# Evolutionary Game Theory

*First published Mon Jan 14, 2002; substantive revision Sun Jul 19, 2009*

Evolutionary game theory originated as an application of the
mathematical theory of games to biological contexts, arising from the
realization that frequency dependent fitness introduces a strategic
aspect to evolution. Recently, however, evolutionary game theory has
become of increased interest to economists, sociologists, and
anthropologists--and social scientists in general--as well as
philosophers. The interest among social scientists in a theory with
explicit biological roots derives from three facts. First, the
‘evolution’ treated by evolutionary game theory need not be
biological evolution. ‘Evolution’ may, in this context,
often be understood as *cultural* evolution, where this refers
to changes in beliefs and norms over time. Second, the rationality
assumptions underlying evolutionary game theory are, in many cases,
more appropriate for the modelling of social systems than those
assumptions underlying the traditional theory of games. Third,
evolutionary game theory, as an explicitly dynamic theory, provides an
important element missing from the traditional theory. In the preface
to *Evolution and the Theory of Games*, Maynard Smith notes that
“[p]aradoxically, it has turned out that game theory is more readily
applied to biology than to the field of economic behaviour for which it
was originally designed.” It is perhaps doubly paradoxical, then, that
the subsequent development of *evolutionary* game theory has
produced a theory which holds great promise for social scientists, and
is as readily applied to the field of economic behaviour as that for
which it was originally designed.

- 1. Historical Development
- 2. Two Approaches to Evolutionary Game Theory
- 3. Why Evolutionary Game Theory?
- 4. Applications of Evolutionary Game Theory
- 5. Philosophical Problems of Evolutionary Game Theory
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Historical Development

Evolutionary game theory was first developed by R. A. Fisher [see
*The Genetic Theory of Natural Selection* (1930)] in his attempt
to explain the approximate equality of the sex ratio in mammals. The
puzzle Fisher faced was this: why is it that the sex ratio is
approximately equal in many species where the majority of males never
mate? In these species, the non-mating males would seem to be excess
baggage carried around by the rest of the population, having no real
use. Fisher realized that if we measure individual fitness in terms of
the expected number of *grandchildren*, then individual fitness
depends on the distribution of males and females in the population.
When there is a greater number of females in the population, males have
a higher individual fitness; when there are more males in the
population, females have a higher individual fitness. Fisher pointed
out that, in such a situation, the evolutionary dynamics lead to the
sex ratio becoming fixed at equal numbers of males and females. The
fact that individual fitness depends upon the relative frequency of
males and females in the population introduces a strategic element into
evolutions.

Fisher's argument can be understood game theoretically, but he did
not state it in those terms. In 1961, R. C. Lewontin made the
first explicit application of
game theory
to evolutionary biology in “Evolution and the Theory of Games” (not to
be confused with the Maynard Smith work of the same name). In 1972,
Maynard Smith defined the concept of an *evolutionarily stable
strategy* (hereafter ESS) in the article “Game Theory and the
Evolution of Fighting.” However, it was the publication of “The Logic
of Animal Conflict,” by Maynard Smith and Price in 1973 that introduced
the concept of an ESS into widespread circulation. In 1982, Maynard
Smith's seminal text *Evolution and the Theory of Games*
appeared, followed shortly thereafter by Robert Axelrod's famous work
*The Evolution of Cooperation* in 1984. Since then, there has
been a veritable explosion of interest by economists and social
scientists in evolutionary game theory (see the bibliography
below).

## 2. Two Approaches to Evolutionary Game Theory

There are two approaches to evolutionary game theory. The first approach derives from the work of Maynard Smith and Price and employs the concept of an evolutionarily stable strategy as the principal tool of analysis. The second approach constructs an explicit model of the process by which the frequency of strategies change in the population and studies properties of the evolutionary dynamics within that model.

The first approach can thus be thought of as providing a static conceptual analysis of evolutionary stability. “Static” because, although definitions of evolutionary stability are given, the definitions advanced do not typically refer to the underlying process by which behaviours (or strategies) change in the population. The second approach, in contrast, does not attempt to define a notion of evolutionary stability: once a model of the population dynamics has been specified, all of the standard stability concepts used in the analysis of dynamical systems can be brought to bear.

### 2.1 Definitions of evolutionary stability

As an example of the first approach, consider the problem of the
Hawk-Dove game, analyzed by Maynard Smith and Price in “The Logic of
Animal Conflict.” In this game, two individuals compete for a resource
of a fixed value *V*. (In biological contexts, the value
*V* of the resource corresponds to an increase in the Darwinian
fitness of the individual who obtains the resource; in a cultural
context, the value *V* of the resource would need to be given an
alternate interpretation more appropriate to the specific model at
hand.) Each individual follows exactly one of two strategies described
below:

HawkInitiate aggressive behaviour, not stopping until injured or until one's opponent backs down. DoveRetreat immediately if one's opponent initiates aggressive behaviour.

If we assume that (1) whenever two individuals both initiate
aggressive behaviour, conflict eventually results and the two
individuals are equally likely to be injured, (2) the cost of the
conflict reduces individual fitness by some constant value *C*,
(3) when a Hawk meets a Dove, the Dove immediately retreats and the
Hawk obtains the resource, and (4) when two Doves meet the resource is
shared equally between them, the fitness payoffs for the Hawk-Dove game
can be summarized according to the following matrix:

HawkDoveHawk½( V-C)VDove0 V/2

Figure 1:The Hawk-Dove Game

(The payoffs listed in the matrix are for that of a player
*using* the strategy in the appropriate row, playing against
someone using the strategy in the appropriate column. For example, if
you play the strategy Hawk against an opponent who plays the strategy
Dove, your payoff is *V*; if you play the strategy Dove against
an opponent who plays the strategy Hawk, your payoff is 0.)

In order for a strategy to be evolutionarily stable, it must have
the property that if almost every member of the population follows it,
no mutant (that is, an individual who adopts a novel strategy) can
successfully invade. This idea can be given a precise characterization
as follows: Let
Δ*F*(*s*_{1},*s*_{2})
denote the change in fitness for an individual following
strategy *s*_{1} against an
opponent following strategy
*s*_{2}, and let
*F*(*s*) denote the total fitness of an individual
following strategy *s*; furthermore, suppose that each
individual in the population has an initial fitness
of *F*_{0}. If σ is an
evolutionarily stable strategy and μ a mutant attempting to invade
the population, then

F(σ) =F_{0}+ (1−p)ΔF(σ,σ) +pΔF(σ,μ)

F(μ) =F_{0}+ (1−p)ΔF(μ,σ) +pΔF(μ,μ)

where *p* is the proportion of the population following the
mutant strategy
μ.

Since σ is evolutionarily stable, the fitness of an individual
following σ must be greater than the fitness of an individual
following μ (otherwise the mutant following μ would be able to
invade), and so *F*(σ) > *F*(μ). Now,
as *p* is very close to 0, this requires that *either*
that

ΔF(σ,σ) > ΔF(μ,σ)

*or*that

Δ(This is the definition of an ESS that Maynard Smith and Price give.) In other words, what this means is that a strategy σ is an ESS if one of two conditions holds: (1) σ does better playing against σ than any mutant does playing against σ, or (2) some mutant does just as well playing against σ as σ, but σ does better playing against the mutant than the mutant does.F(σ,σ) = ΔF(μ,σ) and ΔF(σ,μ) > ΔF(μ,μ)

Given this characterization of an evolutionarily stable strategy,
one can readily confirm that, for the Hawk-Dove game, the strategy Dove
is not evolutionarily stable because a pure population of Doves can be
invaded by a Hawk mutant. If the value *V* of the resource is
greater than the cost *C* of injury (so that it is worth risking
injury in order to obtain the resource), then the strategy Hawk is
evolutionarily stable. In the case where the value of the resource is
*less* than the cost of injury, there is no evolutionarily
stable strategy if individuals are restricted to following pure
strategies, although there is an evolutionarily stable strategy if
players may use mixed
strategies.^{[1]}

In the years following the original work of Maynard Smith and Price,
alternate analytic solution concepts have been proposed. Of these,
two important ones are the idea of an *evolutionarily stable set*
(see Thomas 1984, 1985a,b), and the idea of a “limit ESS” (see Selten
1983, 1988). The former provides a setwise generalization of the
concept of an evolutionarily stable strategy, and the latter extends
the concept of an evolutionarily stable strategy to the context of
two-player extensive form games.

### 2.2 Specifying dynamics for the population

As an example of the second approach, consider the well-known Prisoner's Dilemma. In this game, individuals choose one of two strategies, typically called “Cooperate” and “Defect.” Here is the general form of the payoff matrix for the prisoner's dilemma:

CooperateDefectCooperate( R,R′)( S,T′)Defect( T,S′)( P,P′)

Figure 2:Payoff Matrix for the Prisoner's Dilemma.

Payoffs listed as (row, column).

where *T* > *R* > *P* > *S* and
*T*′ > *R*′ > *P*′ >
*S*′. (This form does not require that the payoffs for
each player be symmetric, only that the proper ordering of the payoffs
obtains.) In what follows, it will be assumed that the payoffs for the
Prisoner's Dilemma are the same for everyone in the population.

How will a population of individuals that repeatedly plays the
Prisoner's Dilemma evolve? We cannot answer that question without
introducing a few assumptions concerning the nature of the population.
First, let us assume that the population is quite large. In this case,
we can represent the state of the population by simply keeping track of
what proportion follow the strategies Cooperate and Defect. Let
*p _{c}* and

*p*denote these proportions. Furthermore, let us denote the average fitness of cooperators and defectors by

_{d}*W*and

_{C}*W*, respectively, and let

_{D}*W*denote the average fitness of the entire population. The values of

*W*,

_{C}*W*, and

_{D}*W*can be expressed in terms of the population proportions and payoff values as follows:

W_{C}=F_{0}+p_{c}ΔF(C,C) +p_{d}ΔF(C,D)

W_{D}=F_{0}+p_{c}ΔF(D,C) +p_{d}ΔF(D,D)

W=p_{c}W_{C}+p_{d}W_{D}

Second, let us assume that the proportion of the population following the strategies Cooperate and Defect in the next generation is related to the proportion of the population following the strategies Cooperate and Defect in the current generation according to the rule:

We can rewrite these expressions in the following form:

If we assume that the change in the strategy frequency from one generation to the next are small, these difference equations may be approximated by the differential equations:

These equations were offered by Taylor and Jonker (1978) and Zeeman
(1979) to provide continuous dynamics for evolutionary game theory and
are known as the *replicator dynamics*.

The replicator dynamics may be used to model a population of individuals playing the Prisoner's Dilemma. For the Prisoner's Dilemma, the expected fitness of Cooperating and Defecting are:

and

W_{C}= F_{0}+p_{c}ΔF(C,C) +p_{d}ΔF(C,D)= F_{0}+p_{c}R+p_{d}S

Since

W_{D}= F_{0}+p_{c}ΔF(D,C) +p_{d}ΔF(D,D)= F_{0}+p_{c}T+p_{d}P.

*T*>

*R*and

*P*>

*S*, it follows that

*W*

_{D}>

*W*

_{C}and hence

*W*

_{D}>

*W*>

*W*

_{C}. This means that and Since the strategy frequencies for Defect and Cooperate in the next generation are given by and respectively, we see that over time the proportion of the population choosing the strategy Cooperate eventually becomes extinct. Figure 3 illustrates one way of representing the replicator dynamical model of the prisoner's dilemma, known as a state-space diagram.

Figure 3:The Replicator Dynamical Model of the Prisoner's Dilemma

We interpret this diagram as follows: the leftmost point represents
the state of the population where everyone defects, the rightmost point
represents the state where everyone cooperates, and intermediate points
represent states where some proportion of the population defects and
the remainder cooperates. (One maps states of the population onto
points in the diagram by mapping the state when *N*% of the
population defects onto the point of the line *N*% of the way to
the leftmost point.) Arrows on the line represent the evolutionary
trajectory followed by the population over time. The open circle at the
rightmost point indicates that the state where everybody cooperates is
an unstable equilibrium, in the sense that if a small portion of the
population deviates from the strategy Cooperate, then the evolutionary
dynamics will drive the population away from that equilibrium. The
solid circle at the leftmost point indicates that the state where
everybody Defects is a stable equilibrium, in the sense that if a small
portion of the population deviates from the strategy Defect, then the
evolutionary dynamics will drive the population back to the original
equilibrium state.

At this point, one may see little difference between the two
approaches to evolutionary game theory. One can confirm that, for the
Prisoner's Dilemma, the state where everybody defects is the only ESS.
Since this state is the only stable equilibrium under the replicator
dynamics, the two notions fit together quite neatly: the only stable
equilibrium under the replicator dynamics occurs when everyone in the
population follows the only ESS. In general, though, the relationship
between ESSs and stable states of the replicator dynamics is more
complex than this example suggests. Taylor and Jonker (1978), as well
as Zeeman (1979), establish conditions under which one may infer the
existence of a stable state under the replicator dynamics given an
evolutionarily stable strategy. Roughly, if only two pure strategies
exist, then given a (possibly mixed) evolutionarily stable strategy,
the corresponding state of the population is a stable state under the
replicator dynamics. (If the evolutionarily stable strategy is a mixed
strategy *S*, the corresponding state of the population is the
state in which the proportion of the population following the first
strategy equals the probability assigned to the first strategy by
*S*, and the remainder follow the second strategy.) However,
this can fail to be true if more than two pure strategies exist.

The connection between ESSs and stable states under an evolutionary
dynamical model is weakened further if we do not model the dynamics by
the replicator dynamics. For example, suppose we use a local
interaction model in which each individual plays the prisoner's dilemma
with his or her neighbors. Nowak and May (1992, 1993), using a spatial
model in which local interactions occur between individuals occupying
neighboring nodes on a square lattice, show that stable population
states for the prisoner's dilemma depend upon the specific form of the
payoff
matrix.^{[2]}

When the payoff matrix for the population has the values *T*
= 2.8, *R* = 1.1, *P* = 0.1, and *S* = 0, the
evolutionary dynamics of the local interaction model agree with those
of the replicator dynamics, and lead to a state where each individual
follows the strategy Defect--which is, as noted before, the only
evolutionarily stable strategy in the prisoner's dilemma. The figure
below illustrates how rapidly one such population converges to a state
where everyone defects.

Generation 1 Generation 2 Generation 3 Generation 4 Generation 5 Generation 6

Figure 4:Prisoner's Dilemma: All Defect

[View a movie of this model]

However, when the payoff matrix has values of *T* = 1.2,
*R* = 1.1, *P* = 0.1, and *S* = 0, the
evolutionary dynamics carry the population to a stable cycle
oscillating between two states. In this cycle cooperators and defectors
coexist, with some regions containing “blinkers” oscillating between
defectors and cooperators (as seen in generation 19 and 20).

Generation 1 | Generation 2 | Generation 19 | Generation 20 |

**Figure 5:**Prisoner's Dilemma: Cooperate

[View a movie of this model]

Notice that with these particular settings of payoff values, the evolutionary dynamics of the local interaction model differ significantly from those of the replicator dynamics. Under these payoffs, the stable states have no corresponding analogue in either the replicator dynamics nor in the analysis of evolutionarily stable strategies.

A phenomenon of greater interest occurs when we choose payoff values
of *T* = 1.61, *R* = 1.01, *P* = 0.01, and
*S* = 0. Here, the dynamics of local interaction lead to a
world constantly in flux: under these values regions occupied
predominantly by Cooperators may be successfully invaded by Defectors,
and regions occupied predominantly by Defectors may be successfully
invaded by Cooperators. In this model, there is no “stable strategy” in
the traditional dynamical
sense.^{[3]}

Generation 1 | Generation 3 | Generation 5 | Generation 7 |

Generation 9 | Generation 11 | Generation 13 | Generation 15 |

**Figure 6:**Prisoner's Dilemma: Chaotic

[view a movie of this model]

These models demonstrate that, although numerous cases exist in which both approaches to evolutionary game theory arrive at the same conclusion regarding which strategies one would expect to find present in a population, there are enough differences in the outcomes of the two modes of analysis to justify the development of each program.

## 3. Why Evolutionary Game Theory?

Although evolutionary game theory has provided numerous insights to particular evolutionary questions, a growing number of social scientists have become interested in evolutionary game theory in hopes that it will provide tools for addressing a number of deficiencies in the traditional theory of games, three of which are discussed below.### 3.1 The equilibrium selection problem

The concept of a Nash equilibrium (see the entry on game theory) has been the most used solution concept in game theory since its introduction by John Nash in 1950. A selection of strategies by a group of agents is said to be in a Nash equilibrium if each agent's strategy is a best-response to the strategies chosen by the other players. By best-response, we mean that no individual can improve her payoff by switching strategies unless at least one other individual switches strategies as well. This need not mean that the payoffs to each individual are optimal in a Nash equilibrium: indeed, one of the disturbing facts of the prisoner's dilemma is that the only Nash equilbrium of the game--when both agents defect--is suboptimal.^{[4]}

Yet a difficulty arises with the use of Nash equilibrium as a solution concept for games: if we restrict players to using pure strategies, not every game has a Nash equilbrium. The game “Matching Pennies” illustrates this problem.

HeadsTailsHeads(0,1) (1,0) Tails(1,0) (0,1)

Figure 7:Payoff matrix for the game of Matching Pennies

(Row wins if the two coins do not match, whereas Column wins if the two coins match).

While it is true that every noncooperative game in which players may use mixed strategies has a Nash equilibrium, some have questioned the significance of this for real agents. If it seems appropriate to require rational agents to adopt only pure strategies (perhaps because the cost of implementing a mixed strategy runs too high), then the game theorist must admit that certain games lack solutions.

A more significant problem with invoking the Nash equilibrium as the
appropriate solution concept arises because games exist which have
multiple Nash equilibria (see the section on
Solution Concepts and Equilibria,
in the entry on game theory). When there are several
different Nash equilibria, how is a rational agent to decide which of
the several equilibria is the “right one” to settle
upon?^{[5]}
Attempts to resolve this problem have produced a number of possible
refinements to the concept of a Nash equilibrium, each refinement
having some intuitive purchase. Unfortunately, so many refinements of
the notion of a Nash equilibrium have been developed that, in many
games which have multiple Nash equilibria, each equilibrium could be
justified by some refinement present in the literature. The problem
has thus shifted from choosing among multiple Nash equilibria to
choosing among the various refinements. Some (see Samuelson (1997),
*Evolutionary Games and Equilibrium Selection*) hope that
further development of evolutionary game theory can be of service in
addressing this issue.

### 3.2 The problem of hyperrational agents

The traditional theory of games imposes a very high rationality requirement upon agents. This requirement originates in the development of the theory of utility which provides game theory's underpinnings (see Luce (1950) for an introduction). For example, in order to be able to assign a cardinal utility function to individual agents, one typically assumes that each agent has a well-defined, consistent set of preferences over the set of “lotteries” over the outcomes which may result from individual choice. Since the number of different lotteries over outcomes is uncountably infinite, this requires each agent to have a well-defined, consistent set of uncountably infinitely many preferences.
Numerous results from experimental economics have shown that these
strong rationality assumptions do not describe the behavior of real
human subjects. Humans are rarely (if ever) the hyperrational agents
described by traditional game theory. For example, it is not uncommon
for people, in experimental situations, to indicate that they prefer
*A* to *B*, *B* to *C*, and *C* to
*A*. These “failures of the transitivity of preference” would
not occur if people had a well-defined consistent set of preferences.
Furthermore, experiments with a class of games known as a “beauty
pageant” show, quite dramatically, the failure of common knowledge
assumptions typically invoked to solve
games.^{[6]}
Since evolutionary game
theory successfully explains the predominance of certain behaviors of
insects and animals, where strong rationality assumptions clearly fail,
this suggests that rationality is not as central to game theoretic
analyses as previously thought. The hope, then, is that evolutionary
game theory may meet with greater success in describing and predicting
the choices of human subjects, since it is better equipped to handle
the appropriate weaker rationality assumptions.

### 3.3 The lack of a dynamical theory in the traditional theory of games

At the end of the first chapter of *Theory of Games and Economic
Behavior*, von Neumann and Morgenstern write:

We repeat most emphatically that our theory is thoroughly static. A dynamic theory would unquestionably be more complete and therefore preferable. But there is ample evidence from other branches of science that it is futile to try to build one as long as the static side is not thoroughly understood. (Von Neumann and Morgenstern, 1953, p. 44)

The theory of evolution is a dynamical theory, and the second approach to evolutionary game theory sketched above explicitly models the dynamics present in interactions among individuals in the population. Since the traditional theory of games lacks an explicit treatment of the dynamics of rational deliberation, evolutionary game theory can be seen, in part, as filling an important lacuna of traditional game theory.

One may seek to capture some of the dynamics of the decision-making process in traditional game theory by modeling the game in its extensive form, rather than its normal form. However, for most games of reasonable complexity (and hence interest), the extensive form of the game quickly becomes unmanageable. Moreover, even in the extensive form of a game, traditional game theory represents an individual's strategy as a specification of what choice that individual would make at each information set in the game. A selection of strategy, then, corresponds to a selection, prior to game play, of what that individual will do at any possible stage of the game. This representation of strategy selection clearly presupposes hyperrational players and fails to represent the process by which one player observes his opponent's behavior, learns from these observations, and makes the best move in response to what he has learned (as one might expect, for there is no need to model learning in hyperrational individuals). The inability to model the dynamical element of game play in traditional game theory, and the extent to which evolutionary game theory naturally incorporates dynamical considerations, reveals an important virtue of evolutionary game theory.

## 4. Applications of Evolutionary Game Theory

Evolutionary game theory has been used to explain a number of
aspects of human behavior. A small sampling of topics which have been
analysed from the evolutionary perspective include:
**altruism** (Fletcher and Zwick, 2007; Gintis *et al*.,
2003; Sanchez and Cuesta, 2005; Trivers, 1971), **behavior in public
goods game** (Clemens and Riechmann, 2006; Hauert, 2006;
Hauert *et al*., 2002, 2006; Huberman and Glance,
1995), **empathy** (Page and Nowak, 2002; Fishman, 2006), **human
culture** (Enquist and Ghirlanda, 2007; Enquist *et al*.,
2008), **moral behaviour** (Alexander, 2007; Boehm, 1982; Harms and
Skyrms, 2008; Skyrms 1996, 2004), **private property** (Gintis,
2007), **signaling systems and other proto-linguistic behaviour**
(Barrett, 2007; Hausken and Hirshleirfer, 2008; Hurd, 1995; Jager,
2008; Nowak *et al*., 1999; Pawlowitsch, 2007, 2008; Skyrms,
forthcoming; Zollman, 2005), **social learning** (Kameda and
Nakanishi, 2003; Nakahashi, 2007; Rogers, 1988; Wakano and Aoki, 2006;
Wakano *et al*., 2004), and **social norms** (Axelrod, 1986;
Bicchieri, 2006; Binmore and Samuelson, 1994; Chalub *et al*.,
2006; Kendal *et al*., 2006; Ostrum, 2000).

The following subsections provide a brief illustration of the use of evolutionary game theoretic models to explain two areas of human behavior. The first concerns the tendency of people to share equally in perfectly symmetric situations. The second shows how populations of pre-linguistic individuals may coordinate on the use of a simple signaling system even though they lack the ability to communicate. These two models have been pointed to as preliminary explanations of our sense of fairness and language, respectively. They were selected for inclusion here primarily because of the relative simplicity of the model and apparent success at explaining the phenomenon in question.

### 4.1 A sense of fairness

One natural game to use for investigating the evolution of fairness
is *divide-the-cake* (this is the simplest version of the Nash
bargaining game). In chapter 1 of *Evolution of the Social
Contract*, Skyrms presents the problem as follows:

Here we start with a very simple problem; we are to divide a chocolate cake between us. Neither of us has any special claim as against the other. Out positions are entirely symmetric. The cake is a windfall for us, and it is up to us to divide it. But if we cannot agree how to share it, the cake will spoil and we will get nothing. (Skyrms, 1996, pp. 3–4)

More formally, suppose that two individuals are presented with a
resource of size *C* by a third party. A *strategy* for
a player, in this game, consists of an amount of cake that he would
like. The set of possible strategies for a player is thus any amount
between 0 and *C*. If the sum of strategies for each player is
less than or equal to *C*, each player receives the amount he
asked for. However, if the sum of strategies exceeds *C*, no
player receives anything. Figure 8 illustrates the feasible set for
this game.

Figure 8:The feasible set for the game of Divide-the-Cake. In this figure, the cake is of sizeC=10 but all strategies between 0 and 10 inclusive are permitted for either player (including fractional demands).

We have a clear intuition that the “obvious” strategy for each
player to select is *C/2*; the philosophical problem lies in
explaining *why* agents would choose that strategy rather than
some other one. Even in the perfectly symmetric situation, answering
this question is more difficult than it first appears. To see this,
first notice that there are an infinite number of Nash equilibria for
this game. If player 1 asks for *p* of the cake, where *0
≤ p ≤ C*, and player 2 asks for *C − p*, then
this strategy profile is a Nash equilibrium for any value
of *p* ∈ [0,C]. (Each player's strategy is a best
response given what the other has chosen, in the sense that neither
player can increase her payoff by changing her strategy.) However,
the equal split is only one of infinitely many Nash equilibria.

One might propose that both players should choose that strategy
which maximizes their expected payoff on the assumption they are
uncertain as to whether they will be assigned the role of Player 1 or
Player 2. This proposal, Skyrms notes, is essentially that of
Harsanyi (1953). The problem with this is that if players only care
about their expected payoff, and they think that it is equally likely
that they will be assigned the role of Player 1 or Player 2, then
this, too, fails to select uniquely the equal split. Consider the
strategy profile ⟨*p, C − p*⟩ which assigns
Player 1 *p* slices and Player 2 *C − p* slices.
If a player thinks it is equally likely that he will be assigned the
role of Player 1 or Player 2, then his expected utility is
½*p* + ½(*C−p*) = *C*/2, for
all values *p* ∈ [0, *C*].

Now consider the following evolutionary model: suppose we have a
population of individuals who pair up and repeatedly play the game of
divide-the-cake, modifying their strategies over time in a way which
is described by the replicator dynamics. For convenience, let us
assume that the cake is divided into 10 equally sized slices and that
each player's strategy conforms to one of the following 11 possible
types: Demand 0 slices, Demand 1 slice, … , Demand 10 slices.
For the replicator dynamics, the state of the population is
represented by a vector
⟨*p*_{0}, *p*_{1}, …,
*p*_{10}⟩ where each *p _{i}*
denotes the frequency of the strategy “Demand

*i*slices” in the population.

The replicator dynamics allows us to model how the distribution of strategies in the population changes over time, beginning from a particular initial condition. Figure 9 below shows two evolutionary outcomes under the continuous replicator dynamics. Notice that although fair division can evolve, as in Figure 9(a), it is not the only evolutionary outcome, as Figure 9(b) illustrates.

(a) The evolution of fair division.

(b) The evolution of an unequal division rule.

Figure 9:Two evolutionary outcomes under the continuous replicator dynamics for the game of divide-the-cake. Of the eleven strategies present, only three are colour-coded so as to be identifiable in the plot (see the legend). The initial conditions for the solution shown in (a) was the point ⟨0.0544685, 0.236312, 0.0560727, 0.0469244, 0.0562243, 0.0703294, 0.151136, 0.162231, 0.0098273, 0.111366, 0.0451093⟩, and the initial conditions for the solution shown in (b) was the point ⟨0.410376, 0.107375, 0.0253916, 0.116684, 0.0813494, 0.00573677, 0.0277155, 0.0112791, 0.0163166, 0.191699, 0.00607705⟩.

Recall that the task at hand was to explain why we think the “obvious” strategy choice in a perfectly symmetric resource allocation problem is for both players to ask for half of the resource. What the above shows is that, in a population of boundedly rational agents who modify their behaviours in a manner described by the replicator dynamics, fair division is one, although not the only, evolutionary outcome. The tendency of fair division to emerge, assuming that any initial condition is equally likely, can be measured by determining the size of the basin of attraction of the state where everyone in the population uses the strategy Demand 5 slices. Skyrms (1996) measures the size of the basin of attraction of fair division using Monte Carlo methods, finding that fair division evolves roughly 62% of the time.

However, it is important to realise that the replicator dynamics
assumes any pairwise interaction between individuals is equally
likely. In reality, quite often interactions between individuals
are *correlated* to some extent. Correlated interaction can
occur as a result of spatial location (as shown above for the case of
the spatial prisoner's dilemma), the structuring effect of social
relations, or ingroup/outgroup membership effects, to list a few
causes.

When correlation is introduced, the frequency with which fair
division emerges changes drastically. Figure 10 illustrates how the
basin of attraction of All Demand 5 changes as the correlation
coefficient ε increases from 0 to
0.2.^{[7]}
Once the amount of correlation present in the interactions reaches
ε = 0.2, fair division is virtually an evolutionary certainty.
Note that this does not depend on there only being three strategies
present: allowing for some correlation between interactions increases
the probability of fair division evolving even if the initial
conditions contain individuals using any of the eleven possible
strategies.

(a) ε = 0 (b) ε = 0.1

(c) ε = 0.2

Figure 10:Three diagrams showing how, as the amount of correlation among interactions increases, fair division is more likely to evolve.

What, then, can we conclude from this model regarding the evolution of fair division? It all depends, of course, on how accurately the replicator dynamics models the primary evolutionary forces (cultural or biological) acting on human populations. Although the replicator dynamics are a “simple” mathematical model, it does suffice for modelling both a type of biological evolution (see Taylor and Jonker, 1978) and a type of cultural evolution (see Börgers and Sarin, 1996; Weibull, 1995). As Skyrms (1996) notes:

In a finite population, in a finite time, where there is some random element in evolution, some reasonable amount of divisibility of the good and some correlation, we can say that it is likely that something close to share and share alike should evolve in dividing-the-cake situations. This is, perhaps, a beginning of an explanation of the origin of our concept of justice.

This claim, of course, has not gone without comment. For a
selection of some discussion see, in particular, D'Arms (1996, 2000);
D'Arms *et al*., 1998; Danielson (1998); Bicchieri (1999);
Kitcher (1999); Gintis (2000); Harms (2000); Krebs (2000); Alexander
and Skyrms (1999); and Alexander (2000, 2007).

### 4.2 The emergence of language.

In his seminal work *Convention*, David Lewis developed the
idea of sender-receiver games. Such games have been used to explain
how language, and semantic content, can emerge in a community which
originally did not possess any language
whatsoever.^{[8]}
His original definition is as follows (with portions of extraneous
commentary deleted for concision and points enumerated for clarity and
later reference):

Atwo-sided signaling problemis a situationSinvolving an agent called thecommunicatorand one or more other agents called theaudience, such that it is true that, and it is common knowledge for the communicator and the audience that:

- Exactly one of several alternative states of affairs
s_{1}, …,sholds. The communicator, but not the audience, is in a good position to tell which one it is._{m}- Each member of the audience can do any one of several alternative actions
r_{1}, …,rcalled_{m}responses. Everyone involved wants the audience's responses to depend in a certain way upon the state of affairs that holds. There is a certain one-to-one functionFfrom {s} onto {_{i}r} such that everyone prefers that each member of the audience do_{j}F(s) on condition that_{i}sholds, for each_{i}s._{i}- The communicator can do any one of several alternative actions σ
_{1}, …, σ(_{n}n≥m) calledsignals. The audience is in a good position to tell which one he does. No one involved has any preference regarding these actions which is strong enough to outweigh his preference for the dependenceFof audience's responses upon states of affairs. […]- A
communicator's contingency planis any possible way in which the communicator's signal may depend upon the state of affairs that he observes to hold. It is a functionFcfrom {s} into {σ_{i}}. […]_{k}- Similarly, an
audience's contingency planis any possible way in which the response of a member of the audience may depend upon the signal he observes the communicator to give. It is a one-to-one functionFafrom part of {σ_{k}} into {r}. […]_{j}Whenever

FcandFacombine […] to give the preferred dependence of the audience's response upon the state of affairs, we call ⟨Fc,Fa⟩ asignaling system. (Lewis, 1969, pp. 130–132)

Since the publication of *Convention*, it is more common to
refer to the communicator as the *sender* and the members of
the audience as *receivers*. The basic idea behind
sender-receiver games is the following: Nature selects which state of
the world obtains. The person in the role of Sender observes this
state of the world (correctly identifying it), and sends a signal to
the person in the role of Receiver. The Receiver, upon receipt of
this signal, performs a response. If what the Receiver does is the
correct response, given the state of the world, then both players
receive a payoff of 1; if the Receiver performed an incorrect
response, then both players receive a payoff of 0. Notice that, in
this simplified model, no chance of error exists at any stage. The
Sender always observes the true state of the world and always sends
the signal he intended to send. Likewise, the Receiver always
receives the signal sent by the Sender (i.e., the channel is not
noisy), and the Receiver always performs the response he intended
to.

Whereas Lewis allowed the “audience” to consist of more than one
person, it is more common to consider sender-receiver games played
between two people, so that there is only a single receiver (or, in
Lewisian terms, a single member of the
audience).^{[9]}
For simplicity, in the following we will consider a two-player,
sender-receiver game with two states of the world
{*S*_{1}, *S*_{2}}, two signals
{σ_{1}, σ_{2}}, and two responses
{*r*_{1}, *r*_{2}}. (We shall see later
why larger sender-receiver games are increasingly difficult to
analyse.)

Notice that, in point (2) of his definition of sender-receiver
games, Lewis requires two things: that there be a unique best response
to the state of the world (this is what requiring *F* to be
one-to-one amounts to) and that everyone in the audience agrees that
this is the case. Since we are considering the case where there is
only a single responder, the second requirement is otiose. For the
case of two states of the world and two responses, there are only two
ways of assigning responses to states of the world which satisfy
Lewis's requirement. These are as follows (where *X*
⇒ *Y* denotes “in state of the world *X*, the best
response is to do *Y*”):

S_{1}⇒r_{1},S_{2}⇒r_{2}.S_{1}⇒r_{2},S_{2}⇒r_{1}.

It makes no real difference for the model which one of these we
choose, so pick the intuitive one: in state of the
world *S _{i}*, the best response
is

*r*(i.e., function 1).

_{i}A *strategy for the sender* (what Lewis called a
“communicator's contingency plan”) consists of a function specifying
what signal he sends given the state of the world. It is, as Lewis
notes, a function from the set of states of the world *into*
the set of signals. This means that it is possible that a sender may
send the *same* signal in two different states of the
world. Such a strategy makes no sense, from a rational point of view,
because the receiver would not get enough information to be able to
identify the correct response for the state of the world. However, we
do not exclude these strategies from consideration because they are
logically possible strategies.

How many sender strategies are there? Because we allow for the
possibility of the same signal to be sent for multiple states of the
world, there are two choices for which signal to send given
state *S*_{1} and two choices for which signal to send
given state *S*_{2}. This means there are four
possible sender strategies. These strategies are as follows (where
'*X* → *Y*' means that when the state of the world
is *X* the sender will send signal *Y*):

Sender 1:S_{1}→ σ_{1},S_{2}→ σ_{1}.

Sender 2:S_{1}→ σ_{1},S_{2}→ σ_{2}.

Sender 3:S_{1}→ σ_{2},S_{2}→ σ_{1}.

Sender 4:S_{1}→ σ_{2},S_{2}→ σ_{2}.

What is a strategy for a receiver? Here, it proves useful to
deviate from Lewis's original definition of the “audience's
contingency plan”. Instead, let us take a receiver's strategy to be a
function from the set of signals into the set of responses. As in the
case of the sender, we allow the receiver to perform the same response
for more than one signal. By symmetry, this means there are **4**
possible receiver strategies. These receiver strategies are:

Receiver 1:σ_{1}→r_{1}, σ_{2}→r_{1}.

Receiver 2:σ_{1}→r_{1}, σ_{2}→r_{2}.

Receiver 3:σ_{1}→r_{2}, σ_{2}→r_{1}.

Receiver 4:σ_{1}→r_{2}, σ_{2}→r_{2}.

If the roles of Sender and Receiver are permanently assigned to individuals — as Lewis envisaged — then there are only two possible signaling systems: ⟨Sender 2, Receiver 2⟩ and ⟨Sender 3, Receiver 3⟩. All other possible combinations of strategies result in the players failing to coordinate. The coordination failure occurs because the Sender and Receiver only pair the appropriate action with the state of the world in one instance, as with ⟨Sender 1, Receiver 1⟩, or not at all, as with ⟨Sender 2, Receiver 3⟩.

What if the roles of Sender and Receiver are not permanently
assigned to individuals? That is, what if nature flips a coin and
assigns one player to the role of Sender and the other player to the
role of Receiver, and then has them play the game? In this case, a
player's strategy needs to specify what he will do when assigned the
role of Sender, as well as what he will do when assigned the role of
Receiver. Since there are four possible strategies to use as Sender
and four possible strategies to use as Receiver, this means that there
are a total of **16** possible strategies for the sender-receiver
game when roles are not permanently assigned to individuals. Here, a
player's strategy consists of an ordered pair (Sender *X*,
Receiver *Y*), where *X*, *Y* ∈ {1, 2, 3,
4}.

It makes a difference whether one considers the roles of Sender and
Receiver to be permanently assigned or not. If the roles are assigned
at random, there are four signaling systems amongst two
players^{[10]}:

**Player 1:**(Sender 2, Receiver 2),**Player 2:**(Sender 2, Receiver 2)**Player 1:**(Sender 3, Receiver 3),**Player 2:**(Sender 3, Receiver 3)**Player 1:**(Sender 2, Receiver 3),**Player 2:**(Sender 3, Receiver 2)**Player 1:**(Sender 3, Receiver 2),**Player 2:**(Sender 2, Receiver 3)

Signaling systems 3 and 4 are curious. System 3 is a case where, for
example, I speak in French but listen in German, and you speak German
but listen in French. (System 4 swaps French and German for both you
and me.) Notice that in systems 3 and 4 the players are able to
correctly coordinate the response with the state of the
world *regardless* of who gets assigned the role of Sender or
Receiver.

The problem, of course, with signaling systems 3 and 4 is that neither Player 1 nor Player 2 would do well when pitted against a clone of himself. They are cases where the signaling system would not work in a population of players who are pairwise randomly assigned to play the sender-receiver game. In fact, it is straightforward to show that the strategies (Sender 2, Receiver 2) and (Sender 3, Receiver 3) are the only evolutionarily stable strategies (see Skyrms 1996, 89–90).

As a first approach to the dynamics of sender-receiver games, let
us restrict attention to the four strategies (Sender 1, Receiver 1),
(Sender 2, Receiver 2), (Sender 3, Receiver 3), and (Sender 4,
Receiver 4). Figure 11 illustrates the state space under the
continuous replicator dynamics for the sender-receiver game consisting
of two states of the world, two signals, and two responses, where
players are restricted to using one of the previous four strategies.
One can see that evolution leads the population in almost all
cases^{[11]}
to converge to one of the two signaling
systems.^{[12]}

Figure 11:The evolution of signaling systems.

Figure 12 illustrates the outcome of one run of the replicator dynamics (for a single population model) where all sixteen possible strategies are represented. We see that eventually the population, for this particular set of initial conditions, converges to one of the pure Lewisian signalling systems identified above.

Figure 12:The evolution of a signalling system under the replicator dynamics.

When the number of states of the world, the number of signals, and the
number of actions increase from 2, the situation rapidly becomes much
more complex. If there are *N* states of the world, *N*
signals, and *N* actions, the total number of possible
strategies equals *N ^{2N}*. For

*N*=2, this means there are 16 possible strategies, as we have seen. For

*N*=3, there are 729 possible strategies, and a signalling problem where

*N*=4 has 65,536 possible strategies. Given this, one might think that it would prove difficult for evolution to settle upon an optimal signalling system.

Such an intuition is correct. Hofbauer and Hutteger (2008) show that,
quite often, the replicator dynamics will converge to a suboptimal
outcome in signalling games. In these suboptimal outcomes,
a *pooling* or *partial pooling* equilibrium will
emerge. A pooling equilibrium occurs when the Sender uses the same
signal regardless of the state of the world. A partial pooling
equilibrium occurs when the Sender is capable of differentiating
between some states of the world but not others. As an example of a
partial pooling equilibrium, consider the following strategies for the
case where *N=3*: Suppose that the Sender sends signal 1 in
state of the world 1, and signal 2 in states of the world 2 and 3.
Furthermore, suppose that the Receiver performs action 1 upon receipt
of signal 1, and action 2 upon receipt of signals 2 and 3. If all
states of the world are equiprobable, this is a partial pooling
equilibrium. Given that the Sender does not differentiate states of
the world 2 and 3, the Receiver cannot improve his payoffs by
responding differently to signal 2. Given the particular response
behaviour of the Receiver, the Sender cannot improve her payoffs by
attempting to differentiate states of the world 2 and 3.

## 5. Philosophical Problems of Evolutionary Game Theory

The growing interest among social scientists and philosophers in evolutionary game theory has raised several philosophical questions, primarily stemming from its application to human subjects.### 5.1 The meaning of fitness in cultural evolutionary interpretations

As noted previously, evolutionary game theoretic models may often be
given both a biological and a cultural evolutionary interpretation. In
the biological interpretation, the numeric quantities which play a role
analogous to “utility” in traditional game theory correspond to the
fitness (typically Darwinian fitness) of
individuals.^{[13]}
How does one
interpret “fitness” in the cultural evolutionary interpretation?

In many cases, fitness in cultural evolutionary interpretations of evolutionary game theoretic models directly measures some objective quantity of which it can be safely assumed that (1) individuals always want more rather than less and (2) interpersonal comparisons are meaningful. Depending on the particular problem modeled, money, slices of cake, or amount of land would be appropriate cultural evolutionary interpretations of fitness. Requiring that fitness in cultural evolutionary game theoretic models conform to this interpretative constraint severely limits the kinds of problems that one can address. A more useful cultural evolutionary framework would provide a more general theory which did not require that individual fitness be a linear (or strictly increasing) function of the amount of some real quantity, like amount of food.

In traditional game theory, a strategy's fitness was measured by the expected utility it had for the individual in question. Yet evolutionary game theory seeks to describe individuals of limited rationality (commonly known as “boundedly rational” individuals), and the utility theory employed in traditional game theory assumes highly rational individuals. Consequently, the utility theory used in traditional game theory cannot simply be carried over to evolutionary game theory. One must develop an alternate theory of utility/fitness, one compatible with the bounded rationality of individuals, that is sufficient to define a utility measure adequate for the application of evolutionary game theory to cultural evolution.

### 5.2 The explanatory irrelevance of evolutionary game theory

Another question facing evolutionary game theoretic explanations of social phenomena concerns the kind of explanation it seeks to give. Depending on the type of explanation it seeks to provide, are evolutionary game theoretic explanations of social phenomena irrelevant or mere vehicles for the promulgation of pre-existing values and biases? To understand this question, recognize that one must ask whether evolutionary game theoretic explanations target the etiology of the phenomenon in question, the persistence of the phenomenon, or various aspects of the normativity attached to the phenomenon. The latter two questions seem deeply connected, for population members typically enforce social behaviors and rules having normative force by sanctions placed on those failing to comply with the relevant norm; and the presence of sanctions, if suitably strong, explains the persistence of the norm. The question regarding a phenomenon's etiology, on the other hand, can be considered independent of the latter questions.

If one wishes to explain how some currently existing social
phenomenon came to be, it is unclear why approaching it from the point
of view of evolutionary game theory would be particularily
illuminating. The etiology of any phenomenon is a unique historical
event and, as such, can only be discovered empirically, relying on the
work of sociologists, anthropologists, archaeologists, and the like.
Although an evolutionary game theoretic model may exclude certain
historical sequences as possible histories (since one may be able to
show that the cultural evolutionary dynamics preclude one sequence from
generating the phenomenon in question), it seems unlikely that an
evolutionary game theoretic model would indicate a unique historical
sequence suffices to bring about the phenomenon. An empirical inquiry
would then still need to be conducted to rule out the extraneous
historical sequences admitted by the model, which raises the question
of what, if anything, was gained by the construction of an evolutionary
game theoretic model in the intermediate stage. Moreover, even if an
evolutionary game theoretic model indicated that a single historical
sequence was capable of producing a given social phenomenon, there
remains the important question of why we ought to take this result
seriously. One may point out that since nearly any result can be
produced by a model by suitable adjusting of the dynamics and initial
conditions, all that the evolutionary game theorist has done is provide
one such model. Additional work needs to be done to show that the
underlying assumptions of the model (both the cultural evolutionary
dynamics and the initial conditions) are empirically supported. Again,
one may wonder what has been gained by the evolutionary model--would it
not have been just as easy to determine the cultural dynamics and
initial conditions beforehand, constructing the model afterwards? If
so, it would seem that the contributions made by evolutionary game
theory in this context simply are a proper part of the parent social
science--sociology, anthropology, economics, and so on. If so, then
there is nothing *particular* about evolutionary game theory
employed in the explanation, and this means that, contrary to
appearances, evolutionary game theory is really irrelevant to the given
explanation.

If evolutionary game theoretic models do not explain the etiology of a social phenomenon, presumably they explain the persistence of the phenomenon or the normativity attached to it. Yet we rarely need an evolutionary game theoretic model to identify a particular social phenomenon as stable or persistent as that can be done by observation of present conditions and examination of the historical records; hence the charge of irrelevancy is raised again. Moreover, most of the evolutionary game theoretic models developed to date have provided the crudest approximations of the real cultural dynamics driving the social phenomenon in question. One may well wonder why, in these cases, we should take seriously the stability analysis given by the model; answering this question would require one engage in an empirical study as previously discussed, ultimately leading to the charge of irrelevance again.

### 5.3 The value-ladenness of evolutionary game theoretic explanations

If one seeks to use an evolutionary game theoretic model to explain the normativity attached to a social rule, one must explain how such an approach avoids committing the so-called “naturalistic fallacy” of inferring an ought-statement from a conjunction of is-statements.^{[14]}Assuming that the explanation does not commit such a fallacy, one argument charges that it must then be the case that the evolutionary game theoretic explanation merely repackages certain key value claims tacitly assumed in the construction of the model. After all, since any argument whose conclusion is a normative statement must have at least one normative statement in the premises, any evolutionary game theoretic argument purporting to show how certain norms acquire normative force must contain--at least implicitly--a normative statement in the premises. Consequently, this application of evolutionary game theory does not provide a neutral analysis of the norm in question, but merely acts as a vehicle for advancing particular values, namely those smuggled in the premises.

This criticism seems less serious than the charge of irrelevancy. Cultural evolutionary game theoretic explanations of norms need not “smuggle in” normative claims in order to draw normative conclusions. The theory already contains, in its core, a proper subtheory having normative content--namely a theory of rational choice in which boundedly rational agents act in order to maximize, as best as they can, their own self-interest. One may challenge the suitability of this as a foundation for the normative content of certain claims, but this is a different criticism from the above charge. Although cultural evolutionary game theoretic models do act as vehicles for promulgating certain values, they wear those minimal value commitments on their sleeve. Evolutionary explanations of social norms have the virtue of making their value commitments explicit and also of showing how other normative commitments (such as fair division in certain bargaining situations, or cooperation in the prisoner's dilemma) may be derived from the principled action of boundedly rational, self-interested agents.

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## Other Internet Resources

- Evolving Artificial Moral Ecologies, (with interactive simulators), by Peter Danielson (U. British Columbia) and William Harms (Bowling Green State).
- The Evolution of Cooperation on Hostility Gradients , by William Harms (Philosophy, Bowling Green State).
- Brookings Center on Social and Economic Dynamics.
- Complexity of Cooperation, website on Robert Axelrod's book (Center for the Study of Complex Systems, U. Michigan)