Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof that 0 Falls Under Q

The proof that 0 falls under Q is relatively straightforward. We want to show:

y Precedes(y,#[λz Precedes+(z,y)])]0

By λ-Conversion, it suffices to show:

Precedes(0, #[λz Precedes+(z,0)])

So, by the definition of Predecessor, we have to show that there is a concept F and object x such that:

  1. Fx
  2. #[λz Precedes+(z,0)] = #F
  3. 0 = #[λu Fu & ux]

We can demonstrate that there is an F and x for which (1), (2) and (3) hold if we pick F to be [λz Precedes+(z,0)] and pick x to be 0. We now establish (1), (2), and (3) for these choices.

To show that (1) holds, we have to show:

z Precedes+(z,0)]0

But we know, from the definition of Precedes+, that Precedes+(0,0), So by abstraction using λ-Conversion, we are done.

To show that (2) holds, we need do no work, since our choice of F requires us to show:

#[λz Precedes+(z,0)] = #[λz Precedes+(z,0)],

which we know by the logic of identity.

To show (3) holds, we need to show:

(A)   0 = #[λu Precedes+(u,0) & u≠0]

[Note that the λ-expression in (A) has been simplified by applying λ-Conversion to the following (which, strictly speaking, is what results when you substitute our choice for F in (3)):

uz Precedes+(z,0)]u & u≠0]

In what follows, we use the simplified version of this λ-expression.]

To show (A), it suffices to show the following, in virtue of the Lemma Concerning Zero (in our subsection on The Concept Natural Number in §4):

¬∃x ([λu Precedes+(u,0) & u≠0]x)

And by λ-Conversion, it suffices to show:

(B)   ¬∃x (Precedes+(x,0) & x≠0)

We establish (B) as follows.

When we established Theorem 2 (i.e., the fact that 0 is not the successor of any number), we proved that nothing precedes 0:

¬∃x Precedes(x,0)

From this, and Fact (4) about R* (in the subsection on the Ancestral of R, in §4), it follows that nothing ancestrally precedes 0:

¬∃x Precedes*(x,0)

Now suppose (for reductio) the negation of (B); i.e, that there is some object, say a, such that Precedes+(a,0) and a≠0. Then, by definition of Precedes+, it follows that either Precedes*(a,0) or a = 0. But since our reductio hypthesis includes that a≠0, it must be that Precedes*(a,0), which contradicts the fact displayed immediately above.

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