such cannot be grasped. Nevertheless, through that which is real that permeates their existence, all beings, including “grasses, trees, and the land itself,” hold the potential for awakening. Such terms as “emptiness” and “dependent origination” are sometimes understood in metaphysical terms, but in the context of Mahayana Buddhist tradition, they are not concepts by which to grasp reality, but above all elements of practice, expressing the realization of the person who enters into profound samadhi by cutting off discriminative thought and eradicating afflicting passions. Because the Pure Land path is not based on such praxis, the use of such terms is unnecessary.

4.2 Pure Land Buddhist Anthropology

For Hōnen and his followers, the characterization of “deep mind” (one of “three minds” or attitudes prescribed in the Contemplation Sutra) by the Chinese master Shandao (613–681) provides a classic expression of the understanding of human existence in the Pure Land path:

“Deep mind” is the deeply entrusting mind. There are two aspects. One is to believe deeply and decidedly that you are a foolish being of karmic evil caught in birth-and-death, ever sinking and ever wandering in transmigration from innumerable kalpas in the past, with never a condition that would lead to emancipation. The second is to believe deeply and decidedly that Amida Buddha's Forty-eight Vows grasp sentient beings, and that allowing yourself to be carried by the power of the Vow without any doubt or apprehension, you will attain birth. (Commentary on the Contemplation Sutra, quoted in Shinran CWS I: 85.)

Second [of the three minds] is deep mind, which is true and real shinjin. One truly knows oneself to be a foolish being full of blind passions, with scant roots of good, transmigrating in the three realms and unable to emerge from this burning house. And further, one truly knows now, without so much as a single thought of doubt, that Amida's universal Primal Vow decisively enables all to attain birth, including those who say the Name even down to ten times, or even but hear it. (Hymns of birth in the Pure Land, quoted in Shinran CWS I: 92)

Three points may be noted here. First, the self-awareness of the practitioner indicated by Shan-tao is that of a human being wholly incapable of fulfilling Buddhist practices. This is expressed in eschatological terms of endless entrapment in samsaric existence: one is burdened by the karmic consequences of evil acts of past lives extending from the immeasurable past; one continues to act from the desires and hatreds arising from ignorant self-attachment in the present; bereft as one is of any genuine goodness, one's future can only be further painful existence in endless transmigration.

The second point is that this self-awareness coexists with the realization that all beings are enabled to attain birth in the Pure Land through Amida's Vow. In other words, the self-reflection implied in deep mind is, in its opposite aspect, at the same time deep trust in the salvific power of Amida. The third point is that while human being and Buddha stand thus as thoroughgoing opposites—the being filled with afflicting passions and lacking any goodness that might lead toward enlightenment, on the one hand, and the Buddha freely exerting the power of wisdom-compassion, on the other—deep mind arises as a unitary awareness out of the interaction of being and Buddha. Self-reflection and trust arise simultaneously. Without the approach of Amida, not only trust, but also genuine self-awareness is unattainable.

Hōnen, who was renown in his period as a Tendai monk of extensive learning and exemplary practice, gives direct expression to the two aspects of “deep mind”:

Although Buddhism is vast, in essence it is composed of no more than the three learnings [of precepts, meditation, and wisdom.] … But as for precepts, I myself do not keep a single one. In meditation, I have not attained even one. In wisdom, I have not attained the right wisdom of cutting off discriminative thinking and realizing the fruit… . [Nevertheless,] without distinguishing between wise and foolish, the upholding of precepts and the breaking of them, Amida Buddha comes to welcome us. (Recorded in Tetsu senchaku hongan nembutsu shū, Jōdoshū zensho 7: 95–96)

It is in such self-awareness that we see the force behind Hōnen's radical reorientation of the understanding of praxis. Hōnen saw clearly that unless a wholly new perspective were established regarding the categorization and evaluation of the myriad practices taught in Buddhist tradition, the genuine meaning of the Pure Land path as he had come to understand it would remain obscure, and vocal nembutsu would continue to be viewed by all people as merely an expedient practice for inferior practitioners. He therefore raised the issue of the subjectivity of the practitioner, and insisted that commonsense hierarchies rooted in presuppositions of one's own fundamental perspicuity and autonomous capacity to judge had to be abandoned. To accomplish this shift, Hōnen relied on the thoroughgoing application of his innovative concept of “selection from among alternatives” (senchaku), which refers most centrally to Amida's own selection, for beings, of vocal nembutsu as the single, universally accessible practice that results in birth into the Pure Land. Beings' taking up of the Pure Land path is thus founded upon Amida's selection and fulfillment of the nembutsu for all beings equally. We see, therefore, that the dual awareness of “deep mind” is at the core of Hōnen's path.

Hōnen's methodical logic led to positions easily vilified by scholar-monks of the traditional schools. One example is his enumeration of “the awakening of aspiration for enlightenment” (hotsu bodaishin) among the traditional “practices” to be set aside by nembutsu practitioners. This “bodhi-mind”—the profound aspiration for enlightenment for oneself and all beings—had been taught to be the crucial starting point for the Mahayana bodhisattva, and other Japanese Pure Land masters such as Genshin had affirmed it to be the core of genuine desire for the Pure Land. Although Hōnen's position is somewhat ambiguous, in Senchakushū his steadfast logic leads understandably to a rejection of the notion that any attitude or attainment beyond trust and utterance is necessary for the person of nembutsu.

Hōnen's religious anthropology is perhaps the hallmark of his tradition, but his closest disciples sought to balance his rejection of self-power with the delineation of the working of Other Power in the practitioner. One of the harshest criticisms of Hōnen from the traditional schools came from Myōe (1173–1232), of the Kegon school. Myōe argued that awakening the bodhi-mind was not to be viewed as a specific practice within the path, but as the core of all authentic Mahayana praxis, which must be infused with the nondiscriminative wisdom that is also compassion. Thus, Hōnen's rejection of bodhi-mind was a departure from the fundamental truths of Mahayana Buddhism itself.

On a superficial level, the answer to Myōe was not difficult for Hōnen's followers. Disciples such as Shinran and Shōkū affirmed the role of the bodhi-mind in the Pure Land path by identifying it with trust in Amida's vow on the part of practitioners. Shinran, for example, distinguishes various types of bodhi-mind and identifies that of the true Pure Land path with his conception of shinjin. Shōkū similarly identifies the taking of refuge in the vow with bodhi-mind. Myōe's criticism, however, points to the underlying issue of the stark dualism of the unenlightened being and the enlightened Buddha in Hōnen's teaching. If there is no cause in beings leading to attainment, how can even trust in Amida's vow arise in them? If they have the ability to give rise to trust, can they not perform other practices also?

Hōnen's disciples again elaborate diverse conceptions of trust in Amida's vow, but at bottom there are two elements. That which is real (suchness, thusness, nondual reality, buddha-nature, etc.) pervades all beings; nevertheless, beings can come to awareness of it only in relation to Amida Buddha, which is manifested in trust in the vow. The question of the nature of the relation leads to the problem of hermeneutics.

4.3 Pure Land Buddhist Hermeneutics

Issues of hermeneutics are central to the Japanese Pure Land tradition because of the discontinuity it asserts between the ordinary awareness of beings and the enlightened wisdom-compassion of the Buddha, which is the source and ultimate content of the teaching. This is not, of course, a problem limited to the Pure Land tradition, but is taken up in Buddhist tradition from the time of Sakyamuni's earliest preaching. Nevertheless, the communication of the intent of the teaching raises special difficulties in Hōnen's Pure Land thought because of the thoroughly negative assessment of human capacities of comprehension undistorted by self-attachment. Authentic grasp of the teaching therefore requires both (1) the working of Buddhas—Amida, Sakyamuni, and the buddhas of the cosmos—to bridge the gap between beings' ignorance and dharma and to bring beings to apprehension of the vow, and (2) a shift or transformation of awareness in beings.

The narrative settings of the Pure Land teachings in the sutras were regarded as particularly significant in this regard. The Contemplation Sutra was especially important in Hōnen's interpretation of Amida's vow, and narratives in that sutra were understood to reveal both Sakyamuni's intent in expounding the Pure Land teaching and the proper stance for understanding it. According to the sutra, the circumstances for Sakyamuni's teaching of Amida and his Pure Land relate to the story of Prince Ajātaśatru, who, prompted by the Buddha's jealous cousin Devadatta, usurps the throne by murdering his father and imprisoning his mother Vaidehi. From her cell, Vaidehi beseeches the Buddha to teach her a way to be born in a world free of such treachery and turmoil. This leads to Sakyamuni's exposition of Amida's Pure Land.

In East Asian Pure Land tradition, this royal “tragedy of the capital of Rājagṛha,” where Sakyamuni often resided and preached, was understood to indicate that the Pure Land teaching was intended for ordinary, unenlightened beings in anguished circumstances, rather than for a capable spiritual elite. Shinran emphasizes the distance between this world and the realm of enlightenment by asserting that at the point in history when conditions were ripe for teaching and reception of the Pure Land path, the entire drama of regicide and betrayal was played out by incarnated bodhisattvas precisely to allow for the introduction of the Pure Land teaching. It is, therefore, the condition of self-reflection and repentance that allows for the reception of the Pure Land teaching. As we have seen, for the Pure Land tradition that Hōnen adopted from China, this motif is reiterated in the sutra narrative of the lowest grade of nembutsu practitioner, who has committed evil throughout his life but encounters the teaching through a good friend on his deathbed and simply utters Amida's name ten times.

In terms of reception, some among Hōnen's disciples further emphasized the action of Amida and Sakyamuni in guiding and actively bringing beings to trust in the vow. While the Chinzei branch of Hōnen's Pure Land school sought to temper the master's sweeping rejection of other practices by recognizing the possibility of attaining birth through the various meditative and nonmeditative practices set forth in the Contemplation Sutra, Shōkū and his Seizan branch taught that the intent of the sutra is precisely to lead people to awareness that birth is possible only through the nembutsu. In the latter view, the various contemplative exercises and the disciplines and study taught by the sutra are meant to reveal the wisdom-compassion of the vow, which grasps all beings without discrimination, whatever their capacity. Since in the sutra beings attain birth regardless of their particular level or kind of practice, it is not that those practices are being prescribed; rather, the sutra intends to show that the actual cause of birth lies not in any such practices, but solely in Amida's vow. In other words, the sutra teachings are not to be taken literally, but as means to awaken beings so that they entrust themselves to the vow.

In Shinran, the activity of the vow is more direct, for he asserts that shinjin in beings is itself the mind of Amida and that Amida gives his mind to beings. Thus, for example, Shinran interprets the nembutsu to be not the invocation of the Buddha by beings but rather the Buddha's call to beings in order to awaken them. Shōkū makes a similar claim, asserting that when a person takes refuge in Amida's vow, then the Buddha, who is the embodiment of perfect practice performed out of the desire to save all beings, enters and becomes one with the person's aspiration. This oneness manifests itself as the nembutsu. We see in such thinkers that genuine engagement with the teaching is not primarily intellectual understanding or simple assent, but a transformative encounter in which the dualism of the person's samsaric existence and Amida's wisdom-compassion is transcendent.

4.4 Pure Land Buddhist Ethical Reflection

The disciples of Hōnen who pursued the teaching that birth in the Pure Land became settled with a single utterance in trust explored the reasons this should be so and also its consequences for ongoing life in the present. As we have seen, Hōnen taught that the vocal nembutsu was qualitatively distinct from all other practices, being effective as practice because it has been fulfilled by Amida and given to beings. Precisely how it was given remained an issue. For disciples like Shōkō, the nembutsu was determined by Amida but retained its quality as practice in that it was to be repeated by a person throughout life, even though a single utterance was taught to be sufficient. Thinkers like Shinran and Shōkū, however, both understood the utterance of nembutsu to be fulfilled practice because it arises from the oneness of being and Buddha expressed as shinjin or taking refuge. Further, because of this oneness, a person's attainment of birth in the Pure Land is completely settled in the immediate present.

The effects of the oneness are manifested not only in the occurrence of birth in the Pure Land at death, but also in various ways in present life. Shōkū speaks of a variety of benefits received in the present by the person of the nembutsu, including the elimination of the effects of past evil acts, extension of life, avoidance of various calamities, protection of buddhas, seeing of Amida, and so on. One should not pursue such benefits for their own sake, but they naturally come about for the person of the nembutsu whose birth in the Pure Land is settled. Thus, to express the condition of the nembutsu practitioner, Shōkū even distinguishes two types of Pure Land “birth,” “immediate birth” (sokuben ōjō) while remaining burdened with afflicting passions in present life and birth into the Pure Land at the time of death (tōtoku ōjō).

Shōkū's thinking about ethical life reflects the same elements seen in relation to benefits in this life: the person continues to act out of ignorance and self-attachment, but conduct manifesting oneness with Amida Buddha may also emerge spontaneously. He speaks, for example, of the elimination of the effects of past evil acts through repentance (zange metsuzai). He distinguishes, however, between two kinds or stages of repentance, that which is deliberately undertaken at particular times through ones own powers of self-reflection and contrition, but which is difficult to achieve (gyōmon no zange), and that which arises spontaneously and immediately as the working of the vow (kanmon no zange). As seen here, ethical behavior is not prescribed and undertaken as another form of praxis, but Other Power may function of itself in the life of the nembutsu practitioner to suppress evil and manifest compassion action.

Such thinking may also be seen in Shinran, who includes, in his list of ten benefits obtained by the nembutsu practitioner in the present, “constantly enacting great compassion.” In letters, he states:

Those who feel that their own birth is completely settled should, mindful of the Buddha's benevolence, hold the nembutsu in their hearts and say it to respond in gratitude to that benevolence, with the wish, “May there be peace in the world, and may the Buddha's teaching spread!”. (Shinran CWS I: 560)

In the face of the persecution of the nembutsu by local authorities, he advises his disciples:

The people who are trying to obstruct the nembutsu are the manor lords, bailiffs, and landowners in the local areas … . practicers of the nembutsu should act with compassion for those who commit such obstruction, feel pity for them, and earnestly say the nembutsu, thereby helping those who seek to hinder them. (Shinran CWS I: 563–564)

For Shinran, the working of Other Power is precisely the falling away of one's own calculative thinking, seeking religious or worldly advantage through one's own capacities. Thus, where self-power has been “overturned,” acts spontaneously possessed of compassion arise unprescribed and undeliberated.

For both Shōkū and Shinran, the life of the nembutsu practitioner is informed by a transformed temporality. This is especially clear in Shinran, who adopts the distinction of two dimensions or phases of Amida's activity—that for beings' birth in the Pure Land (ōsō ekō) and that for their immediate return from the Pure Land to this world in order to work for the liberation of all beings (gensō ekō). The ethical ideal of genuinely compassionate action—action that leads others to liberation from ignorance—exists in the present for the nembutsu practitioner as a goal one looks forward to in the future, beyond all falsification by self-attachments. It is the teleological fulfillment of human existence that unfolds only by Other Power. At the same time, that goal, as the content of birth in the Pure Land that is already settled in the present, pervades present existence, interfused with the karmic burden of the samsaric past. What is authentically known of such a self by the nembutsu practitioner, according to both Shōkū and Shinran, is the repentance that is also Amida's wisdom-compassion.


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