Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Oct 10, 2012

Existence raises deep and important problems in metaphysics, philosophy of language, and philosophical logic. Many of the issues can be organized around the following two questions: Is existence a property of individuals? and Assuming that existence is a property of individuals, are there individuals that lack it?

What does it mean to ask if existence is a property? A full answer to this question requires a general theory of properties, which is well beyond the scope of this article. I briefly sketch the landscape to set up our discussion of existence. (See the entries on properties and substance for deeper discussion.) Properties contrast with individuals. This distinction can be explicated using the instantiation relation. My cat instantiates the property of being hungry, as that is a way he is, and, being an individual, is not himself instantiated by anything. While properties also instantiate—the property of being red, for example, has the property of being a color—only properties are instantiated; individuals only instantiate. So, our first question is whether existence is instantiated and, if so, whether it is instantiated by individuals like Obama, my chair, and the fig tree in my backyard. Do individuals, in addition to ordinary properties like being human, being comfortable to sit in, and needing more water, instantiate a property expressed by the English verb ‘exists’? 

There is a debate in the literature on properties between the abundant conception of properties, according to which there is a property corresponding to every natural language predicate and, more generally, every class of individuals, and the sparse conception of properties, according to which a predicate expresses a property only if the objects that predicate is true of resemble one another in an intrinsic way. If the abundant conception is true, then our first question may seem trivial: Existence is a property of individuals because sentences like ‘Bill Gates exists’ are grammatical and there is a class of all individuals and hence a corresponding property of existing. It seems, then, that our first question has bite only if the sparse conception is true. But appearances deceive. As we will see in section 1, there is a controversy as to whether the logical form of a sentence like ‘Bill Gates exists’ is really subject-predicate in structure and so whether the English verb ‘exists’ really is predicated of individuals. The question whether existence is a property of individuals is perhaps more straightforward on the sparse conception of properties. But the question can still be raised even on the abundant conception as the question whether existence is a property of individuals involved in our talk of what exists and what does not, which is then a question about the logical form of the sentences used in our existential discourse. 

We can trace the issue of whether existence is a property to a disagreement between the ancient Greek philosopher Aristotle and some of his medieval followers over the relationship between an individual's essence and its existence. The debate requires some background. We begin with the distinction between accident and essence and that distinction's relation to contingency and necessity. Some of a thing's properties are contingent, in the sense that the thing might not have had them. I am writing right now, but I might have been out for a run instead. So working on a paper right now is one of my contingent properties. Contingent properties contrast with necessary properties. I am necessarily human, in the sense that it is impossible that I am a nonhuman. All contingent properties are accidents and all essences are necessary but, according to the Aristotelian, some necessary properties are accidents. A thing's essential properties are inseparable from the bearer, not only in the sense that the property is necessarily had by that object but in the deeper sense that any adequate account of what that object is involves that property; they are part of any adequate definition of the thing or answer to the question ‘What is it?’. I am essentially a human and perhaps essentially the person I in fact am, if there are individual essences in addition to general essences. I am necessarily identical to something and necessarily such that 2+2=4, but these properties are among my accidents, as they are not part of any adequate account of what I am and what distinguishes me from others. While this distinction between a thing's necessary properties and its essential properties is controversial, there is no doubt that it was Aristotle's view, shared by most of his medieval followers, and so informed the first historical occurrence of the debate about existence under discussion. Aristotle seems to have seen nothing more to existence than essence; there is not a space between an articulation of what a thing is and that thing's existing. Saint Thomas Aquinas, on the other hand, famously distinguished a thing's essence from its existence. Aquinas argued something as follows, in chapter 4 of his On Being and Essence. One can have an understanding of what a man or a phoenix is without knowing whether it exists. So, existence is something in addition to essence. In short, Aquinas argued that existence is a separate property as existence is not part of most objects's natures and so those objects can be conceived or thought of separately from their existing.

There is a long and distinguished line of philosophers, including David Hume, Immanuel Kant, Gottlob Frege, and Bertrand Russell, who followed Aristotle in denying that existence is a property of individuals, even as they rejected other aspects of Aristotle's views. Hume argued (in A Treatise of Human Nature 1.2.6) that there is no impression of existence distinct from the impression of an object, which is ultimately on Hume's view a bundle of qualities. As all of our contentful ideas derive from impressions, Hume concluded that existence is not a separate property of an object. Kant's criticism of the ontological arguments for the existence of God rested on a rejection of the claim that existence is a property of an object. Proponents of the ontological argument argue that the concept of God as an entity with all perfections or a being of which no greater can be conceived entails God's existence, as existence is a perfection and a being that exists is greater than a being that does not exist. Kant objected (in his Critique of Pure Reason, A596/B624-A602/B630) that existence is not a property. “Thus when I think a thing, through whichever and however many predicates I like (even in its thoroughgoing determination), not the least bit gets added to the thing when I posit in addition that this thing is. For otherwise what would exist would not be the same as what I had thought in my concept, but more than that, and I could not say that the very object of my concept exists” (A600/B628). Finally, both Frege and Russell maintained that existence is not a property of individuals but instead a second-order property—a property of concepts, for Frege, and of propositional functions, for Russell. Crudely, to say that dinosaurs do not exist is to say that the property of being a dinosaur is not instantiated; to say that Jean-Baptiste Botul does not exist is to say that some property—say, the property of being a unique post-war critic of Kant and father of Butolism—is not instantiated. In neither case is it to say of some individual that it does not exist, which neither Frege nor Russell thought made sense.

The view that existence is not a property of individuals became the common view in the early 20th Century. While Aristotle, Hume, and Kant's related reasons for the thesis have persuaded some, the dominant force behind this agreement is the thought, developed most forcefully in [Russell 1905b], that denying that existence is a first-order property is the only way to avoid the consequence that there are things that do not exist and thus that there is a distinction between being and existing, our second framing question from above. The thesis that there are things that do not exist was held by the Austrian philosopher Alexius Meinong. Existence is a genuine property of individuals, Meinong maintained, but not universally had. While there are many ways to motivate Meinongianism, a primary motivation is the puzzle of negative singular existentials—sentences that seem to truly assert the nonexistence of an individual, such as the sentence ‘Jean-Baptiste Botul does not exist’. In order to be true, it seems, the subject position must designate some entity of which nonexistence is truly predicated, in which case there are things—the designation of these singular terms—that do not exist. Frege and Russell, by contrast, take the same sentences to demonstrate that those expressions are not genuine singular terms at all and that negative existentials all have a general form, asserting the noninstantiation of a property. In the following section I discuss Frege and Russell's account of true negative existentials. In the second section I discuss Meinongianism, comparing the account of true negative existentials on offer by the Meinongian with the Russellian account discussed in the first section. The article ends with a discussion of an anti-Meinongian account according to which existence is a universal property of individuals and a discussion of the related issues of existence in the context of quantified tense and modal logics.

1. Frege and Russell: Existence is not a Property of Individuals

There are two sets of reasons for denying that existence is a property of individuals. The first is Hume and Kant's puzzlement over what existence would add to an object. What is the difference between a red apple and a red existing apple? To be red (or even to be an apple) it must already exist, as only existing things instantiate properties. (This principle—that existence is conceptually prior to predication—is rejected by Meinongians.) Saying it is red and an apple and furthermore exists is to say one thing too many. The thought seems to be that instantiating any property whatsoever presupposes existence and so existence is not a further property over and above a thing's genuine properties. The thought is not merely that everything that instantiates any property exists, as the same is true of being self-identical, being either human or not human—assuming the law of excluded middle—and being such that 2+2=4, all of which seem to be unproblematic properties of individuals even if that status is denied of existence. Instead the thought is that instantiating any property whatsoever conceptually presupposes the existence of a subject in a way that makes it incoherent to then think of existence as a further property of that thing. The thing's existence is prior to any predication to it and so it is incoherent to think of existence as a property had by the thing. This thought is behind Aristotle's thesis that existence is not a further feature of a thing beyond its essence.

The second consideration favoring the thesis that existence is not a property of individuals concerns the puzzle of negative singular existentials. Suppose that existence is a property of the designation of the subject term in a singular existential sentence. Then ‘Ronald McDonnald does not exist’ predicates nonexistence of the designation of the subject term, in which case reality includes an entity—the designation of the singular term and subject of predication—that has the property of not existing. That, Russell complained, runs contrary to a robust sense of reality, according to which everything exists. So, we should reject the claim that existence is a property of the designation of subject terms in existential sentences.

To appreciate Russell's alternative account, consider first general nonexistence claims. To say that foxes exist is to say that there are some things that are foxes; that is, the property of being a fox is instantiated. This is reflected in the standard regimentation of the sentences ‘Foxes exist’ and ‘There are foxes’ in first-order quantificational logic as ∃xFx, where Fx is the translation for the predicate ‘is a fox’. General kind terms do not, then, designate individuals, which we then (redundantly) say exist when using the predicate ‘exists’ or (paradoxically) say are not when using the predicate ‘does not exist’. Instead, kind terms designate properties and simple seeming subject-predicate sentences like ‘Foxes are carnivores’ are claimed to possess a more complicated logical form, ∀x(FxCx), where Cx translates the predicate ‘is a carnivore’. (I ignore the difficult question whether generics are really quantifiers at all, made more troubling by the fact that some generics seem to admit of exceptions—‘Birds fly’ is true, even though penguins are birds and don't fly; ‘Cats have four legs’ is true, even though there is a three-legged cat wandering my neighborhood.) Given this analysis, general nonexistence claims are unproblematic. The sentence ‘Dragons do not exist’ says, on this analysis, that the property of being a dragon is not instantiated. Take the most inclusive class of what there is; nothing in that class has the property of being a dragon. That is what ¬∃xDx says, letting Dx translate the predicate ‘is a dragon’. This is significant because it does not require identifying some entity to then predicate of that thing the property of nonexistence.

The Frege-Russell view that existence is a second-order property is based on the idea that seemingly singular existential and negative existential sentence like ‘Bill Gates exists’ and ‘Ronald McDonnald does not exist’ are, in their deeper logical form, general existential and negative existential claims. I focus on Russell's version of the view.

Russell claimed that ordinary proper names like ‘Bill Gates’ are disguised definite descriptions, something like ‘the richest man in the world’. And definite descriptions, given Russell's view of definite descriptions, are not genuine referring terms but are instead quantificational expressions. The sentence ‘The richest man in the world lives in Washington’ has, as its logical form, a quantificational structure and not a subject-predicate structure, equivalent to something like the following: There is a unique richest person who lives in Washington. Individuals do not enter directly into the proposition expressed by the sentence and are not part of the sentence's truth conditions.

These features of Russell's account of definite descriptions are significant for the treatment of seemingly singular existential and negative existentials as they remove the need for entities to serve as the designation of the singular terms for the meaningfulness and truth of negative existentials. Seemingly singular existentials like ‘Bill Gates exists’ are assimilated to general existentials like ‘Foxes exist’. Assuming the proper name ‘Bill Gates’ is analyzed as the definite description ‘the richest person alive’, the sentence ‘Bill Gates exists’ has a logical form that can be more accurately expressed as There is someone that is uniquely richer than anyone else alive. This is neither redundant nor uninformative, assuming that we can grasp in thought properties while coherently and rationally wondering whether or not they are instantiated. Russell's account similarly dissolves the problems generated by seemingly singular negative existentials like ‘Ronald McDonald does not exist’. The truth of this sentence does not require a designation for the term of which nonexistence is then predicated. ‘Ronald McDonald’ is short for a definite description, say, ‘the happy hamburger clown’. The sentence ‘Ronald McDonald does not exist’ expresses a proposition of the form It is not the case that there is a unique happy hamburger clown. This proposition is true even if absolutely everything there is exists. The proposition concerns the property of being a happy hamburger clown and says of that property that it is not uniquely instantiated. As the property—the true subject of predication—exists, however, we are not forced to countenance the reality of entities that do not exist in order to recognize this sentence as saying something true.

Russell's strategy depends on two claims. The first is that the negation in a negative existential takes wide scope, applying to the whole sub-sentence and not just the predicate. So, ‘Ronald McDonald does not exist’ does not involve ascribing the predicate ‘is nonexistent’ to the subject ‘Ronald McDonald’. Instead, it is more faithfully represented as ‘It is not the case that [Ronald McDonald exists]’. The second is that ‘Ronald McDonald’ is not a genuine referring expression and the predicate ‘exists’ really means something like is instantiated. Notice that the first in solitude is not sufficient to overcome the problems generated by seemingly singular negative existentials. Even if the deep form of ‘Ronald McDonald does not exist’ is  ‘It is not the case that [Ronald McDonald exists]’, assuming that ‘Ronald McDonald’ is a genuine singular term, the problem remains of finding in reality some entity to serve as the designation of ‘Ronald McDonald’. That entity is then part of reality and so, assuming that Meinongianism is false, is existent. In that case, the sub-proposition Ronald McDonald exists is true and so its negation false. The problem of true singular negative existentials does not rest on the supposition that they involve ascribing the property of nonexistence. So, it is the second of the above claims that carries the weight of Russell's solution to the problem of singular negative existentials.

The second component of the Russellian solution—the claim that ordinary proper names like ‘Bill Gates’ are disguised definite descriptions—faces a number of objections. One is the semantic argument. (See [Kripke 1972].) Suppose that the descriptive equivalent of the name ‘Bill Gates’ is ‘the richest living person in the world’. An adequate semantic understanding of the sentence ‘Bill Gates is richer than everyone else alive’ would then be sufficient for recognition of its truth. (More precisely, the sentence, ‘If anyone is richer than everyone else alive, then Bill Gates is richer than everyone else alive’ has this feature.) But that seems implausible. Surely we must collect empirical data to determine its truth. One who wonders whether someone, say, Warren Buffett, is wealthier than Bill Gates does not display irrationality or semantic ignorance, comparable to one who wonders whether a fortnight is longer than 14 nights.

Perhaps these considerations should motivate the descriptivist to abandon “great deeds” descriptions in favor of metalinguistic descriptions like ‘the person named ‘Bill Gates’’ or causal descriptions like ‘the person that stands at the origin of this chain of uses of the name ‘Bill Gates’’. It is plausible that semantic competence suffices to know that the sentence ‘Bill Gates is named ‘Bill Gates’’ is true and, while perhaps importing extra-semantic facts about language use, it is plausible that any reflective speaker of English knows that any token of ‘Bill Gates is the person that stands at the origin of this chain of uses of the name ‘Bill Gates’’ is true. So these descriptions seem to survive the semantic argument presented in the previous paragraph. But they face another objection, also facing simpler versions of descriptivism: Namely, the modal objection ([Kripke 1972]). While it is absolutely impossible that Bill Gates is not Bill Gates, it is, it seems metaphysically possible that Bill Gates is not the richest person alive, instead being a middle American, and it seems metaphysically possible that he is not named ‘Bill Gates’ and does not stand at the causal origin of any particular chain of uses of the name ‘Bill Gates’. This suggests that ordinary proper names and their alleged descriptive equivalents considered above are not, in fact, semantically equivalent, as they embed differently under modals like ‘it is necessary that’. [See the entry on names for further discussion of these problems.]

In response to the modal argument, the descriptivist might avail herself of individual essence descriptions like ‘the person identical to Bill Gates’, ‘the person that Bill-Gatizes’, or rigidifications of the above descriptions, ‘the person actually named ‘Bill Gates’’ and ‘the person that actually stands at the origin of this chain of uses of the name ‘Bill Gates’’, all of which designate the same person in every possible world in which they designate anything. It is plausible that semantic competence suffices for recognition of the truth of the sentence ‘Bill Gates is the person identical to Bill Gates’ and that that sentence expresses a necessary truth. So these versions of descriptivism seem to escape the problems discussed in the previous paragraphs. The first two candidates, however, do not hold much promise for solving the problem of apparently true singular negative existentials. We know what the property of being identical to Bill Gates is, but only because we know the result of plugging up one of the relata in the two-place relation is identical to with the individual Bill Gates. Insofar as we think that reality does not include any entity identical to Ronald McDonald, however, we are then left to wonder what the property of being identical to Ronald McDonald is. Because the contents of these properties are derivative from the individuals that serve as the referents of their names, they are poor candidate descriptive equivalences for a robust version of descriptivism and unlikely to shed light on the truth of seemingly singular negative existentials like ‘Ronald McDonald does not exist’. Similar considerations apply to the predicating view. 

The last candidates, rigidified metalinguistic and causal descriptions, are the most promising. But some have claimed to discern important differences in the functioning of a name and its alleged semantically equivalent rigidified description, of any flavor. First, some have claimed that the name ‘Bill Gates’ designates Bill Gates with respect to every possible world, including worlds at which Bill Gates does not exist; otherwise the sentence ‘Bill Gates does not exist’ would not be true with respect to those worlds. But the rigidified description ‘the person actually named ‘Bill Gates’’, for example, does not designate anything with respect to such a world, as nothing in the domain of that world satisfies the condition being named ‘Bill Gates’ at the actual world. That is because it is only Bill Gates that satisfies that condition and he is not a member of the domain of the possible world in question. So, differences in how a name and a rigidified description embed under modal operators can still be discerned. (See [Salmon 1981] for further discussion.) This objection assumes that the domain of quantification varies from world to world and that individuals that serve as the designation of ordinary names are genuine contingent existents, which some may deny. The objection also assumes that the range of the description is the domain of the world with respect to which the description is being evaluated, the actuality operator rigidifying only the condition of the description, which may also be denied. The second objection to rigidified descriptivism concerns the differences some have claimed between how names and rigidified descriptions embed under propositional attitude verbs. Intuitively, Jones would have still believed that Bill Gates is wealthy even if things had been ever so slightly different than they actually are—say, I bought a poppy bagel instead of a sesame bagel this morning. But if the content of Jones's belief concerns the actual world, as rigidified descriptivism dictates, then, to retain his actual belief in that counterfactual situation, he would have to believe something about another possible world—the actual world. But it is implausible that Jones would have a belief about another possible world. So, the content of Jones's belief does not concern the actual world and so one can believe what is expressed by ‘Bill Gates is wealthy’ without believing what is expressed by ‘The person that actually stands at the origin of this chain of uses of the name ‘Bill Gates’ is wealthy’. (See [Soames 1998].) 

In this section I examined the thesis that seemingly singular existential and negative existential sentences are really general existentials, which are then treated as ascribing the property of being instantiated or not instantiated to some property. The need to grant being to entities that do not exist in order to account for the truth of sentences like ‘Ronald McDonald does not exist’ is then avoided, which is no small victory. The success of that proposal, however, was seen to rest on the claim that ordinary proper names have descriptive equivalences, which many philosophers of language reject.

2. Meinongianism

Perhaps, then, we should reject descriptivism and accept that ordinary proper names are devices of direct reference, that there are true genuinely singular negative existentials, and so that there are nonexistent objects. ‘Ronald McDonald’ seems like a referring term, open to existential generalization, in the sense that a sentence like ‘Ronald McDonald does not exist’ entails ‘There is something that does not exist’, and ‘exists’ seems like a predicate that applies or fails to apply to the designation of subject-place terms. The Meinongian accepts these appearances and concludes that reality includes referents for empty names and those referents do not exist. The Meinongian trades logical and semantic simplicity for metaphysical abundance.

Meinongianism is the thesis that there are objects that do not exist, nonexistent entities being included in the most unrestricted domain of quantification and discourse. One immediate challenge to the Meinongian is to offer individuating conditions for nonexistents. The most straightforward comprehension principle is the naive principle that, for any condition on objects, there is a unique object satisfying exactly that condition. For our purposes, we can conceive of a condition as determining a set of properties; crudely, the properties expressed by the predicates composing the condition. In that case, condition C is the same condition as C′ when they determine the same set of properties. It follows that corresponding to any set of properties, there is exactly one object with exactly those properties. The naive comprehension principle faces several problems. In what remains of this section, I survey these problems and distinguish different versions of Meinongianism in terms of the devices employed to develop a restricted comprehension principle for objects that avoids them.

The first is the problem of incomplete objects. Conditions need not be total; that is, we do not require that the set of properties a condition determines is such that, for every property, either it or its complement is a member of that set. So, by the naive comprehension principle, the condition of being a singer defines an object with exactly that property—being a singer—and no other properties. A set with other properties as well is a distinct set of properties and so corresponds to a different condition and hence a different object. Some find incomplete objects problematic in themselves, as they are counterexamples to bivalence: Our singer, for example, is neither wearing a dress nor not wearing a dress. But they also lead to more general threats of paradox. Our singer is an object with exactly one property: That of being a singer. This is its sole defining characteristic. So having a exactly one property is also a property of our singer and that property is distinct from the property of being a singer, which our singer also has. So, the singer has two properties Contradiction. One simple solution is to restrict the comprehension principle to total conditions. The resulting proposal, however, leads to a questionable application of Meinongian metaphysics to problems of fictional truth, as many want to claim that there is simply no fact of the matter as to whether or not Sherlock Holmes has a mole on his left shoulder, as that is left underdetermined by the Holmes stories and there are no deeper grounds for either predication. The promise of employing nonexistent objects in explaining apparent truths about fiction is one of the theory's main virtues. Relatedly, this solution undermines a primary motivation for Meinongianism—namely, the idea that there is a subject of predication corresponding to any object of thought, as we certainly do not think only of complete objects.

The second is the problem of contradiction. A naive comprehension principle generates objects that violate the principle of noncontradiction. Consider the condition of being taller than everything. By the naive comprehension principle, this condition determines an object and so there is an object that has exactly the property of being taller than everything. But then it is taller than itself, which is a contradiction given the irreflexivity of the taller than relation. The irreflexivity of the taller than relation is nonlogical. But not so with the identity relation, as = is typically taken to be a logical predicate. It is a logical truth that everything is self-identical; i.e., the sentence ∀x x=x is true under every interpretation. But consider the property of being self-distinct. By the naive comprehension principle this condition determines an object and that object is self-distinct. But then that object does not satisfy the condition x=x. So our logically true sentence has a counterinstance. Contradiction.

A third problem, one of Russell's objections to Meinongianism (see [Russell 1905a, 1907]), turns on the fact that existence is, on Meinongianism, a property and hence figures into the base of the naive comprehension principle. So, consider the condition of being winged, being a horse, and existing. By the naive comprehension principle, there is an object with exactly these features. But then this object exists, as existing is one of its characterizing features. Intuitively, however, there is no existent winged horse; existing seems to require a bit more substance. Indeed, for every intuitively nonexistent object that motivates Meinongianism—Zeus, Pegasus, Santa Clause, and Ronald McDonald—there is, by the naive abstraction principle, an object just like it but with additional the property of existing. But then there is an existing Zeus, an existing Pegasus, etc.. This is overpopulation not of being but of existence as well.

The naive comprehension principle, then, must be rejected and a restricted principle connecting sets of properties with objects found. The principle should generate enough objects to serve the Meinongian purpose of ensuring a corresponding object for every thought while avoiding the problems discussed above. We can distinguish two strategies, both suggested by Meinong's student Ernst Mally [Mally 1912]. The first distinguishes two kinds of properties, what, following Terence Parsons [Parsons 1980], we shall call nuclear and extra-nuclear properties. While the distinction remains ultimately unclear, the key idea is that nuclear properties are part of a thing's nature, broadly construed, and extra-nuclear properties are external to a thing's nature; more precisely, nuclear properties, but not extra-nuclear properties, are part of the characterization of what the object is. The comprehension principle is then restricted to conditions involving only nuclear predicates. Problematic properties, like existing, etc., are deemed extra-nuclear and beyond the scope of the comprehension principle, not determining the objects that there are. Nuclear, not extra-nuclear, properties individuate objects. The second Meinongian camp distinguishes two modes of predication: What Mally called determining and satisfying, Hector-Neri Castañeda [Castañeda 1974] called internal and external predication, William Rapaport [Rapaport 1978] called constituency and exemplification, Kit Fine [Fine 1982] called implicit and explicit, and Edward Zalta [Zalta 1983, 1988] called encoding and exemplifying. There is, on this view, a single class of properties that the comprehension principle ranges over, but the principle determines the properties encoded not exemplified (to follow Zalta's terminology). For every condition, there is a unique object that encodes just those properties. An object may or may not exemplify the properties it encodes. Sherlock Holmes encodes the properties of being a detective and living at 221B Baker Street, etc., but he does not exemplify those properties. He exemplifies (but does not encode) the properties of being a fictional character and being the hero of Arthur Conan Doyle's Holmes stories.

How do these distinctions solve the problems raised above for the naive comprehension principle? I begin with Parsons's view. Parsons focuses on the problems of contradiction and of the existent winged horse. Following Russell's discussion of Meinong, in [Russell 1905a, 1907], Parsons considers the threat of contradiction generated by impossible objects like the round square. Meinong claimed that there is a round square, but that, complained Russell, leads to violations of the principle of noncontradiction, as that entity is then both round and not round, in light of the fact that it is square, which entails that it is not round. Parsons's response (see [Parsons 1980], 38-42) seems to be to deny that being square entails not being round, in which case it is simply false that the round square is not round. He thinks that that implication holds only for “real” objects. He claims that there are counterexamples to the claim that all square objects are not round; after all, the round square is a square object that is round! This solution, however, does not seem to solve the more general threat of contradiction, as discussed above. Indeed, Parsons himself recognizes the limited success of his response (see [Parsons, 1980, 42n8]). He allows that being non-squared is a nuclear property. But then his comprehension principle entails that there is an object corresponding to the condition of being a non-squared square, where that object instantiates the incompatible properties of being a square and being a non-square.

Let's turn to Parsons's response to the existence problem. The naive comprehension principle faced the problem of generating an existent winged horse. Because existence is an extra-nuclear property, however, Parsons's version of the comprehension principle, which correlates sets of only nuclear properties to objects, avoids this problem. The condition of being an existent winged horse is not composed solely of nuclear properties and so Parsons's principle does not correlate it to an object. Parsons's distinction between nuclear and extra-nuclear properties similarly promises to solve the problem of incomplete objects. Recall our singer from above. That object does not have exactly one property; instead, it has exactly one nuclear property. As having exactly one nuclear property is itself an extra-nuclear property, much as being a complete object is on Parsons's view, the threat of contradiction is avoided. 

The distinction between nuclear and extra-nuclear properties remains unclear. Parsons introduced the distinction with lists of nuclear predicates (‘is blue’, ‘is tall’, ‘kicked Socrates’, ‘is a mountain’) and extra-nuclear predicates (‘exists’, ‘is thought about by Meinong’, ‘is complete’). He then tells us that the extra-nuclear are those that do not stand for properties of individuals ([Parsons 1980, 24]). And, of course, it is nuclear and not extra-nuclear properties by which objects are individuated. Parsons's individuation principle for objects is the following: “(1) No two objects (real or unreal) have exactly the same nuclear properties; and (2) For any set of nuclear properties, some object has all the properties in that set and no other nuclear properties” ([Parsons 1980, 19]). But it is not clear what status individual identity properties—properties like being identical to A, where A is an individual substance like, say, Parsons himself—have with respect to this distinction. He sometimes claims that they are extra-nuclear properties ([Parsons 1980, 28]). In that case, however, Parsons is committed to the problematic thesis of the identity of indiscernibles and so the impossibility of two primitively distinct but qualitatively identical objects. (For further discussion, see the entry on the identity of indiscernibles.) Most contemporary philosophers agree that objects are not individuated qualitatively, their identity and diversity being primitive. Max Black's two qualitatively indiscernible spheres are primitively distinct, in virtue of which one has the property of being that very thing and the other lacking that property (see [Black 1953]). Furthermore, it is hard to see why identity properties are not properties of individuals. Suppose, then, that we count individual identity properties like being identical to A as nuclear properties, those properties entering the range of Parsons's restricted comprehension principle. Then the nuclear negations of those properties are also nuclear. But then we can take the set of all objects, construct the individual identity property for each, construct the nuclear negation of each of those properties, and then construct a condition from those properties that, by Parsons's comprehension principle, corresponds to an object. Then there is an object that is distinct from every object that there is, which is a contradiction. It is unclear, then, that the distinction between nuclear and extra-nuclear properties and the restriction of the comprehension principle to nuclear properties solves the problems facing the naive comprehension principle. (For further discussion of Parsons's view, see [Fine 1982, 1984] and [Zalta 1992].)

Earlier I distinguished two versions of sophisticated Meinongianism. The first, based on the distinction between nuclear and extra-nuclear properties, was found lacking. I turn now to the second, based on the distinction between encoding and exemplifying a property, focusing on Zalta's version. Whereas Parsons distinguishes different kinds of properties, restricting the comprehension principle to only nuclear properties in the hope of thereby avoiding the problems plaguing the naive comprehension principle, Zalta distinguishes two different modes of having a property for the same effect. Exemplifying a property is the familiar way in which an individual has a property; it is what I called instantiation above. Obama exemplifies humanity, my chair exemplifies being comfortable, and the fig tree in my backyard exemplifies needing water. What the comprehension principle does is say not what properties object exemplify, in this sense, but rather what properties they encode. So, for any condition C on properties, there is an object that encodes exactly those properties, which leaves open whether or not those objects also exemplify those properties.

Let's apply this distinction to the problems facing Meinongianism presented earlier in this section. By the comprehension principle, the condition of being a singer determines an object with exactly that property. The object does not exemplify the property of being a singer but rather encodes it. Indeed, exemplifying the property of being a singer requires exemplifying other properties like having a spatial location, having a voice box, etc., all properties our singer does not have, neither encoding nor exemplifying these further properties. That object does exemplify some properties: Like the property of encoding exactly one property. There is no contradiction here, as the singer encodes exactly one property—the property of being a singer—and exemplifies multiple properties, including the property of encoding exactly one property, being self-identical, etc.. More generally, Zalta's comprehension principle correlates sets of properties with objects that encode, not (necessarily) exemplify, those properties. Insofar as the set of properties characterizing an object are not complete, the resulting object will be incomplete with respect to the properties it encodes. But it need not be incomplete with respect to the properties it exemplifies. While our singer encodes neither the property of wearing blue shoes nor the property of not wearing blue shoes, we can say that it exemplifies the property of not wearing blue shoes. Restricting the comprehension principle to the properties encoded also promises to avoid the other threats of contradiction presented above. Recall the logically impossible condition of being self-distinct. The principle of noncontradiction concerns the properties objects exemplify, not the properties objects encode (assuming our Meinongian is going to account for impossible objects). Because an object can encode inconsistent properties without exemplifying them, impossible objects do not violate the principle of noncontradiction. Finally, Russell's worry that a Meinongian comprehension principle generates existent winged horses can be answered. There is an object correlated to the condition of being an existent winged horse, but that object encodes and does not exemplify the property of existing. Being existent can characterize an object without that object exemplifying existence. So we do not need to worry about an overpopulation of existent beings, as existent beings exemplify existence, which the existent winged horse does not. 

A view based on the distinction between encoding and exemplifying avoids the standard objections to Meinongianism while promising to deliver that view's many benefits. The semantics and logic is straightforward and simple and surface forms of the natural language sentences of interest in this article match their deep logical forms. But the ontological costs are evident. There is semantic and logical simplicity at a metaphysical price.

3. An Anti-Meinongian First-Order View

In the previous two sections I discussed views that deny that existence is a property of individuals and views that deny that existence is a universal property. In this section I consider views according to which existence is a universal property of individuals, in the hope of reaping the benefits of both the earlier views. I then explore the interaction between quantifiers, tense operators, modal operators, and a universal, first-order existence predicate in an attempt to expose some difficulties such a view faces.

For both the Meinongian and the proponent of the proposal under consideration, proper names are directly referential and simple sentences in which they occur express singular propositions. However, unlike the Meinongian, a proponent of this view insists that absolutely everything exists. In that case, a sentence like ‘Ronald McDonald does not exist’ either expresses a fully articulate singular proposition and so is false, as in that case there is a referent of the subject-place singular term which exists, or does not express a truth evaluative proposition at all, as the singular term lacks a semantic content. In neither case is the sentence true. Avoiding that consequence was a primary motivation behind all of the alternative accounts discussed in the previous two sections. Our first challenge, then, is to explain how sentences like ‘Ronald McDonald does not exist’ are both meaningful and sometimes apparently true without abandoning the theses that absolutely everything exists and all names are devices of direct reference.

One important suggestion, adopted by Saul Kripke [Kripke 1973], Peter Inwagen [van Inwagen 1977, 1983, 2003], Nathan Salmon [Salmon 1998], David Braun [Braun 1993, 2005], and Amie Thomasson [Thomasson 1999, 2003, 2009], among others, is that seemingly empty names like ‘Ronald McDonald’ refer to existent, albeit abstract, fictional characters. Fictional characters have both being and existence. As we don't run into them on the street, see them on the bus, or feel them in our beds, given their lack of spatiotemporal location, it is plausible that what a speaker means when she utters the sentence ‘Ronald McDonald does not exist’ is not the false proposition that that sentence expresses but instead the true proposition that (the fictional character) Ronald McDonald is not a real person or is not concrete. Indeed, this is suggested by the natural amendment, ‘‘Ronald McDonald does not exist; he's a creation of advertisement!’’ On this view, then, there are no genuinely true singular negative existentials. All meaningful singular existentials are true and their negations false. We mistakenly take some singular negative existentials to be true because we conflate or do not sharply distinguish existing from being concrete. (Edward Zalta suggests the possibility of reinterpreting his Meinongian object theory along similar lines, trading his primitive nonuniversal, sometimes contingent existence predicate E!x in for a primitive nonuniversal, sometimes contingent concreteness predicate C!x. I discuss this version of object theory view below.) The benefit of this account is the simple semantics of proper names and the sparse metaphysics. The cost is revisionism regarding what we mean when we use apparently true singular negative existentials.

I end this section by briefly discussing issues that arise with the interaction between quantifiers, tense and modal operators, and a universal, first-order existence predicate, as this interaction is the source of another important cost of this account of existence. There are two sets of intuitions that seem to pull in opposite directions. The first concerns the transience and contingency of existence. Things come in and go out of existence through time. While Plato and Descartes used to exist, they no longer do; when Plato existed, Descartes did not yet exist; and right now the first child to be born in 2150 does not exist, but that individual will. So, it seems, different things exist at different times. Likewise, of the things that in fact exist, some of them might not have and different things—things that in fact do not exist—might have existed instead or in addition. So, it seems, different things exist at different worlds. These intuitions are quite robust. The second set of intuitions concern the ontological status of nonactual and nonpresent objects. Many philosophers are drawn to the thesis of actualism: The thesis that absolutely everything is actual and how an object is simpliciter is how it actually is, unactualized possibilities for an object being in some sense hypothetical ways of being for that object. While less popular, many philosophers accept the temporal analog of actualism, the thesis of presentism, according to which absolutely everything is present and how an object is simpliciter is how it presently is, how an object was and will be are in some sense hypothetical ways of being for that object. These two sets of intuitions combined with the view of existence under consideration in this section lead to difficulties.

Let's begin with the modal problem. There could have been an object distinct from all actually existing objects. For example, I could have had a brother and, given origin essentialism, if I had a brother, he would have been distinct from every actually existing objects, as no actually existing thing could have been my brother. Our intuitions concerning how things might have been lead us to accept this claim as true. But, by the thesis of actualism, absolutely everything is actual and, by our view of existence, exists and so actually exists. So, it seems that actualism and our view of existence are incompatible with the intuitive possibility of there being an object distinct from all existing objects and the intuition that I might have had a brother.

We can regiment the contingency of existence intuition as followings, letting A be the actuality operator, where Aφ is true with respect to a world w under an interpretation I just in case φ is true with respect to the distinguished world of I: ◊∃x¬Ay(y=x). Call this sentence Alien. The worry is that the truth of Alien carries ontological commitment to merely possible individuals and so the falsity of the thesis of actualism. One way to substantiate this worry is to invoke the Barcan Formula, or one of the mixing axioms proposed for modal operators and quantifiers in Ruth Barcan Marcus's groundbreaking work in quantified modal logic [Marcus 1946], according to which all instances of the sentence ◊∃xφ(x) →∃x◊φ(x) are logical true. (In the foregoing formulas, φ(x) stands for any formula in which the variable x may or may not be free.) We can then transpose the modal and quantifier in Alien to derive ∃x◊¬Ay(y=x). The truth of this second sentence evidently requires that there is something that is not actual, contrary to the dictates of actualism. The Barcan Formula, and in part for this very reason, is controversial and rejected by those that subscribe to a varying domains possible worlds semantics for modal discourse. So this line of argument is not likely to convince everyone that our modal intuitions lead to problems.

There is, however, a second line of argument that does not rest on the validity of the Barcan Formula, relying instead on combining standard truth definitions for quantified and modal sentences in the most straightforward way. Alien is true under an interpretation I just in case there is a world w accessible from the distinguished world of I with an object in its domain that is not in the domain of the distinguished world of I. This is because its truth requires that ∃x¬Ay(y=x) is true with respect to w and so, it is tempting conclude, that there is a witness that satisfies the condition ¬Ay(y=x) at w. But that is the rub. If actualism is true, then there is no such witness, although there could have been. If we are realistic about possible worlds semantics, the model theory for modal talk itself does not contain primitive modality, instead containing worlds as points of evaluation and the notion of truth at a world, in which case ‘there is’ in the above truth recursion does not occur inside the scope of a possibility operator. So, if Alien is true, there is some object o and accessible possible world w such that o satisfies ¬Ay(y=x) at w, which seems to run contrary to the thesis of actualism, as that witness does not actually exist. (For further discussion of this problem and some of the solutions considered below, see the entry on actualism.)

One solution is to abandon actualism and accept that there are merely possible objects. According to this possibilist position, merely possible objects are among the most unrestricted domain of quantification, being constituents of fundamental reality. It is simply false, then, that absolutely everything is actual. While this position deserves serious consideration, I propose to set it aside and explore only actualist solutions. A second solution rests on the Meinongian distinction between being, in the sense of being a member of the most inclusive domain of quantification and discourse, and existing and the claim that there are objects that do not exist. Armed with a Meinongian metaphysics, we can reject Alien as capturing the intuition that existence is contingent, opting instead for the following sentence as doing that, where E!x is the Meinongian logically primitive existence predicate: ∃xE!x ∧ ◊E!x). The Meinongian can then deny Alien and appeal to the truth of this sentence to explain our intuitions concerning the contingency of existence. Everything is actual, on this view, although some of those actual things do not exist but could have. This solution to our problems, however, is unavailable to a proponent of the view that existence is a universal property of individuals.

Bernard Linsky and Edward Zalta [Linsky and Zalta 1994] present a novel solution to this problem that promises to be consistent with the tenets of the view of existence under consideration in this section. (A similar account is defended by Timothy Williamson [Williamson 1998, 1999, 2000, 2002].) I begin with the intuitive possibility that I have a brother. An entity that encodes the property of being my brother actually exists, but as a nonconcrete object. That object is only contingently nonconcrete; it could have been concrete, and had it been concrete, it would have exemplified the property of being my brother (along with the other properties that it encodes and the necessary consequences thereof). On this view, my possible brother (as well as any alleged merely possible object) actually exists, just as a nonconcrete individual that could have been concrete. The view is both actualistic, as absolutely everything is actual, and anti-Meinongian, as absolutely everything exists. Note, however, that Alien, the sentence two paragraphs above purported to capture our intuitions concerning the contingency of existence, is false on this view, as every individual is a necessary existent. Instead, our intuition that what there is is contingent is to be explained in terms of the contingency of what is concrete and nonconcrete. So, where C!x is a logically primitive predicate of concreteness, it is the truth of the following sentence, not Alien, that explains those intuitions: ∃xC!x ∧ ◊C!x). While the explanation of the contingency of existence bears a structural similarity to the Meinongian explanation discussed in the previous paragraph, the metaphysics is importantly different and so the two views should not be collapsed.

Linsky and Zalta's view requires that concreteness is an accidental property. The self-same individual that is nonconcrete (my possible brother, for example) could have been concrete and the self-same individual that is concrete (me, for example) could have been nonconcrete. This is problematic and becomes more problematic, I believe, when one considers its temporal analog. To see, we turn from the modal problem of contingent existents to its temporal analogy, the problem of temporary existents. While one's accounts of the two problems do not need to swing together (Linsky and Zalta, for example, do not offer the temporal analog of their account of contingent existents), as there are differences between alethic modality and temporality, it is useful to consider them as a pair for our purposes. Intuitively things come in and go out of existence; what exists at one time does not exist at another. The temporal analog of Linsky and Zalta's view of contingent existents entails that everything always exists. What there is and what exists at one time is the same as what is and what exists at any other time; the domain of quantification is fixed across all times. What varies from time to time is which of those individuals are concrete. Socrates still exists now, although as a nonconcrete individual, who was concrete in 450 BCE, and similarly for the first child to be born in 2150. This view requires that a thing can survive the change from being nonconcrete to concrete, intuitive generation, and the change from being concrete to nonconcrete, intuitive destruction. On this view, then, seeming generation and destruction or substantial change are really forms of qualitative change; a change in the quality of concreteness. This runs contrary to the common conception that concreteness is necessary and eternal to any object that instantiates it, the divide between concrete and nonconcrete individuals marking a divide between categories of being that an individual cannot migrate across. Just as one and the same thing cannot go from being an individual to being a property, so too one and the same thing cannot go from being nonconcrete to being concrete. Suppose then that this view of the transience of existence is rejected. What account can be given to ground the asymmetry between the permanence of concreteness and its contingency? The above explanation, that concreteness marks a category of being, explains the permanence of concreteness, but entails its necessity as well. While not conclusive, this suggests that we look for an alternative solution to our problem.

I now turn to the prospects of a theory according to which existence is a universal, genuinely contingent and transient property of individuals. Such a view requires that the domain of quantification varies from world to world and time to time, as everything that is exists but different individuals exist at different possible worlds and at different times. In that case, Alien is true. What, though, of the earlier argument that the truth of Alien is inconsistent with the thesis of actualism? One response rejects the last step, insisting that there are general claims that could have been true, and so are true at some accessible possible world, without there being specific instances of those claims that are true at those accessible worlds. In nonmodal environments, the quantified sentence ∃xφ(x) is true just in case there is some witness o that satisfies the condition φ(x). The argument that the truth of Aliens requires that there are merely possible individuals quite naturally imports this truth definition to the truth of a quantified sentence at a merely possible world. And that is the step I am proposing rejecting. The model theory for a model language—with its space of possible worlds and individuals populating the domains of possible worlds—contains, like everything else if actualism is true, only actually existing entities. Still, sentences like Alien are true and so there are merely possible worlds at which ∃x¬Ay(y=x) is true. There is no individual of which ¬Ay(y=x) is true in virtue of which the quantified sentence is true, although there would have been had that merely possible world been actual. This is perhaps more clear when we turn from sentences being true with respect to merely possible worlds to propositions being true at merely possible worlds. There is a world w at which the existential proposition [there is something such that there is no actual thing identical to it] is true but there is no singular proposition [there is no actual thing identical to o] true at w as there is no such entity o. Had w been actual, however, then there would have been such an entity and it is this fact that grounds the truth of the existential proposition at w. (See [Adams 1981].) This suggestion, then, runs contrary to the standard semantics for quantificational sentences, which reduces the truth or falsity of existential and universal sentences to the truth or falsity of their instances, when extending that semantics to truth at a world. The suggestion also requires a distinction between truth at a world, in terms of which the model theory for modal operators is given, and truth in a world, which involves the notion of considering what would have been had a nonactual world been actual. 

4. Conclusion

I began by saying that existence raises a number of deep and important problems in metaphysics, philosophy of language, and philosophical logic. I have examined some of those problems and surveyed a number of different accounts of existence. None of the theories surveyed is wholly satisfying and without cost. The first view proposed by Frege and Russell treats existence as a second-order property and assimilates seemingly singular existentials to general existentials. The proposal requires descriptivism, the thesis that ordinary proper names have descriptive equivalences, which many find to be a problematic thesis. The second Meinongian view requires countenancing individuals that do not exist. We have seen the view face challenges in giving coherent and yet informative and compelling individuation principles for nonexistent individuals and all versions of the view suffer from the problem of metaphysical overpopulation. Finally I presented the naive view that existence is a universal property of individuals. That view faced the problem of having to reject the truth of highly intuitively true singular negative existential sentences like ‘Ronald McDonald does not exist’. The view also faces difficulties in properly accounting for the interaction of quantifiers and modal and tense operators. Existence remains, then, itself a serious problem in philosophy of language, metaphysics, and logic and one connected to some of the deepest and most important problems in those areas.


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actualism | Aristotle, General Topics: metaphysics | descriptions | identity: of indiscernibles | Mally, Ernst | Meinong, Alexius | names | nonexistent objects | object | properties | substance


The author would like to thank Phillip Bricker for comments on an earlier draft of this entry.