# Fictionalism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

*First published Tue Apr 22, 2008; substantive revision Fri Sep 16, 2011*

Mathematical fictionalism (or as I'll call it,
*fictionalism*) is best thought of as a reaction to mathematical
platonism. Platonism is the view that (a) there exist abstract
mathematical objects (i.e., nonspatiotemporal mathematical objects),
and (b) our mathematical sentences and theories provide true
descriptions of such objects. So, for instance, on the platonist
view, the sentence ‘3 is prime’ provides a straightforward
description of a certain object—namely, the number 3—in much the same
way that the sentence ‘Mars is red’ provides a description
of Mars. But whereas Mars is a physical object, the number 3 is
(according to platonism) an *abstract* object. And
abstract objects, platonists tell us, are wholly nonphysical,
nonmental, nonspatial, nontemporal, and noncausal. Thus, on this
view, the number 3 exists independently of us and our thinking, but it
does not exist in space or time, it is not a physical or mental object,
and it does not enter into causal relations with other objects.
This view has been endorsed by Plato, Frege (1884, 1893–1903, 1919),
Gödel (1964), and in some of their writings, Russell (1912) and
Quine (1948, 1951), not to mention numerous more recent philosophers of
mathematics, e.g., Putnam (1971), Parsons (1971), Steiner (1975),
Resnik (1997), Shapiro (1997), Hale (1987), Wright (1983), Katz (1998),
Zalta (1988), and Colyvan (2001).

Fictionalism, on the other hand, is the view that (a) our mathematical
sentences and theories do purport to be about abstract mathematical
objects, as platonism suggests, but (b) there are no such things as
abstract objects, and so (c) our mathematical theories are not
true. Thus, the idea is that sentences like ‘3 is
prime’ are false, or untrue, for the same reason that, say,
‘The tooth fairy is generous’ is false or untrue—because
just as there is no such person as the tooth fairy, so too there is no
such thing as the number 3. It is important to note, however,
that despite the name, fictionalist views do not have to involve any
very strong claims about the analogy between mathematics and
fiction. For instance, there is no claim here that mathematical
discourse is a kind of fictional discourse.
Thus, fictionalists are not committed to the thesis that there are no
important disanalogies between mathematics and fiction. (We will
return to this issue below, in section 2.4.) Finally, it should
also be noted at the start that fictionalism is a version of
*mathematical nominalism*, the view that there are no such
things as mathematical objects.

Fictionalism was first introduced by Field (1980, 1989, 1998). Since then, the view has been developed—in a few different ways—by Balaguer (1996a, 1998a, 2001, 2009), Rosen (2001), Yablo (2002a, 2002b, 2005), Leng (2005a, 2005b, 2010), and Bueno (2009), though as will become clear below, one might question whether Bueno and Yablo are best interpreted as fictionalists. Finally, one might also interpret Melia (2000) as defending a fictionalist view, though he doesn't really commit to this.

(It's worth noting that Hoffman (2004) also endorses a view that is a kind of fictionalism. Her view is very different from the fictionalist view defined above, however, because it doesn't involve a commitment to thesis (a). She reinterprets mathematics along the lines of Kitcher (1984) and then endorses a fictionalist view of this reinterpretation; i.e., she maintains that once mathematics is reinterpreted in this way, it's singular terms fail to refer and its sentences are not true. (It's not clear how much this view differs from Kitcher's view; one might interpret Kitcher as endorsing a very similar view.) In any event, it is important to note that Hoffman's rejection of thesis (a) makes her view radically different from more standard fictionalist views. As will become clear below, thesis (a) is very plausible, and its plausibility is one of the main reasons for the popularity of platonism. Thus, one of the main selling points of fictionalism—i.e., the standard sort of fictionalism defined above—is that it combines an acceptance of thesis (a) with an anti-platonistic ontology.)

When one first hears the fictionalist hypothesis, it can seem a bit
crazy. Are we really supposed to believe that sentences like
‘3 is prime’ and ‘2 + 2 = 4’ are
*false*? But the appeal of fictionalism starts to emerge
when we realize what the alternatives are. By thinking carefully
about the issues surrounding the interpretation of mathematical
discourse, it can start to seem that fictionalism is actually very
plausible, and indeed, that it might just be the least crazy view out
there.

Section 1 provides a formulation of what might be thought of as the
central argument for fictionalism. Section 2 provides a
discussion of a number of different objections to fictionalism, as well
as a number of different *versions* of fictionalism. These
two things go together very naturally, because the different versions
of fictionalism have emerged in connection with the responses that
different philosophers have given to the various objections to
fictionalism.

- 1. The Argument For Fictionalism
- 2. Objections to Fictionalism and Responses
- 3. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The Argument For Fictionalism

### 1.1 The Main Argument

The main argument for fictionalism proceeds essentially by trying to eliminate all of the alternatives to fictionalism. The argument can be put like this:

- Mathematical sentences like ‘4 is even’ should be read
at face value; that is, they should be read as being of the form
‘
*F**a*’ and, hence, as making straightforward claims about the nature of certain objects; e.g., ‘4 is even’ should be read as making a straightforward claim about the nature of the number 4. But - If sentences like ‘4 is even’ should be read at face value, and if moreover they are true, then there must actually exist objects of the kinds that they're about; for instance, if ‘4 is even’ makes a straightforward claim about the nature of the number 4, and if this sentence is literally true, then there must actually exist such a thing as the number 4. Therefore, from (1) and (2), it follows that
- If sentences like ‘4 is even’ are true, then there are such things as mathematical objects. But
- If there are such things as mathematical objects, then they are abstract objects, i.e., nonspatiotemporal objects; for instance, if there is such a thing as the number 4, then it is an abstract object, not a physical or mental object. But
- There are no such things as abstract objects. Therefore, from (4) and (5) by modus tollens, it follows that
- There are no such things as mathematical objects. And so, from (3) and (6) by modus tollens, it follows that
- Sentences like ‘4 is even’ are not true (indeed, they're not true for the reason that fictionalists give, and so it follows that fictionalism is true).

The three inferences in this argument are all pretty clearly valid, and so the only question is whether the four basic premises—(1), (2), (4), and (5)—are true. And the nice thing about the way this argument is set up is that each of these premises is supposed to get rid of a different alternative to fictionalism. So the argument in (1)-(7) is actually a shell of a much longer argument that includes subarguments in favor of the basic premises and, hence, against the various alternatives to fictionalism.

Given this, we can say that there are five alternatives (or if
you'd rather, five *categories* of alternatives) to
fictionalism. Those who reject (1) can be called *paraphrase
nominalists*; those who reject (2) can be called
*neo-Meinongians*; those who reject (4) are either
*physicalists* or *psychologists*; and those who reject
(5) are *platonists*. In order to motivate their view,
fictionalists need to provide arguments against all of these views.

The easiest part of the fictionalist's job here is arguing against the various anti-platonist views. All of these views—paraphrase nominalism, neo-Meinongianism, physicalism, and psychologism—can be understood (as fictionalism can) as reactions to platonism. Platonism is a very attractive view because it provides an extremely natural and pleasing account of mathematical practice and mathematical discourse. But despite this, many philosophers do not endorse platonism because they cannot bring themselves to accept its ontology. In other words, they simply don't believe that there are any such things as abstract objects. Because of this, much of the work that's been done in the philosophy of mathematics has been dedicated to attempts to avoid platonism. In particular, paraphrase nominalism, neo-Meinongianism, physicalism, and psychologism can all be understood in these terms. They all attempt to undermine the platonistic view of the truth conditions of mathematical sentences. But as will become clear below, there are serious problem with all of these views. And this is where fictionalism comes in: it grants the platonistic view of the truth conditions of mathematical sentences but still denies the platonist's ontological thesis that there exist abstract objects. This makes fictionalism very different from other anti-platonist views. We can appreciate this by noting that platonism involves two different theses, one semantic and the other ontological. The semantic thesis is an empirical hypothesis about the truth conditions of ordinary mathematical utterances, and the ontological thesis is a deeply metaphysical hypothesis about the existence of abstract objects. Every version of anti-platonism rejects the platonist's ontological hypothesis, and all of the non-fictionalistic versions of anti-platonism reject the semantic thesis as well. Fictionalism is the only anti-platonistic view that doesn't reject the semantic thesis. And this is why fictionalism can seem more attractive than the other versions of anti-platonism—because the platonist's semantic hypothesis is extremely plausible and well-motivated. Thus, the versions of anti-platonism that reject this hypothesis can seem implausible and unmotivated.

So, again, the easy part of the argument for fictionalism (or at any
rate, the easi*er* part) is carried out by providing arguments
for premises (1), (2), and (4)—or equivalently, by providing arguments
against the various non-fictionalistic versions of anti-platonism,
i.e., paraphrase nominalism, neo-Meinongianism, physicalism, and
psychologism. The next three subsections (1.2–1.4) discuss these
four views as well as some arguments that fictionalists might mount
against them. Section 1.5 covers the more difficult part of the
fictionalist's argument—i.e., premise (5) and the question of
how fictionalists might argue against platonism.

### 1.2 Premise (1) and Paraphrase Nominalism

Paraphrase nominalism is the view that ordinary mathematical sentences
like ‘3 is prime’ should not be read at face
value—or more specifically, that they should not be read as
being of the form ‘*F**a*’ and making claims
about mathematical objects. There are a few different versions of
this view. Perhaps the most famous is *if-thenism.* On this
view, ‘3 is prime’ is best interpreted as expressing a
conditional claim, such as ‘If there were numbers, then 3 would
be prime’, or perhaps ‘Necessarily, if there are numbers,
then 3 is prime.’ (Versions of if-thenism have been developed by
Putnam (1967a,b) and Hellman (1989); moreover, a precursor to this
view was endorsed by the early Hilbert (see his 1899 and his letters
to Frege in Frege 1980). Finally, other versions of paraphrase
nominalism have been endorsed by Wittgenstein (1956) and Chihara
(1990).)

The problem with paraphrase nominalist views is very simple: they
involve empirical hypotheses about the meanings of ordinary
mathematical utterances that are extremely implausible. For
instance, in connection with if-thenism, it's just really hard to
believe that the best interpretation of what ordinary speakers of
mathematical discourse (ordinary mathematicians and ordinary folk) are
saying when they utter, e.g., ‘3 is prime’ is that *if
there were numbers then 3 would be prime*. This just seems to
get wrong what people actually mean when they utter sentences like
this. Indeed, it seems that a more general point can be made
here. There is a good interpretive principle that says something
like this: we should interpret people's utterances at face value
unless there's evidence that they have positive intentions to be
interpreted nonliterally. Given this, and given (what seems
obvious) that ordinary people don't have positive intentions for
their mathematical utterances to be interpreted nonliterally—e.g., as
expressing conditional propositions—it seems to
follow that we ought to interpret our mathematical utterances at face
value. But this means that we ought to accept premise (1) and
reject paraphrase nominalism.

Paraphrase nominalists might try to respond to this argument by
denying that they are committed to the thesis that their paraphrases
fit with the intentions of ordinary mathematicians and ordinary
folk. Indeed, claims of this sort have been made by both Chihara
(1990, 2004) and Hellman (1998). But paraphrase nominalists cannot
endorse this stance, for if they do, their view will collapse into a
version of fictionalism. If paraphrase nominalists admit that
platonists and fictionalists are right about the meanings
of *real* mathematical utterances—i.e., the utterances of
actual mathematicians—then (since they also want to maintain
that there are no such things as abstract objects) they will be
committed to the claim that the utterances of actual mathematicians
are untrue. Thus, if paraphrase nominalists don't claim that their
paraphrases capture the actual meanings of ordinary mathematical
sentences, then their view won't provide a genuine alternative to
fictionalism. It will collapse into a version of fictionalism. More
specifically, a paraphrase nominalist would just be a fictionalist who
thinks that we ought to *alter* our mathematical language, or
what we mean by our mathematical utterances; or perhaps the claim
would simply be that we *could* alter our mathematical language
if we wanted to and that this fact provides fictionalists with a way
of responding to certain objections.

### 1.3 Premise (2) and Neo-Meinongianism

Neo-Meinongianism is the view that (a) as platonists and fictionalists
maintain, ordinary mathematical sentences like ‘3 is
prime’ should be read at face value, i.e., as being of the form
‘*F**a*’ and hence as making claims about
mathematical objects, and (b) there are no such things as mathematical
objects, but (c) our mathematical sentences are still true. Views of
this kind have been endorsed by Routley (1980), Azzouni (1994, 2004),
Priest (2003, 2005), and Bueno (2005, 2009). It should be noted,
however, that Bueno—in his (2009)—calls his version of
neo-Meinongianism a version of *fictionalism*. This isn't
because he really endorses the view that's being called fictionalism
in this essay; it's because he uses the term
‘fictionalism’ differently from the way in which it's
being used in this essay. But it's important to note that Bueno's
usage isn't *that* different; for as we are about to see,
neo-Meinongianism and fictionalism (as it's being defined here) are
extremely similar views. (Bueno's view also differs from the
fictionalist view defined here in a second way: he
endorses *agnosticism* about abstract objects rather than
full-blown anti-realism. But this difference is even less important
than the first one; if we rephrased (b) and (c) in the above
definition of fictionalism so that they were consistent with
agnosticism, virtually nothing else about the fictionalist view would
have to changed. So fictionalists can choose whether they want to be
agnostic or anti-realist about abstract objects, and this decision
won't have a very big impact on the rest of their view. Indeed, as
will become clear in section 3, Bueno's agnosticism might be more or
less equivalent to the views of certain fictionalists.)

Before describing the problems with neo-Meinongianism, it's important
to note that the central claim behind that view is an empirical
hypothesis about ordinary discourse. In particular, it's a claim about
the meaning of the term ‘true’, or about the concept of
truth. When neo-Meinongians say that, e.g., ‘3 is prime’
could be true even if there were no such thing as the number 3, they
are making a claim about the ordinary concept of truth. They are
saying that that concept applies in certain situations that most of
us—platonists and fictionalists and just about everyone
else—think it *doesn't* apply in. If neo-Meinongians try
to deny that they are making a claim about the
*ordinary* concept of truth, then their view will collapse into
a version of fictionalism. For since they agree with fictionalists
that ‘3 is prime’ purports to be about a certain abstract
object, and since they also agree that there are no such things as
abstract objects, it follows that if they endorsed a standard view of
truth—i.e., a platonist-fictionalist view according to which a
sentence of the form ‘*F**a*’ could not be
true unless ‘*a*’ referred to an actually existing
object—then they would have to admit that ‘3 is
prime’ is untrue. Now, they might go on to argue that these
sentences are *true**—where this is defined in such a way
that sentences of the form ‘*F**a*’ can be
true* even if there is no such thing as *a*—but, of
course, fictionalists would *agree* with this. So if
neo-Meinongianism is to be genuinely distinct from fictionalism, it
has to involve a thesis about the meaning of the ordinary word
‘true’; in particular, the claim has to be that sentences
of the form ‘*F**a*’ can be true, *in the
ordinary sense of the term*, even if the singular term
‘*a*’ doesn't refer to any actually existing object.

Given this, most fictionalists would probably say that the problem with Neo-Meinongianism is that it's empirically implausible. In other words, the objection would be that neo-Meinongianism flies badly in the face of our intuitions about the meaning of ‘true’. And there does seem to be some justification for this claim. For instance, it just seems intuitively obvious that the sentence ‘Mars is a planet’ could not be literally true unless there really existed such a thing as Mars. If this is right—if the neo-Meinongian semantic thesis runs counter to our semantic intuitions—then this provides strong evidence for thinking it's false.

But there is also a second problem with neo-Meinongianism: it's
supposed to provide us with a way of avoiding platonism, but in fact,
it doesn't. *Prima facie*, it might seem that
neo-Meinongianism does deliver a way of avoiding platonism, because
the argument for platonism might seem to rely upon premise (2)
above—i.e., it might seem to rely upon the anti-neo-Meinongian
claim that if sentences like ‘4 is even’ should be read at
face value, i.e., as being of the form
‘*F**a*’, and if these sentence are
literally true, then we are committed to believing in the objects that
they're about, e.g., the number 4. But, in fact, platonists can
formulate their argument so that it doesn't rely upon this
anti-neo-Meinongian premise. To bring this point out, let's
begin by introducing two new terms of
art—‘true_{1}’ and
‘true_{2}’—and stipulating that
‘true_{1}’ is to be taken as expressing the
platonist-fictionalist concept of truth, so that a sentence of the
form ‘*F**a*’ cannot be true_{1}
unless ‘*a*’ refers to an actually existing object, whereas
‘true_{2}’ expresses a neo-Meinongian concept of
truth, so that a sentence of the form
‘*F**a*’ can be true_{2} even if
‘*a*’ doesn't refer to any actually existing object. Given this,
platonists can say the following:

We just don't care whether the word ‘true’, as it's used in ordinary English, expresses truth_{1}or truth_{2}(or whether it's ambiguous and sometimes expresses the one concept and sometimes the other). It's true that standard formulations of the argument for platonism involve claims to the effect that ordinary mathematical sentences like ‘3 is prime’ aretrue. But we could just as easily base our argument on the claim that sentences like this are true_{1}. In doing this, we wouldn't weaken our argument in any way. For the arguments we use to motivate the truth of mathematics—most notably, the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument discussed below—arealreadyarguments for the truth_{1}of mathematics. And this shouldn't be surprising; for whenwesay that ordinary mathematical sentences like ‘3 is prime’ are true, what wemeanis that they're true_{1}; so, of course, the arguments that we give for the truth of mathematics are already supposed to be arguments for the truth_{1}of mathematics.

Given that platonists can proceed in this way, it seems that the
question of whether the neo-Meinongian semantic thesis is
right—i.e., the question of whether the English word
‘true’ expresses the concept of truth_{1} or
truth_{2}—is simply a red herring. The real question is
whether platonists have any good arguments for the truth_{1}
of mathematics (and, of course, whether anti-platonists have any good
arguments *against* the truth_{1} of mathematics). In
other words, if we assume that premises (1) and (4) are true, so that
we have to read our mathematical claims as being about (or at least
purporting to be about) abstract objects, then the real question is
whether there are any good reasons for choosing between platonism and
fictionalism.

### 1.4 Premise (4) and Physicalism and Psychologism

Physicalism is the view that our mathematical sentences and theories are about ordinary physical objects. John Stuart Mill (1843) developed a view of this kind. On his view, mathematics is just a very general natural science. Thus, for instance, according to Mill, the sentence ‘2 + 3 = 5’ is not a claim about abstract objects (the numbers 2, 3, and 5); rather, it's a claim about piles of physical objects (in particular, it tells us that if we push a pile of two objects together with a pile of three objects, we'll get a pile of five objects. (Phillip Kitcher (1984) and the early Penelope Maddy (1990) have also endorsed views with “physicalistic leanings”, but in the end, neither is plausibly interpreted as falling into this camp. Maddy's early view is better thought of as a non-traditional sort of platonism, because according to this view, mathematics is about nonphysical objects that exist in space and time; and Kitcher's view is best thought of as a kind of paraphrase nominalism, because on his view, mathematical utterances turn out not to be about any actually existing objects.)

There are numerous problems with physicalistic views of mathematics. To mention just one of these problems, physicalism seems completely incapable of accounting for various kinds of claims about infinities that we find in mathematics. For instance, it is a theorem of set theory that there are infinitely many transfinite cardinal numbers that keep getting bigger and bigger without end. Thus, set theory is committed to the existence of infinite sets that are so huge that they simply dwarf garden variety infinite sets, like the set of all the natural numbers. There is just no plausible way to interpret this talk of gigantic infinite sets as being about physical objects.

Psychologism is the view that mathematical sentences and theories are
about mental objects. Probably the most common version of this
view holds that numbers are something like ideas in our heads, and
ordinary mathematical sentences like ‘3 is prime’ provide
descriptions of these ideas. This view was popular in the late
19^{th} Century; it was endorsed by, e.g., the early Husserl
(1891), as well as the intuitionists, Brouwer (1912, 1948) and Heyting
(1956). But Frege (1884, 1893–1903) provided a host of arguments
against the view and essentially buried it. To give just one
argument here, it seems that psychologism is just as incapable as
physicalism is of dealing with the huge infinities in
mathematics. As was just seen, standard set theories entail that
there actually exist huge infinities of mathematical objects. But
it's just not believable that there are that many ideas in our
heads. Indeed, it seems clear that there are only finitely many
ideas in our heads. Therefore, it is not plausible to maintain
that the claims of set theory are made true by mental objects.

In response, one might claim that even if there aren't infinitely many ideas in our heads, it seems likely that we have ideas of infinities in our heads. This is no doubt true—there are such ideas in our heads—but this does not save psychologism from the above objection. For our mathematical theories entail that there actually exist infinitely many different mathematical objects. E.g., standard theories of arithmetic entail that there is such a thing as 1, and that there is such a thing as 2 (and that it's distinct from 1), and that there is such a thing as 3 (and that it's distinct from both 1 and 2), and so on. So our mathematical theories are true descriptions of ideas in our heads only if there actually exist infinitely many different ideas in our heads. Thus, since there aren't that many ideas in our heads, we cannot maintain that our mathematical theories are true descriptions of such things.

Alternatively, one might respond to the above argument against
psychologism by moving to a view according to which mathematical
claims are about ideas that we *could* construct,
or *possible mental objects,* or some such thing. But this
would not be a psychologistic view, because on this view, the objects
of mathematics would not be actual mental objects; they would
be *possible* objects, which, presumably, are either abstract
objects or objects of some other metaphysically dubious kind.

Finally, one might object to both of the arguments in this subsection—i.e., the arguments against physicalism and psychologism—by saying something like this:

The arguments given here are supposed to motivate the idea that ordinary mathematical sentences like ‘4 is even’ are not plausibly interpreted as being about physical or mental objects—or more specifically, that they are better interpreted as being about (or at least purporting to be about) abstract objects. But one might object here that, as an interpretation of ordinary mathematical discourse, the platonist/fictionalist view is no more plausible than physicalism or psychologism. For one might find it implausible to suppose that when ordinary folk make mathematical claims, they intend to be speaking about abstract objects.

But platonists and fictionalists are not committed to the thesis that people have positive intentions to be talking about abstract objects. Rather, they can say the following: (i) ordinary mathematical claims are best interpreted at face value—and, hence, as making claims about objects—because typical mathematicians (and, indeed, typical examples of ordinary folk) do not have positive intentions to be speaking nonliterally when they utter mathematical sentences; and (ii) there are features of the intentions of typical mathematicians and typical folk, with respect to their mathematical utterances, that are inconsistent with the idea that these utterances are about physical or mental objects; and (iii) there is nothing in the intentions of typical mathematicians or typical folk that is inconsistent with the idea that our mathematical sentences are about abstract objects. Thus, on this view, the platonist/fictionalist semantic theory is better than other semantic theories of mathematical discourse because it's the only theory that's consistent with the data—not because mathematicians and ordinary folk have positive intentions to be speaking about abstract objects when they utter mathematical sentences.

### 1.5 Premise (5) and Platonism

If the arguments given so far are correct, then the only remaining
views—the only philosophies of mathematics that haven't been
ruled out—are platonism and fictionalism. Thus, to complete
their argument, fictionalists need merely to provide an argument for
premise (5); in other words, they just need to argue against
platonism. But this turns out to be a lot harder than arguing
against the various non-fictionalistic versions of anti-platonism
considered above. As we've seen, fictionalists can argue
against those views by simply motivating a series of empirical
hypotheses about ordinary mathematical discourse and the ordinary
meaning of the word ‘true’. More specifically,
fictionalists can argue against these views by arguing that (a)
ordinary mathematical utterances are best interpreted at face value,
and (b) these utterances cannot plausibly be interpreted as being about
physical or mental objects, and (c) sentences of the form ‘The
object *a* is an *F*’ cannot be true, in the
ordinary sense of the term, unless there really is such a thing as
*a*. But fictionalists cannot argue against platonism in
anything like this way, because fictionalists and platonists are in
agreement about the meanings of ordinary mathematical utterances (and
the word ‘true’). Indeed, platonists and
fictionalists don't disagree about *any* semantic
theses. Their disagreement is about an *ontological*
thesis: platonists believe in abstract objects, whereas fictionalists
do not. Thus, if fictionalists are going to argue against
platonism, they're going to have to use a different kind of
argument.

There are a few different arguments that have been brought against
mathematical platonism, but the most important—and the most famous—is
what is known as the *epistemological* argument against
platonism. This argument goes back at least to Plato. In
contemporary times, it received its most classical statement in a paper
by Paul Benacerraf (1973), although most philosophers of mathematics
agree that Benacerraf's formulation of the argument is
problematic because of its reliance on an implausible causal theory of
knowledge. A better and more standard way to formulate the
argument is as follows:

- Human beings exist entirely within spacetime.
- If there exist any abstract mathematical objects, then they exist outside of spacetime. Therefore, it seems likely that
- If there exist any abstract mathematical objects, then human beings could not attain knowledge of them. But
- It's built into the platonistic view that there do exist abstract
objects and that human beings can acquire knowledge of them (after
all, according to platonism, mathematical knowledge just
*is*knowledge of abstract objects). Therefore, - Platonism is false.

Platonists have tried to respond to this argument in a few different
ways, but the most popular (and, it can be argued, the most plausible)
response is to try to undermine the inference from (i) and (ii) to
(iii) by explaining how (iii) could be false even if (i) and (ii) are
true—i.e., how human beings could acquire knowledge of abstract
objects despite the fact that they are causally isolated from such
objects and, hence, do not have any information-transferring
*contact* with such objects. This strategy of response has
been pursued by Quine (1948, 1951), Steiner (1975), Katz (1981, 1998),
Resnik (1982, 1997), Shapiro (1989, 1997), Lewis (1986), Linsky and
Zalta (1995), Balaguer (1995, 1998a), and Linnebo (2006). The question of whether
any of these responses succeeds is extremely controversial among
philosophers of mathematics. Moreover, anti-platonists do not
have any compelling argument for the thesis that platonists
*couldn't* provide the required explanation here—i.e.,
that they couldn't explain how human beings could acquire
knowledge of abstract objects without the aid of any
information-transferring contact with such objects. Thus, to make
a very long story short, it seems fair to say that the epistemological
argument against platonism is, at best, controversial and
inconclusive.

(For a more complete discussion of the epistemological argument against
platonism, including discussions of the various responses that
platonists have attempted, see the *Stanford Encyclopedia of
Philosophy* entry entitled “Platonism in
Metaphysics”.)

Given that the epistemological argument does not succeed in refuting
platonism, fictionalists might attempt to provide some other argument
against platonism. One such argument that has received
considerable attention is the *multiple-reductions
argument*. The classical statement of this argument is given,
once again, by Benacerraf (1965). The argument can be run in
connection with any of our mathematical theories, but the point is
usually made in connection with arithmetic. Moreover, even when
we zero in on arithmetic, there are still many different ways to
formulate the argument. One way to do this is as follows: (A) if
there are any sequences of abstract objects that satisfy our
arithmetical theories, then there are infinitely many, and there is
nothing “metaphysically special” about any of these
sequences that makes it stand out as *the* sequence of natural
numbers; but (B) platonism is committed to the thesis that there is a
unique sequence of abstract objects that is the natural numbers.
Therefore, (C) platonism is false.

Platonists have offered numerous responses to this argument.
Probably the most common strategy has been to reject (A), i.e., to
argue that platonists can in fact defend the claim that there is a
unique sequence that stands out as *the* sequence of natural
numbers. This strategy has been pursued in different ways by,
e.g., Resnik (1997), Shapiro (1997), Parsons (1990), and Linsky and
Zalta (1995). Moreover, Balaguer (1998a) argues that
even if (A) is true, it doesn't matter, because (B) is false:
platonists can simply admit that there are numerous sequences that
satisfy our arithmetical theories and that it may be that none of them
stands out as the one and only sequence of natural numbers. There
is no widespread agreement on the status of these platonistic
responses, and so, as is the case with the epistemological argument, it
would be extremely controversial, if not downright implausible, to
claim that the multiple-reductions argument refutes platonism.

Aside from this, the only argument against platonism that has received much attention in the philosophy of mathematics is an Ockham's-razor-based argument. We will return to this argument (very briefly) in section 3; for now, we can simply note that, like the epistemological argument and the multiple-reductions argument, the Ockham's-razor-based argument is very controversial, and the claim that this argument refutes platonism is (at the very least) tendentious. Thus, the overall conclusion that we seem led to here is this: even if fictionalists can motivate the platonist/fictionalist semantics of mathematical discourse and, thus, eliminate all of the anti-platonistic alternatives to fictionalism, they do not have any really compelling argument against platonism, or for the conclusion that fictionalism is superior to platonism. In other words, fictionalists don't have any compelling argument for premise (5), and so the positive argument for their view is, at best, incomplete.

## 2. Objections to Fictionalism and Responses

Given that there are no compelling arguments against platonism, the next question one might naturally ask is whether there are any good arguments against fictionalism (and hence, if platonism is really the only plausible alternative to fictionalism, in favor of platonism). The present section considers several such arguments. In going through the fictionalist responses to these arguments, we will also see how different philosophers have developed different versions of fictionalism.

### 2.1 The Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument

By far the most important and widely discussed argument against fictionalism is what's known as the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument (see, e.g., Quine (1948, 1951), Putnam (1971), Resnik (1997), and Colyvan (2001)). This argument has been formulated in a number of different ways. One very simple version of the argument can be put like this: (i) mathematical sentences form an indispensable part of our empirical theories of the physical world—i.e., our theories of physics, chemistry, and so on; (ii) we have good reasons for thinking that these empirical theories are true, i.e., that they give us accurate pictures of the world; therefore, (iii) we have good reasons to think that our mathematical sentences are true and, hence, that fictionalism is false.

Fictionalists have developed two different kinds of responses to this
argument. The first one, due to Field (1980), can be called the
*nominalization response*, and the version of fictionalism it
gives us can be called *hard-road fictionalism*. The second
response, developed by Balaguer (1996a, 1998a), Melia (2000), Rosen
(2001), Yablo (2005), Bueno (2009), and Leng (2010), can be called
the *no-nominalization response*, and the version of
fictionalism it gives us can be called *easy-road
fictionalism*, or *weasel fictionalism*. (The names here
are due to Colyvan and Melia; the former speaks of ‘hard-road
nominalism’ and ‘easy-road nominalism’, and the
latter speaks of ‘weasel nominalism’.)

Field's hard-road response is based on the rejection of premise
(i). He argues that mathematics is, in fact, *not*
indispensable to empirical science. Field tries to establish this
thesis by arguing that our empirical theories can be
*nominalized*, i.e., reformulated in a way that avoids reference
to, and existential quantification over, abstract objects. This
is an extremely controversial claim, and it is very difficult to
establish, for presumably, one would have to actually carry out the
nominalization for every one of our empirical theories—thus, the name
*hard-road fictionalism*. Field did not try to do this for
all of our empirical theories. Rather, he tried to motivate his
position by explaining how the nominalization would go for one
empirical theory, namely, Newtonian Gravitation Theory. Now, some
people have complained that even if Field's strategy could work
for this one theory, it might not work for other theories, and in
particular, Malament (1982) has argued that his strategy would
*not* work in connection with Quantum Mechanics (but see
Balaguer (1996b and 1998a) for an argument that Field's
strategy *can* be extended to the case of quantum mechanics,
and see Bueno (2003) for a response). Moreover, there are several
other objections that have been raised against Field's
program—see, e.g., Malament (1982), Shapiro (1983), Resnik
(1985), and Chihara (1990, chapter 8, section 5). At present, the
status of Field's response to the Quine-Putnam argument remains
controversial at best.

Balaguer's easy-road response begins by granting premise (i) of the
Quine-Putnam argument—i.e., by granting (for the sake of
argument) that there do exist indispensable applications of
mathematics to empirical science. Balaguer's strategy is simply to
account for these applications from a fictionalist point of view. His
argument can be summarized as follows: If there are any such things as
abstract objects, then they are causally inert. But given this, it
follows that the truth of empirical science depends upon two sets of
facts that hold or don't hold independently of one another. One of
these sets of facts is purely platonistic and mathematical, and the
other is purely physical (or more precisely, purely
anti-platonistic). Since these two sets of facts hold or don't hold
independently of one another, fictionalists can maintain that (a)
there does obtain a set of purely physical facts of the sort required
here, i.e., the sort needed to make empirical science true, but (b)
there doesn't obtain a set of purely platonistic facts of the sort
required for the truth of empirical science (because there are no such
things as abstract objects). Therefore, fictionalism is consistent
with an essentially realistic view of empirical science, because
fictionalists can maintain that even if there are no such things as
mathematical objects and, hence, our empirical theories aren't
strictly true, these theories still paint an essentially accurate
picture of the physical world, because the physical world is just the
way it needs to be for empirical science to be true. In other words,
fictionalists can maintain that the physical world “holds
up *its end* of the empirical-science bargain”. Finally,
to provide a view of what mathematics is doing in empirical science,
the claim is that it functions as a descriptive or representational
aid. In other words, it gives us an easy way of making claims about
the physical world. For instance, by making reference to real
numbers—or, better, by using terms that
*purport* to refer to real numbers—we give ourselves an
easy way of describing the temperature states of physical systems. And
Balaguer argues that mathematics can succeed in its role as a
descriptive aid even if it isn't true; indeed, he argues that truth is
simply no help at all in this connection.

Others have developed similar
views. For instance, Melia (2000) argues that we can assert our
empirical theories and then simply *take back* the
platonistic/mathematical consequences of those assertions. And
Rosen (2001) argues that fictionalism is epistemically permissible
because another community of scientists could accept the very same
theories that we do while endorsing—or, more to the point,
*rationally* endorsing—a fictionalist attitude toward the
mathematical components of their theories. And Bueno (2009) argues
that mathematics plays a descriptive role in empirical science, and
because of this, it needn't be true in order to be applicable. And
Leng (2010) argues that the indispensability argument does not refute
fictionalism because fictionalists can provide an adequate account of
the success of science.

Yablo (2005, 2002a, 2002b) also develops a view like this (and it's
worth noting that his view here draws heavily on the work of Walton
(1990)). Yablo claims that mathematics appears in science as a
representational aid and that it doesn't need to be true in order to
do this well. But his version of the view is a bit different, because
he thinks that the sentences of our platonistically formulated
empirical theories—or at least typical utterances of these
sentences—are actually
*true*, because their *real contents* are
nominalistic. To use a trivial sort of example, consider the
sentence

(M) The number of Martian moons is 2.

According to Yablo, typical utterances of sentences like (M) are analogous to ordinary instances of figurative speech, e.g., sentences like

(A) The average mum has 2.4 children.

The syntactic form of (A) seems to suggest that it's about an
actual object known as *the average mum*; but, of course, it
isn't—to read it in this way would be to misunderstand what
people mean when they utter sentences like (A). Likewise,
according to Yablo, while it might seem that (M) is making a claim
partially about an actual object known as *2*, it really
isn't. Rather, the real content of (M)—i.e., what typical
utterances of this sentence really *say*—is that there are two
Martian moons. And, of course, this claim—i.e., the claim that
there are two Martian moons—is not a claim about the number 2 or any
other abstract object; it is nominalistically kosher. In sum,
then, the idea here is that fictionalists about pure mathematics can
endorse a paraphrase nominalist view of mixed mathematical
sentences.

(It is worth noting that Yablo also seems to think that, at least
sometimes, *pure* mathematical sentences have real
contents—i.e., really say things—that are nominalistic and
true. For instance, he thinks that, at least sometimes, sentences
like ‘3 + 2 = 5’ say things like *if there are three Fs
and two Gs, then (barring overlap) there are five F-or-Gs*.
Moreover, at times, Yablo seems to at least hint at the view that, at
least sometimes, when we utter sentences like ‘3 is prime,’
what we're really saying is that ‘3 is prime’ is true
or acceptable according to the theory (or the story, or the game) of
arithmetic. It's not clear how seriously Yablo takes this
idea, however; at any rate, it seems pretty clear that if he endorses
it at all, he thinks it's true in only some contexts, i.e., of
only some pure mathematical utterances. Whatever Yablo's
view is, though, it's important to note that views of this
general kind—i.e., views that take pure mathematical sentences to have
real contents, or really say things, that are nominalistic and
true—are *not versions of fictionalism at all*, as that view
has been defined here. They are rather versions of paraphrase
nominalism, and so they are subject to the argument against that view
given in section 1.2. We will return (very briefly) to the issue
of whether Yablo's view is really a version of fictionalism in
section 2.3.)

It's worth noting that proponents of easy-road nominalism do not prefer their view to Field's simply because it's “easier”, or because it doesn't involve a commitment to the controversial claim that our empirical theories can be nominalized. Melia, Yablo, and Balaguer all argue that the view is independently superior to Field's view because it fits better with actual scientific practice.

A response to the easy-road view has been given by Colyvan (2002) and
Baker (2005, 2009). They argue that mathematics doesn't just play a
descriptive role in science. It also plays an *explanatory*
role. For instance, Baker considers a case involving various species
of periodic cicadas in which the nymphal stage is either 13 or 17
years. Why are the nymphal stages 13 or 17 years? According to
evolutionary biologists, the answer is that 13 and 17 are prime
numbers, and this minimizes intersections with other periodic species.
Colyvan and Baker argue that cases like this—cases in which
mathematical objects play an indispensable role in the explanations of
physical phenomena—provide us with a better and more powerful
version of the indispensability argument. Indeed, they argue that if
there really are cases involving genuinely mathematical explanations
of physical phenomena, then easy-road versions of fictionalism cannot
succeed. But this claim is open to debate, and responses to these
explanatory versions of the indispensability argument have been given
by Melia (2002), Leng (2005b), Bangu (2008), and Daly and Langford
(2009).

### 2.2 Objectivity

A second objection to fictionalism is based on the idea that
fictionalists cannot account for the *objectivity* of
mathematics. It is an obvious fact about mathematical practice
that there's some sort of objectivity at work in that
practice. There's an important difference in mathematics
between sentences like ‘2 + 2 = 4’ and ‘3 is
prime’ on the one hand and ‘2 + 2 = 5’ and ‘3
is composite’ on the other. There's obviously
*some* sense in which the first two sentences, but not the
second two, are “correct”, or “right”, or
“good”, or some such thing. The most obvious thing to
say here is that the first two sentence are *true* whereas the
latter two are *false*. But fictionalists cannot say this;
they're committed to saying that all four of these sentences are
untrue. Thus, the question arises whether fictionalists have any
adequate account of the objectivity of mathematics—i.e., of the
differences between these two kinds of sentences.

Once again, there are two different responses that fictionalists have
given to this problem. These two responses give us versions of
fictionalism that, for lack of a better pair of terms, can be called
*formalistic fictionalism* and *non-formalistic
fictionalism*.

The formalistic view has been developed by Field (1980, 1989,
1998). On his view, the difference between ‘3 is
prime’ and ‘3 is composite’ is analogous to the
difference between, say, ‘Santa Claus wears a red suit’ and
‘Santa Claus wears a green suit’. More specifically,
Field's idea is that the difference between sentences like
‘3 is prime’ and ‘3 is composite’ is that the
former (but not the latter) are part of a certain well-known
“story”, namely, the story of mathematics. Field puts
this point by saying that while ‘3 is prime’ and ‘3
is composite’ are both strictly untrue, the former is *true in
the story of mathematics*, whereas the latter is not. Now,
most of Field's view here is consistent with both formalistic
fictionalism and non-formalistic fictionalism. The difference
between these two views has to do with what fictionalists take the
story of mathematics to consist in. For Field, the story of
mathematics consists essentially in a bunch of formal systems, namely,
the ones that we currently accept. More precisely, he says (1998,
p. 391) that a mathematical sentence is fictionalistically correct if
and only if it is “a *consequence* of accepted axioms [in
a]…sense of consequence that goes a bit beyond first-order
consequence in including the logic of the quantifier ‘only
finitely many’”. So on this view, the difference
between sentences like ‘3 is prime’ and ‘3 is
composite’—the reason the former are “correct” and
the latter are not—is that the former follow from accepted
mathematical axioms. (This view has also been endorsed by Leng
(2010); she says that mathematical acceptability
comes down to following from accepted axioms.)

Balaguer (2001, 2009) argues that Field's formalistic view can't be
right, and he develops a non-formalistic alternative to it. His
argument against the formalistic view is that it cannot account for
all of the objectivity that we find in mathematics. Most importantly,
the formalistic view entails (incorrectly) that there can be no
objectively correct answers to questions that ask about the truth
values of mathematical sentences that are undecidable in currently
accepted mathematical theories. The most famous example here is
probably the continuum hypothesis (CH), which is undecidable in
currently accepted set theories, e.g., Zermelo-Frankel set theory
(ZF). (In other words, ZF is consistent with both CH and ~CH; i.e.,
ZF+CH and ZF+~CH are both consistent set theories.) Given this, it
follows from Field's view that neither CH nor ~CH is part of the story
of mathematics and, hence, that there is no objectively correct answer
to the CH question. This, however, seems unacceptable, because it
could turn out that mathematicians are going to *discover* an
objectively correct answer to the CH question. For instance, suppose
that some mathematician came up with a new axiom candidate AX such
that (i) all mathematicians agreed that AX was an intuitively obvious
claim about sets, and (ii) ZF+AX entailed CH. If this happened, then
mathematicians would say that they had *proven* CH, and that
they had *discovered* that CH was correct, and so on. Field's
view would force us to say that if we endorsed AX, then CH
would *become* true in the story of mathematics. But this seems
to get things wrong. Given the intuitive obviousness of AX, it seems
very natural to say that, in this scenario, mathematicians discovered
that CH had been true (or “correct”, or true in the story
of mathematics, or whatever we want to call it) *all
along*—i.e., that we didn't just make this up by endorsing a
new theory. And, again, it seems that this is what
mathematicians *would* say. So, Balaguer argues, Field's
formalistic view of the objectivity of mathematics is
unacceptable.

Balaguer's non-formalistic version of fictionalism retains Field's thesis that mathematical “correctness” has to do with being true in the story of mathematics, but it abandons the Fieldian view that the story of mathematics consists in currently accepted axioms. According to Balaguer, the so-called “story of mathematics” consists in the thesis that there actually exist abstract mathematical objects of the kinds that platonists have in mind, i.e., the kinds that our mathematical theories purport to be about. Thus, on this view, a mathematical sentence is fictionalistically correct if and only if it would have been true if there had actually existed abstract mathematical objects of the kinds that platonists have in mind. Balaguer argues that if fictionalists adopt this view, they can avoid the above problem with Field's view and, more generally, they can completely solve the problem of objectivity because they can mimic everything platonists say about objectivity.

### 2.3 Revolutionism and Hermeneuticism

Another objection to fictionalism is put forward by Burgess (2004)—and it should be noted that the argument here has roots in Burgess (1983) and Burgess and Rosen (1997). The argument can be put like this:

Fictionalists face a dilemma: they have to endorse either hermeneutic fictionalism or revolutionary fictionalism, but neither is plausible. We can define hermeneutic fictionalism as the view that mathematicians (and perhaps ordinary folk) intend their mathematical talk to be taken as a form of fiction; more specifically, the view here is that, according to ordinary mathematical intentions, singular terms like ‘3’ are not supposed to refer, and sentences like ‘3 is prime’ are not supposed to be true. But hermeneutic fictionalism is implausible and unmotivated; as an empirical hypothesis about what mathematicians intend, there is simply no good evidence for it, and it seems obviously false. Revolutionary fictionalism, on the other hand, is the view that (a) mathematicians do not intend their utterances to be taken as fiction, or as non-literal in any other way; and so (b) we should interpret mathematicians as really asserting what their sentences say, i.e., as making assertions that are about (or that purport to be about) mathematical objects; but (c) since there are no such things as mathematical objects, the assertions of mathematicians are simply mistaken. But revolutionary fictionalism is implausible as well; given the track records of philosophers and mathematicians, it would be “comically immodest” for philosophers to presume that they had discovered a problem with mathematics (Burgess, 2004, p. 30).

No one has ever defended hermeneutic fictionalism, as it's
defined above. Yablo (2002a) claims that his view is a version of
hermeneutic fictionalism, but the view he has in mind is a bit
different from the hermeneutic fictionalist view described above.
Yablo does not claim that mathematicians intend their utterances of
sentences like ‘3 is prime’ to be taken as fictional
claims. Rather, he thinks these utterances are (at least
sometimes, or perhaps typically) analogous to ordinary examples of
figurative speech, e.g., sentences like ‘The back burner is where
you put things to let them simmer.’ This sentence contains
a singular term—‘the back burner’—that seems
(syntactically) to be a denoting expression; but it's not really
a denoting expression (at least in typical cases) and to interpret it
as a genuine denoting expression in sentences like the above would be
to badly misunderstand what typical speakers of sentences like this
intend to be saying. Yablo thinks that something like this is
true in connection with typical utterances of (pure and mixed)
mathematical sentences, e.g., sentences like ‘3 is prime’
and ‘The number of Martian moons is 2.’ So Yablo is
certainly proposing a hermeneutic *nominalist* view, but
it's not clear that his view is best thought of as a kind of
hermeneutic *fictionalism*. As was noted above (section
2.1), the view might be better classified as a sort of paraphrase
nominalism. Yablo calls his view *figuralism*, and he
talks as if it is a version of fictionalism. But he seems to be
using the term ‘fictionalism’ differently from how
it's been defined here. What he likely has in mind is this:
on a *literal* reading, mathematical sentences are untrue, as
fictionalism says, but there's an alternative reading on which
they come out true (and nominalistically kosher). But what makes
it awkward to take Yablo's view as a version of fictionalism is
that he seems to think that what (pure and mixed) mathematical
sentences *really say*—or, more precisely, what typical
utterances of these sentences really say—is true and nominalistic in
content. This sounds more like paraphrase nominalism than
fictionalism.

Stanley (2002) has mounted several arguments against hermeneutic fictionalism. Responses to his arguments are given by Yablo (2002a) and Liggins (2010).

In contrast to Yablo, Leng (2005a, 2010), Daly (2006), and Balaguer
(2009) respond to Burgess's argument by defending revolutionary
fictionalism. Leng's version of the response is based on the claim
that it is acceptable for philosophers to evaluate and criticize the
work of mathematicians. Of course, Leng acknowledges that mathematics
is a very successful practice and that philosophers have to respect
this, but her claim is that we can account for the success of
mathematics without supposing that it's *true*. And given this,
she argues, we can rationally evaluate and criticize mathematical
practice from the outside, from a philosophical point of view.

Finally, Balaguer (2009) argues that there are ways for fictionalists to avoid both hermeneuticism and revolutionism and, hence, that they might be able to avoid Burgess's dilemma altogether. And Armour-Garb (forthcoming) has argued in response that the version of (non-hermeneuticist, non-revolutionary) fictionalism that Balaguer proposes here is untenable.

### 2.4 Similarity to Fiction

A few people—e.g., Katz (1998), Thomas (2000 and 2002), Hoffman
(2004), and Burgess (2004)—have objected to fictionalism on the
grounds that there are obvious disanalogies between mathematics and
fiction. (What exactly the disanalogies are differs in different
versions of the objection. E.g., Katz argues that consistency is
an important criterion for goodness in mathematics but not in
fiction. And Burgess argues that the question of whether
mathematical objects exist is not empirically meaningful, whereas the
question of whether the (non-abstract) objects in our fictional stories
exist *is* empirically meaningful.)

One way that fictionalists can respond to this objection is to claim that it's simply irrelevant, because fictionalism does not involve the claim that there are no important disanalogies between mathematics and fiction. As it was defined above, fictionalism is the view that (a) our mathematical sentences and theories do purport to be about abstract mathematical objects, as platonism suggests, but (b) there are no such things as abstract objects, and so (c) our mathematical theories are not true. There is no claim about fictional discourse at all here, and so fictionalists can simply deny that their view entails that there are no important disanalogies between mathematics and fiction.

Now, this does not mean that fictionalists can't claim that there
are some relevant analogies between mathematics and fiction. They
can of course claim that there *are*; e.g., they might want to
say that, as is the case in mathematics, there are no such things as
fictional objects and, because of this, typical fictional sentences are
not literally true. But by making such claims, fictionalists do
not commit themselves to any stronger claims about the analogy between
mathematics and fiction—e.g., that mathematical discourse is a kind of
fictional discourse—and they certainly don't commit themselves
to the claim that there are no important disanalogies between the two
enterprises. In short, fictionalism is perfectly consistent with
the claim that there are numerous important disanalogies between
mathematics and fiction.

Finally, it should be noted that there are *some* fictionalists
who do seem to want to make some stronger claims about the analogy
between mathematics and fiction. Such people might have to take
objections of the above kind more seriously. But none of the
fictionalists discussed in this essay endorses any very strong claims
of this kind; in particular, none of them says anything that entails
that there are no important disanalogies between mathematics and
fiction. On the other hand, it should be noted that Yablo and Bueno
have made some claims in this connection that go beyond what
fictionalists need to say. For instance, Bueno (2009) says that
mathematical objects are similar to fictional characters in that they
are abstract *artifacts* (in saying this, he follows Amie
Thomasson's (1999) view of fictional characters). And Yablo has made
some relatively strong claims about an analogy that he thinks holds
between mathematical utterances and
*metaphorical* utterances, or figurative utterances. Thus,
Yablo's particular version of fictionalism is open to objections
to the effect that mathematical utterances are in fact *not*
similar or analogous to metaphorical utterances. Some objections
of this kind have been raised by Stanley (2002), and Yablo responds to
them in his (2002a). But since Yablo doesn't claim that
mathematical utterances are analogous to *fictional* utterances,
he does not have to respond to objections of the kind mentioned at the
start of the present subsection.

### 2.5 Accepting and Believing

As became clear in section 2.2, while fictionalists think that
sentences like ‘2 + 2 = 4’ are strictly speaking false,
they nonetheless think they're “correct” in some sense of
the term. What, then, is the fictionalist's *attitude* toward
these sentences? Following Bas van Fraassen (1980), who endorses a
similar view with respect to empirical science, the standard
fictionalist line here is that they *accept* sentences like
‘2 + 2 = 4’ without *believing* them. How exactly
acceptance should be defined is a matter of some controversy, but one
obvious way to proceed here is to claim that
fictionalists *accept* a pure mathematical sentence S if and
only if they believe that S is true in the story of mathematics.

Some people object to the distinction between belief and acceptance. Horwich (1991), O'Leary-Hawthorne (1997), and Burgess and Rosen (1997) present arguments for the claim that there is no real difference between acceptance and belief because, roughly, (a) to believe something is just to be disposed to behave in certain ways, and (b) those who believe that 2 + 2 = 4 and those who allegedly only accept that 2 + 2 = 4 are presumably disposed to behave in exactly the same ways.

Daly (2008) and Leng (2010) provide a number of responses to this
argument. One point Daly makes is that fictionalists are in
fact *not* disposed to behave in the same ways that platonists
are. They're disposed to behave very differently in response to
questions like, “Do there actually exist any such things as
numbers?”

### 2.6 Other Objections

There are, of course, other objections to fictionalism. Probably the
most widely discussed is based on the claim that fictionalism is not a
genuinely nominalistic view because the very formulation of
fictionalism includes statements that involve ontological commitments
to abstract objects. It would be difficult to address this objection
here, though, because it takes a different form in connection with
each different version of fictionalism, and as the foregoing
discussion makes clear, there are many different versions of
fictionalism (e.g., one can endorse either hard-road fictionalism or
easy-road fictionalism; and both of these views can be combined with
either formalistic fictionalism or non-formalistic fictionalism; and
any of these views can be combined with hermeneutic fictionalism or
revolutionary fictionalism; and so on). It should be noted, though,
that several different defenders of fictionalism have responded to
worries about the nominalistic status of their own particular versions
of fictionalism. In particular, Field (1989) defends his version of
fictionalism against the charge that it is commits to the existence
of *spacetime points*, which one might think are not
nominalistically kosher; and Balaguer (1998a) defends his version
against the charge that it (and, indeed, Field's version) are
committed to the existence of *stories*, which would presumably
be abstract objects if they existed; and finally, Rosen (2001) defends
his view against the charge that it commits to *theories* and
*possible worlds*. Balaguer and Rosen are both concerned the
worry that ficitonalists are committed to the existence
of *sentence types*, which would presumably be abstract
objects. Daly presents a version of this worry in his (2008), and he
provides a counter to Balaguer's response to the worry. He also
provides a counter to a response that Rosen had given earlier, in his
(1990).

## 3. Conclusion

So there are several different objections to fictionalism out there,
but fictionalists have responses to all of them, and it is not at all
obvious that any of the objections succeeds in refuting
fictionalism. Thus, at the present time, it seems at least prima facie
plausible to suppose that fictionalism can be defended. On the other
hand, if the claims of section 1 are correct, then fictionalists do
not have a compelling positive argument in favor of their view. The
arguments of sections 1.2–1.4 suggest that there are good reasons for
rejecting the various anti-platonistic alternatives to fictionalism
and, hence, for thinking that platonism and fictionalism are the two
best views of mathematics, but there does not seem to be any good
argument for favoring fictionalism over platonism or *vice
versa*. Now, most fictionalists would probably say—and
some *have* said (see, e.g., Leng, 2010)—that this
situation itself already gives us a good reason to favor fictionalism
over platonism. For if we take the claim that there is no good
positive argument for platonism and we combine it with Ockham's razor
(i.e., the principle that tells us that if two theories account for
all the same facts, then, *ceteris parabis*, we ought to
endorse the more ontologically parsimonious of the two), then we seem
to be led to the result that fictionalism is superior to platonism. It
should be noted, however, that this argument is explicitly rejected by
at least two of the defenders of fictionalism discussed above. Rosen
(see, e.g., Burgess and Rosen, 1997) doubts that there is any good
reason to accept Ockham's razor, and Balaguer (1998a) argues that even
if we accept it, there are reasons to think that it is not applicable
in the present case. Thus, Rosen and Balaguer both think that, at
present, we do not have any good reason to endorse platonism or
fictionalism. Moreover, as was noted in section 1.3, Bueno (2009)
thinks fictionalists should be *agnostic* about the existence
of abstract objects; this seems to be more or less equivalent to
Rosen's view; Balaguer's view is a bit different because he actually
thinks that there's no fact of the matter whether abstract objects
exist.

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abstract objects | fictionalism | mathematics, philosophy of | mathematics, philosophy of: indispensability arguments in the | mathematics, philosophy of: nominalism | mathematics, philosophy of: Platonism | nominalism: in metaphysics | nonexistent objects | Platonism: in metaphysics | psychologism