Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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James Ward

First published Sat Jul 18, 2009

British idealism was the dominant philosophical movement in the closing decades of the nineteenth century. Its best-known representatives—philosophers of the like of Thomas Hill Green and Francis Herbert Bradley—held a version of Absolute idealism, the theory that reality is a single unified consciousness or cosmic experience. The doctrine has its roots in the philosophies of Spinoza, Kant and Hegel, but the British idealists elaborated it in independent, original ways. In this, they were motivated by a desire to oppose materialism and vindicate our instinctive belief that human life has a meaning. As Bradley forcefully put it in his Logic, “that the glory of this world in the end is appearance leaves the world more glorious, if we feel it is a show of some fuller splendor; but the sensuous curtain is a deception and a cheat, if it hides some colourless movement of atoms […]” (Bradley 1883: 590).

It is easy to see, however, how Absolute idealism threatens those very ideals it is supposed to defend, since it denies that finite existence is truly real and downgrades it to ‘a show of some fuller splendor.’ If reality is a single unified totality, what is the individual self? If the past, the present and the future are not real for the Absolute, wherein lays our freedom? If reality is eternally perfect, what is the point of our moral struggles? The philosophy of the Cambridge Professor James Ward (1843–1925)—now a largely forgotten figure but once a very respected thinker—is an attempt at overcoming these difficulties by combining the idealistic standpoint with a pluralistic metaphysics.

1. Life

James Ward was born in Hull, Yorkshire, on 27th January 1843, as a son of James Ward, senior, a merchant with some scientific and philosophical ambition (in a book entitled God, Man and the Bible, he tried to give a scientific explanation of the Flood). His father's enterprises were disastrous, however, so that lack of resources was to be a constant source of anxiety for the family, which included an uneducated, hard-working, deeply religious mother, six sisters and a brother (another son died).

After one of his father's bankruptcies, Ward remained for two years without schooling and occupation. At the age of thirteen and a half, the boy was let free to occupy his time as he wished. In the small country town where his family had moved, Waterloo near Liverpool, he developed a spirit of solitude and a love of nature. A ‘Memoir’ written by the philosopher's daughter, Olwen Ward Campbell, enables us to get a glimpse of his life in these early years: “Waterloo was only a village in those days, and wild stretches of sandhills lay beyond it for many miles. Here he used to wander for hours on end, alone with his thoughts and the sea birds” (1927: 7).

In addition to the family's economic difficulties, Ward's youth was shaped by the narrow Calvinistic faith in which he was raised. In 1863 he entered Spring Hill College (later incorporated in Mansfield College, Oxford) with the aim of becoming a minister, but became increasingly skeptical of the doctrines he was expected to preach. In the middle of his religious crisis, Ward moved to Germany for a temporary period of study. In Göttingen, he attended lectures by one of the most influential philosophers of the time, Rudolf Hermann Lotze. It is probably from Lotze that Ward gained a first substantial appreciation of the philosophy of Leibniz, whose theory of monads was later to provide the basis of his own metaphysics.

Upon returning to England, Ward made a sincere yet vain attempt to retain his faith and accepted a pastorate in Cambridge. His spiritual crisis reached its climax and the point of no return in 1872, when he definitively abandoned the project of becoming a minister and applied as a non-collegiate student at Cambridge. One year later, he won a scholarship in Moral Science at Trinity College.

Important lessons were learned in the anguish of these vicissitudes and deliberations. In a letter to a friend, Ward writes: “I am coming to see more clearly every day that man is only half free, or rather that his freedom is not what I once thought it. It is not the power to choose anything, but only the power to choose between alternatives offered, and what these shall be circumstances determine quite as will” (59). Surely, this insight owes more to the struggle of existence than to abstract speculation. Interestingly, Ward's mature philosophy comprises a defense of human freedom and sustains the idea that—independently of circumstances outside of our control—we always retain a capacity for responsible action.

Ward made the best out of the difficult challenge of beginning a new life at the age of thirty. In 1874 he obtained a first in his Tripos; one year later, he won a fellowship with a dissertation entitled ‘The Relation of Physiology to Psychology,’ part of which was published in the first issue of Mind in 1876. These successes marked the beginning of a distinguished career. He first became known for his article on ‘Psychology’ (1886) in the Encyclopaedia Britannica, in which he criticised Mill and Bain's associationism, and in the years 1896–98 he delivered the prestigious Gifford Lectures, later published under the title Naturalism and Agnosticism (1899). In this book, Ward attacked the various forms of scientific materialism that were current in the second half of the nineteenth century. The lectures were well received by his contemporaries and there was a widespread agreement that Ward had been effective in his refutation. According to Alfred Edward Taylor, who reviewed the book in Mind in 1900, “one may assert without much fear of contradiction that Prof. Ward's Gifford Lectures are the philosophical book of the last year” (Taylor 1900: 244).

G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell were among Ward's students at Cambridge, where he had been elected to the new Chair of Mental Philosophy and Logic in 1897. Moore has left a vivid testimony of his personality and teaching style; as he recalls,

We sat around a table in his rooms at Trinity, and Ward had a large notebook open on the table before him. But he did not read his lectures; he talked; and, while he talked, he was obviously thinking hard about the subject he was talking of and searching for the best way of putting what he wanted to convey. (Moore 1942: 17)

Moore describes Ward as a melancholy personality, overwhelmed by the difficulties of philosophical thinking—‘Das Denken ist schwer’ was one of his favorite sayings. (16) And while Moore was also impressed by Ward's ‘extreme sincerity and conscientiousness’ (18), Russell singles him out as one for whom he had a ‘great personal affection’ (Russell 1946: 10).

Ward's reputation as a philosopher must have been very high, for he was invited to deliver a second series of Gifford Lectures. These were held in the years 1907–1910 and published in 1911 as The Realm of Ends or Pluralism and Theism; it is in this book that he provides the most complete exposition of his idealistic metaphysics.

2. Metaphysics

Ward reached his metaphysics—a theory of interacting monads—by way of criticism of the two main philosophical tendencies of his day, scientific materialism and ‘absolute’ (or ‘monistic’) idealism. The critique of materialism is developed at considerable length in the first series of Gifford Lectures, Naturalism and Agnosticism. Ward observes here that the view of reality as a system of inert material particles subject to strict deterministic laws cannot explain the world's contingency, a fundamental aspect of experienced reality that needs to be taken at face value. Moreover, materialism fails to provide an adequate ontology for biology, for it cannot explain the emergence of life from lifeless matter. The doctrine is also inconsistent with the latest development of physics, which is moving away from the seventeenth-century, Democritean conception of the atom as an inert particle—a microscopic, indivisible ‘thing.’

Ward's overall conclusion is that materialism is so beset with difficulties that the real question is not whether it is true, but why it has come to be believed in the first place. Ward traces the origin of this doctrine in a tendency to confound abstractions with concrete realities. At the beginning of inquiry, the scientist is faced with a concrete whole of experience, but takes notice only of some aspects of it. This is wholly justified, but errors are likely to be committed if he overlooks the richness of the empirical basis from which his notions are derived. He is then apt to “confound his descriptive apparatus with the actual phenomena it is devised to describe” (1899: Vol. 1, 81). Materialism is the metaphysics of the scientist lacking understanding of his own procedure.

These reflections led Ward to the idealistic conclusion that reality must be interpreted ‘in terms of Mind.’ Absolute idealism—the then widespread view that reality is a cosmic consciousness or single ‘Experience’—will not do, for Ward regards it as explanatorily vacuous. The theory that the world of finite things is but the ‘appearance’ of the One does nothing to make the nature of the world more intelligible. Why does the One appear in the way it does? And why does it have to appear at all? These questions find no answer in the works of great monistic thinkers such as Spinoza and Hegel, nor do their British followers do any better in this respect. Ward substantiates this claim with a quotation from Bradley's Appearance and Reality (1893), where he admits that the ‘fact of fragmentariness,’ that is, why the One appears in the form of a multiplicity, cannot be explained.

The upshot of these two parallel lines of arguments—the critique of materialism and Absolute idealism—is that some form of pluralistic idealism must be true. And it is only natural at this point to turn to Leibniz, and especially so for a thinker so well acquainted with German philosophy. According to Ward, however, Leibniz's metaphysics needs to be amended in one fundamental respect:

…the well-known Monadology of Leibniz may be taken as the type, to which all modern attempts to construct a pluralistic philosophy more or less conform. But the theology on which Leibniz from the outset strove to found his Monadology, is, in the first instance at all events, set aside; and in particular his famous doctrine of pre-established harmony is rejected altogether. (1911: 53–54)

Ward's main crux is that pre-established harmony fails to leave any room open for contingency and genuine novelties. In Leibniz's system, evolution can only be interpreted as ‘preformation,’ the gradual unfolding of what in a compressed form is already present at the beginning. This is inconsistent with a correct understanding of evolution, which involves ‘epigenesis’—the coming into being of unexpected facts.

Interestingly, the same criticism is advanced against philosophies such as Hegel's that conceives of natural history as the ‘externalization’ of a primordial ‘Idea.’ Ward notices, however, that Hegel's description of nature—as ‘a bacchantic God’ (148), and as providing ‘the spectacle of a contingency that runs out into endless detail’ (139)—is insightful and wholly in line with his own; indeed, he goes so far as to say that ‘there is a strong undercurrent of [Leibnizian] pluralism running through the whole of Hegel's philosophy.’ (159)

Part of Leibniz's motivation for holding to pre-established harmony was the alleged impossibility of making sense of transeunt causation—that is, causation understood as a direct relation between distinct monads (as opposed to immanent causation, which holds between successive stages of a monad's life). If direct interaction is impossible, how to account for the correlations between things except by assuming that it had been established by a supreme Architect? In the hands of Leibniz, this surprising view as to the nature of causation becomes the foundation of an original proof of God's existence.

Ward attacks Leibniz's reasoning at its very basis. Causal interaction was understood by Leibniz in terms of the doctrine of physical influx. On that model, direct causal interaction is rejected because properties cannot exist unless as inhering in substances; in passing from one substance to another, however, the communicated property would have to exist in a detached condition, which seems absurd. Could this simple piece of reasoning suffice to reject what we seem to experience all the time, namely our power to act directly upon external realities and to be immediately affected by them? In his answer to Leibniz, Ward remarks that the theory of physical influx categorizes the terms of a causal relation as substances to which qualities inhere; on this theory, even the monads are therefore conceived as if they were things. This involves a special sort of category-mistake: ‘Monads’—Ward says—“are conative, that is are feeling and striving subjects or persons in the widest sense, not inert particles or things” (260).

In other words, since monads are not ‘things’ but ‘subjects,’ the argument against direct monadic interaction is blatantly invalid. As Ward puts it: “If the Leibnizian assumption, that there are no beings devoid of perception and spontaneity… is otherwise sound, then the objections to transeunt action between things become irrelevant” (219). Hence, in a polemical reversion of Leibniz's famous metaphor, he concludes that ‘all monads have windows’ (260).

3. Natural Philosophy

If pre-established harmony fails to account for the world's contingency, it must be asked whether Ward's theory of interacting monads can explain nature's order and regularity. The element of contingency that pervades the world is immediately accounted for by the assumption that the ultimate constituents of reality are ‘living’ subjects, but how do orderly processes emerge? Ward formulates this question as follows: “Can we conceive such an interaction of spontaneous agents…, taking on the appearance of mechanism?” (1927: 239).

The solution consists in interpreting nature after a social analogy. The following thought-experiment illustrates the idea: “Let us imagine a great multitude of human beings, varying in tastes and endowments as widely as human beings are known to do, and let us suppose this multitude suddenly to find themselves, as Adam and Eve did, in an ample Paradise enriched sufficiently with diverse natural resources to make the attainment of high civilization possible” (1911: 54). It is obvious to Ward that such individuals would gradually achieve a hierarchical, specialized form of social organization. To a hypothetical external observer, the initial phases of the new life of the selected individuals will appear utterly chaotic, but in due course order and regularity would emerge: “…in place of an incoherent multitude, all seemingly acting at random, we should have a social and economic organization, every member of which had his appropriate place and function” (55–56).

It is after this fashion that nature should be understood. Consider an apparently inert object such as a piece of rock. This is not an aggregate of material atoms, but a society of active subjects. Starting out from a state of mutual isolation, Ward speculates, a plurality of monads might end up finding a satisfactory modus vivendi. These monads might then continue to stick together—either because they are unwilling to break out of the social structures in which they are embedded, or because they have become unable to do so. To clarify this concept, Ward appeals to an ingenious simile:

…as there are some individuals who are restless, enterprising and inventing to the end of their days, so there are others who early become supine and contented, the slaves of custom and let well alone. The simpler their standard of well-being and the less differentiated their environment the more monotonous their behavior will be and the more inert they will appear. (60)

Thus, monads might get imprisoned within a form of life in the same way in which persons might get imprisoned in their habits. While the more energetic monads will try to escape routine, other will acquiesce in it. It is the passivity and repetitiveness of the monad's behavior that generates ‘the appearance of mechanism.’

In spite of the rejection of pre-established harmony, this conception still owes much to Leibniz's teaching. On Ward's view, the physical objects apprehended in ordinary experience are the appearance to us of a structured conglomerate, or societal whole, of living subjects (1927: 239). Such appearances are not illusions. Our immediate sensations fail to reproduce the object's real internal constitution, yet they do point toward realities actually existing independently of the perceiving subject. Ward's metaphysical idealism thus comes with a form of epistemological realism, while his conception of every-day physical objects is virtually identical with Leibniz's notion of phenomena bene fundata. Stated in Kantian terminology, physical objects are the appearances to us of things whose noumenal being or intrinsic nature is mental or experiential. According to Ward (1911: 392), Kant too was forcefully drawn to this position, even in his critical phase and in spite of his notorious claim that noumena lie outside the categories of the understanding and sensible intuition.

Ward's social account of the natural world provides the foundation for an original account of natural laws that he conceived of as statistical, evolved and transient. In the first place, in a universe that is ultimately social, natural laws must be of the like of economic or anthropological laws; as such, they hold for groups of monads rather than for individual ones and are statistical generalizations rather than eternally fixed decrees. Secondly, natural laws are to be regarded as the products of evolution because they record the habitual behavior of groups of socialized monads, and habits have to be acquired or ‘learned’ over time. Thirdly, it is a historical platitude that societies emerge and decay. Since the natural laws dominating a given epoch depend upon that epoch's social order, natural laws cannot be regarded as immutable; like all finite realities, they too are likely to change in the course of cosmic history.

Another notable Cambridge thinker and Leibnizian scholar, Charles Dunbar Broad, nicely summarized Ward's conception with the following words:

…it seems quite impossible to explain the higher types of mental fact materialistically, whilst it does not seem impossible to regard physical and chemical laws as statistical uniformities about very large collections of very stupid minds. (Broad 1975: 169)

Ward's account might be profitably compared with a similar one provided by Charles Sanders Peirce in his important essay of 1891, ‘The Architecture of Theories.’ Here, Peirce advocates the view that “the only intelligible theory of the universe is that of objective idealism, that matter is effete mind, inveterate habits becoming physical laws” (153). Furthermore, he contends that “the only possible way of accounting for the laws of nature and for uniformity in general is to suppose them results of evolution. This supposes them not to be absolute, not to be obeyed precisely. It makes an element of indeterminacy, spontaneity, or absolute chance in nature” (148).

Despite the analogies, a major point of controversy is represented by Peirce's tychism—the doctrine hinted at in the just quoted passage that ‘absolute chance’ (tyche) is of the essence of the universe. The disagreement is not as to whether there is a level of reality that escapes external determination—a striking anticipation of Heisenberg's indeterminacy principle that both Peirce and Ward endorse. The question is as to how that most fundamental level is to be understood. In a passage that can only be interpreted as a reply to Peirce, Ward writes:

Some pluralists, very ill advisedly as I think, have identified this element [contingency, what is unpredictable in the world] with pure chance and even proposed to elevate it to the place of a guiding principle under the title of ‘tychism’ […] But every act of a conative agent is determined by—what may, in a wide sense, be called—a motive, and motivation is incompatible with chance, though in the concrete it be not reducible to law. (1911: 76)

This critique rests upon the argument that—since monads are ‘subjects’ in the full sense of the term—they cannot act at random; specifically, monads act either in order to secure self-preservation or to achieve self-realization. This doctrine is phenomenologically well-grounded. Our own psychic life provides us with an immediate grasp of the inner life of a monadic creature, and it is clear to Ward that we do experience ourselves as motivated in this way.

In sum, for Ward it is the ‘teleological’ that grounds the ‘mechanical.’ A monad always aims at self-preservation and self-realization; this is the simplest way in which the monad's conatus—or will to live—manifests itself. At the same time, self-preservation and self-realization are two fundamental metaphysical parameters, the defining features of each monad's ‘character.’ If the need for self-preservation predominates, the monad will acquiesce in its acquired status. These are Broad's ‘stupid minds’ and represents the conservative elements in nature. Per contra, ‘intelligent’ monads actively seek self-realization. Their importance in the cosmic scheme cannot be underestimated; eventually, it is their craving for novelties that powers evolution and prevents history from coming to a halt.

4. Philosophy of Mind

Ward's theory of monads is a radical form of panpsychism; on this view, experience is not solely ubiquitous—it is all there truly his. In the last decades of the nineteenth century, the debate on panpsychism was launched by the publication in 1878 of William Kingdon Clifford's ‘On the Nature of Things-in-Themselves.’ This essay was perfectly attuned to the Zeitgeist, since it linked panpsychism with evolutionary theory. Clifford appeals to the non-emerge argument: the transition from inert matter to conscious beings would be unintelligible, a kind of unfathomable creatio ex nihilo; hence, we are forced to conclude that ‘experience’ is an intrinsic, aboriginal feature of matter.

Ward apparently agrees with the general drift of this argument. In an essay significantly entitled ‘Mechanism and Morals,’ he explains that one need not fear the theory of evolution; this does not degrade either consciousness or human life, but leads to a spiritualized view of matter:

It is interesting… to notice that in the support which it lends to pampsychist [sic] views the theory of evolution seems likely to have an effect on science the precise opposite of that which it exercised at first. That was a leveling down, this will be a leveling up. At first it appeared as if man were only to be linked with the ape, now it would seem that the atom, if reality at all, may be linked with man. (1927: 247)

Ward's endorsement of Clifford's evolutionary argument, however, points towards a tension in his philosophy. If evolution means ‘epigenesis’—the coming into being of what was not potentially present at the beginning—it is not clear why Ward should be worried by the generation of mind out of matter. Conscious existence might well be one of the novelties evolution is capable of producing.

Ward does, at any rate, vehemently reject Clifford's specific version of panpsychism. Clifford speculated that each atom of matter was associated with a quantum of experience, a small piece of ‘mind-stuff.’ This piece of ‘mind-stuff’ was conceived as an atom of experience, amounting to something less than a complete thought or feeling. Clifford also held that thoughts and feelings could be constituted simply by way of combination. “When molecules are so combined as to form the brain and nervous system of a vertebrate,” he wrote, “the corresponding elements of mind-stuff are so combined as to form some kind of consciousness.” Analogously, “when matter takes the complex form of a living human brain, the corresponding mind-stuff takes the form of a human consciousness, having intelligence and volition” (65). In this way, Clifford believed, it would be possible to explain why the genesis of complex material structures in the course of evolution is accompanied by the parallel emergence of higher forms of sentience and mental activity.

The theory is best regarded as a form of psycho-physical parallelism; this is, at all events, how Ward interprets it in Naturalism and Agnosticism, just before subjecting ‘Clifford's wild speculations concerning mind-stuff’ (1899: Vol. 2, 12) to a devastating critique.

Ward's criticizes Clifford's theory on three main accounts. (1) In the first place, the whole theory presupposes a point-to-point correspondence between matter and mind. Clifford's conception of an atom, however, is obsolete: ‘if the speculations of Lord Kelvin and others are to be accepted, and the prime atom itself is a state of motion in a primitive homogeneous medium [the ether], what is the mental equivalent of this primordial medium?’ (114) In other words, Clifford's theory couples material atoms with simple ideas. But if the atom is not a simple particle but a state of an underlying substance, it is not so easy to see what precisely in our consciousness could correspond to it.

(2) Secondly, Clifford's views—‘a maze of psychological barbarism’ (15)—totally misrepresent the nature of human consciousness. It is inconceivable how there could be experiences apart from subjects of experiences or larger wholes of consciousness, such as the smallest pieces of mind-dust will have to be: “Nobody bent on psychological precision would speak of ideas as either conscious or intelligent, but still less would he speak of ideas existing in isolation apart from, and prior to, a consciousness and intelligence” (15–16). Clifford fails to recognize the fundamental psychological fact of the unity of consciousness; the psychical field is not made up of simple sensations in the way in which a mosaic-picture is made up of little stones.

(3) Lastly, the mind-dust theory faces its own problem of emergence. Why should the transition from inert matter to consciousness be regarded as more mysterious than the transition from little pieces of consciousness to the single, unified consciousness of a human being? “Allowing that it [mind-dust] is not mind, he [Clifford] makes no attempt to show how from such dust a living mind could ever spring” (15). Thus, Clifford's theory has no explanatory advantage over competitor accounts of the mind-body relation; there is still a ‘gap’ that needs to be closed.

One easily sees that Ward's theory of monads does not face any of these difficulties. (1) The correlation between the psychical and the physical is not a one-to-one correspondence between discrete physical atoms and discrete psychical atoms, but is explained in terms of a Leibnizian theory of ‘confused perception.’ (2) There are no ‘subjectless’ experiences, but all experienced contents are ‘owned’ by the monads, each of which is a genuine unity containing distinct perceptual contents—Leibniz's ‘petites perceptions’ (1911: 256), but is not literally ‘made up’ by them. The relationship between the mind and the monads in the body, Ward also remarks in this connection (196), is not that of a whole to its parts but that of a dominant to its subordinate monads. (3) And lastly, there are no mysterious transitions in Ward's theory. The growth of the mind—from the inchoate experiences of infants to the relatively sophisticated experiences of adult human beings—shows that ‘lower’ states are superseded by ‘higher’ ones thanks to intersubjective, social intercourse.

Hence, Ward sums up his discussion by claiming the superiority of a Leibnizian approach over Clifford's mind-stuff theory:

Had he [Clifford] followed Leibniz instead, he could have speculated as to simple minds to his heart's content, but would never have imagined that absurdity, ‘a piece of mind-stuff,’ to which his fearless and logical interpretation of atomistic psychology had led him; he would never have imagined that … mind … could be described in terms that have a meaning only when applied to the complexity of material structure. (1899: Vol. 2, 16)

Nevertheless, Ward's theory does leave several questions open. In the first place, if our conscious apprehension of the external world is mediated by our direct apprehension of the monads constituting the body and more specifically the brain—as Ward contends (1911: 257–258)—why are we not aware of our neurons? Secondly, Ward's theory escapes the composition-problem, but this is now replaced by the problem of monadic interaction. How does the dominant monad influence the lower ones and rule over them? Thirdly, there is a question as to the nature of space. Granted that direct monadic interaction is real, where does it occur? Interaction would seem to require a common dimension or medium in order to be possible at all; what kind of dimension could host spiritual beings such as the monads are supposed to be?

Disappointingly enough, on all these crucial issues Ward has nothing to say. In the absence of a satisfactory treatment of these topics, however, his theory becomes intrinsically unstable, as further reflection might show that the positions just reached will have to be abandoned.

5. Natural Theology

As in the rest of his philosophy, evolutionary theory also looms large in Ward's natural theology. The existence of God, Ward frankly recognizes, cannot be proved. However, a theory of interacting monads cannot guarantee that the universe will keep moving towards a state of increasing harmony and cohesion: “without such a spiritual continuity as theism alone seems able to ensure,” Ward remarks, “it looks as if a pluralistic world were condemned to a Sisyphean task” (215). At the same time, the worldly monads need the leadership of a supreme agent if harmony has to be widespread across the entire universe. Accordingly, Ward's main problem is to understand how God can be related to the world of monads and guide them towards the realization of societies of ever increasing perfections.

It is clear to Ward that there must be an ontological gap between God and the monads. God cannot be a primus inter pares—only a monad among other monads (as Leibniz's language sometimes suggests). Since God is the world's ratio essendi—its ontological foundation, rather than its creator in time—He must be regarded as altogether transcendent. At the same time, since God has to lure the evolutionary process, He cannot merely maintain the world in existence, but must somehow actively enter into it; His relation to the world must therefore involve an aspect of immanence. This gives rise to a dilemma: how could God be both immanent and transcendent? Ward can do no better than to provide an analogy in which God is compared with a Cosmic Artist:

We may discern perhaps a faint and distant analogy… in what we are wont to style the creations of genius… the immortal works of art, the things of beauty that are a joy forever, we regard as… the spontaneous output of productive imagination, of a free spirit that embodies itself in its work, lives in it and loves it. (238–239)

Needless to say, this analogy is too ‘faint and distant’ to be of any real help.

Ward strikes an original note in his attempt to accommodate the reality of God with epigenesis. Since he believes that novelties could only be generated by the interplay of genuinely free agents, he conceives of God as limiting himself in the exercise of his power, so as to let the monads free: “Unless creators are created,” he says, “nothing is really created” (437). Having renounced omnipotence, God cannot have knowledge of a future he does not control anymore. This means that the notion of divine omniscience—which in the case of Leibniz takes the form of the doctrine of complete concepts—must be abandoned. God lacks knowledge of future contingents; nevertheless, he is aware of all the possibilities open to a monad at any moment, so that the future will never come to him as unexpected: “God, who knows both tendencies and possibilities completely, is beyond surprise and his purpose beyond frustration” (479). Clearly, such a God cannot be the perfect, immutable God of Leibniz and of classical theism, but is a developing God whose knowledge of the world increases with the unfolding of cosmic history. How does such a God lure the world towards greater perfection? This question too is left unanswered; always candid, Ward acknowledges that God's “modus operandi…is to us inscrutable” (479).

6. Legacy

Ward's metaphysics has had very little impact upon later Anglo-American philosophy, but it was not without influence in the Cambridge philosophical world in the first two or three decades of the twentieth century. Bertrand Russell explicitly recognizes his indebtedness to his teacher in his scholarly study of 1900, A Critical Examination of the Philosophy of Leibniz. Although he complained that Ward's philosophy was ‘dull and antiquate’ in a letter to Ottoline Morrell (Griffin 1991: 39), it is arguable that the influence run deeper, as Russell cultivated an interest in those questions at the verge between natural philosophy, philosophy of mind and metaphysics that so much mattered to Ward. This becomes clear as soon as one considers that he is not solely the celebrated author of ‘On Denoting’ (1905) and The Principles of Mathematics (1903), but also of The Analysis of Mind (1921) and The Analysis of Matter (1927).

Other Cambridge thinkers that might have been influenced by Ward are John Ellis McTaggart, C. D. Broad, and Alfred North Whitehead. In The Nature of Existence (1921/1927) McTaggart developed a system of idealistic metaphysics that bears some resemblance with Leibniz's theory of monads. Broad says in his ‘Autobiography’ (1959) that his idealist professor had ‘little influence’ on his thought (50), yet he favorably (and acutely) reviewed Ward's The Realm of Ends and devoted an important study to Leibniz's philosophy. Arguably, the greatest ascertained influence was exerted on Alfred North Whitehead; the system of metaphysics that he exposed in Process and Reality (1929) incorporates all the crucial ideas of Ward's philosophy of nature, while his conception of the God-World relationship is a way of bringing to completion Ward's fragmentary account. (Basile 2009: 61–62, 142–43) One might reasonably expect that, outside of Cambridge, his philosophy should have been taken into serious consideration by thinkers with an interest in Naturphilosophie, and especially so by a philosopher usually referred to as an ‘idealist’ such as Robin G. Collingwood, but there seems to be no documentary evidence of this. American process philosopher and theologian Charles Hartshorne, whose speculative system approximates to Whitehead's, displays in print knowledge of Ward's works. (1963: 19)

Ward's philosophy is little known today and scholarly discussions of his thought are scanty. In the widely read A Hundred Years of Philosophy, John Passmore compares it unfavourably with McTaggart's: “In McTaggart's case, the difficulty is to give a summary account of a highly intricate pattern of argument; in Ward's case, to decide what he really meant to say on the issues of central philosophical importance” (82). In an age in love with logical technicalities, this is like putting a heavy stone on the philosopher's grave.

Passmore's judgment is not entirely justified; the essentials of Ward's philosophical credo are clear enough. The reasons for the oblivion in which his thought has fallen are historical and have much to do with a general shift of philosophical concerns, as he belonged to a philosophical world that was swept away as a whole by the mounting tide of linguistic philosophy—a world in which other towering figures were, just to mention a few names, forgotten but truly exceptional personalities like Francis Herbert Bradley, Bernard Bosanquet, Samuel Alexander, and George Santayana. It is not a sheer accident that Ward's chair was inherited by Moore, and then by Wittgenstein. Nevertheless, it would be a mistake to regard his philosophy as little more than a relic from the past. The question concerning the mind's place in nature is still at very centre of philosophical debate; panpsychism has been recently recognized as a hypothesis worth contemplating by acclaimed philosophers such as Nagel (1979) and Chalmers (1996); more surprisingly perhaps, the idea that the riddle of the universe might be solved by a theory of interacting monads has resurfaced in recent ‘revisionary’ work by Galen Strawson (2006: 274).

At a deeper level, Ward's thought is admirable for his sincere attachment to the ideal of philosophical speculation as a non-dogmatic source of orientation. His belief in the creative powers and ‘freedom’ of the monad—which he defended from Peircian tychism, scientistic determinism and traditional theism—implicitly grounds an ethics of responsibility, while his evolutionary theism (a form of meliorism, rather than of optimism) inspires a confident yet not naive attitude towards life and its challenges. Surely, Ward's own vicissitudes—from debilitating poverty to public recognition as Cambridge Professor of Mental Philosophy—are reflected in his grand vision of reality as comprising an indefinite number of conative subjects obstinately striving to achieve self-realization and social harmonization; in this only sustained, as he was wont to say, by ‘faith in light to come’ (1927: 66).


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Bradley, Francis Herbert | Hartshorne, Charles | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Lotze, Hermann | panpsychism | Peirce, Charles Sanders | Russell, Bertrand