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Virtue Epistemology

First published Fri Jul 9, 1999; substantive revision Wed Jan 12, 2011

Contemporary virtue epistemology (hereafter ‘VE’) is a diverse collection of approaches to epistemology. Two commitments unify them. First, epistemology is a normative discipline. Second, intellectual agents and communities are the primary source of epistemic value and the primary focus of epistemic evaluation.

This entry introduces you to many of the most important results of the contemporary VE research program. These include novel attempts to resolve longstanding disputes, solve perennial problems, and expand epistemology's horizons. In the process it reveals the diversity within VE. Beyond sharing the two unifying commitments mentioned above, its practitioners diverge over the nature of intellectual virtues, which questions to ask, and which methods to use.

It will be helpful to note some terminology before proceeding. First, we use ‘cognitive’, ‘epistemic’ and ‘intellectual’ synonymously. Second, we often use ‘normative’ broadly to include not only norms and rules, but also duties and values. Finally, ‘practitioners’ names contemporary virtue epistemologists.

1. Introduction

We'll start by explaining contemporary VE's two basic commitments.

One of VE's commitments is that epistemology is a normative discipline. This entails at least two things.

First, it signals opposition to Quine's radical suggestion in “Epistemology Naturalized” that philosophers should abandon questions about what's reasonable to believe, and should restrict themselves to questions about cognitive psychology instead. Virtue epistemologists reject Quine's proposal (McDowell 1994, 133; Sosa 1991, 100–105; Zagzebski 1996, 334–8). Still they are generally receptive to empirical data on belief formation, both from psychology and history (Greco 2001; Roberts and Wood 2007, Part II; Sosa 1991, 105–6; Zagzebski 1996, 336–7).

Second, it implies that epistemologists should focus their efforts on understanding epistemic norms, value and evaluation. This is a defining feature of the field. Accordingly, VE features centrally in the recent “value turn” in epistemology (Riggs 2006, Pritchard 2007).

For some virtue epistemologists, however, the idea that epistemology is a normative discipline means more than this. For example, some practitioners think that epistemological terms (or concepts) like ‘knowledge’, ‘evidence’, ‘justification’, ‘duty’ and ‘virtue’ cannot be adequately defined or fully explained in purely non-normative vocabulary (e.g. Axtell and Carter 2008, McDowell 1994, Roberts and Wood 2007, and Zagzebski 1996, 2009), although others disagree (e.g. Goldman 1992, Greco 1999, 2009, Sosa 2007).

Others think that epistemology should aim to promote intellectual well being. Perhaps an epistemological theory should be “practically useful” in helping us recognize when we do or don't know something (Zagzebski 1996: 267), or help us overcome “anxieties” due to defective presuppositions about knowledge (McDowell 1994, xi), or help us appreciate forms of “epistemic injustice” (Fricker 2007). Or perhaps it should inspire us with stimulating portraits of intellectual virtue, thereby promoting cultural reformation and intellectual flourishing (Roberts and Wood 2007). But while a strong practical or educative streak runs through much contemporary VE, it is far from a defining feature of the field.

VE's second basic commitment is that intellectual agents and communities are the primary source of epistemic value and the primary focus of epistemic evaluation. This focus includes not only individuals and groups, but also the traits constitutive of their cognitive character.

This second commitment of VE entails a distinctive direction of analysis characteristic of virtue theories in both ethics and epistemology. Virtue ethics explains an action's moral properties in terms of the agent's properties, for instance whether it results from kindness or spite. VE explains a cognitive performance's normative properties in terms of the cognizer's properties, for instance whether a belief results from hastiness or excellent eyesight, or whether an inquiry manifests carelessness or discrimination. For virtue ethics the relevant properties are moral virtues and vices, and for VE intellectual virtues and vices.

Here is an example of how VE's direction of analysis distinguishes it from standard, non-virtue approaches. An evidentialist might define an epistemically justified belief as one that is supported by the evidence, and then define evidence in a way that entirely abstracts from the properties of the person. On such an approach, it would be natural to understand intellectual virtues as dispositions to believe in accordance with the evidence (which, again, is defined independently, without mentioning the virtues). A virtue epistemologist would reverse the order of analysis, defining justified belief as one that manifests intellectual virtue, and evidence in terms of intellectual virtue.

Beyond those basic commitments, we find great diversity in the field. Three main issues divide practitioners. The first concerns the nature and scope of intellectual virtues (section 3). The second concerns what questions to address, and the third what methods to use (section 4).

2. Precursors

Practitioners draw inspiration from many important historical philosophers, including Plato (Zagzebski 1996, 139), Aristotle (Greco 2002, 311; Sosa 2009, 187; Zagzebski 1996, passim), Aquinas (Roberts and Wood 2007, 69–70; Zagzebski 1996, passim), Descartes (Sosa 2007, ch. 6), Kierkegaard (Roberts and Wood 2007, 29–30) and Peirce (Hookway 2000). Hints of VE can also be found in Hume (1748), Reid (1785), Russell (1948) and Sellars (1956).

Jonathan Kvanvig (1992) argues that early versions of reliabilism are best interpreted as virtue epistemologies. When early reliabilists speak of reliability, Kvanvig argues, they are most charitably understood as invoking reliable cognitive character. Here he has in mind the views of David Armstrong, Robert Nozick and Alvin Goldman. Goldman (1992) has since embraced the VE label.

3. The Nature of Intellectual Virtues

Start with an uncontroversial, but still informative, characterization of intellectual virtues. Intellectual virtues are characteristics that promote intellectual flourishing, or which make for an excellent cognizer.

VE is standardly divided up into virtue responsibilists and virtue reliabilists (e.g. Axtell 1997). According to this taxonomy, the two camps differ over how to characterize intellectual virtue. Virtue reliabilists (e.g. Goldman, Greco, Sosa) understand intellectual virtues to include faculties such as perception, intuition and memory; call these ‘faculty-virtues’. Their view is best understood as descendant from earlier externalist epistemologies such as simple process reliabilism. Virtue responsibilists (e.g. Code, Hookway, Montmarquet, Zagzebski) understand intellectual virtues to include refined character traits such as conscientiousness and open-mindedness; call these ‘trait-virtues’. Their approach is broadly aligned with internalist sympathies in epistemology, and deeply concerned with cognition’s ethical dimensions and implications.

This reliabilist/responsibilist taxonomy has attracted criticism. First, it is not clear why practitioners need to choose between faculty-virtues and trait-virtues. At first glance, excellent perception, good memory, open-mindedness and humility all seem equally good candidates to promote excellence or flourishing. Arguments over which are the “real” virtues can seem pointless and counterproductive, since many are the ways of excelling and flourishing intellectually (Battaly 2001). Second, and closely related, it is plausible that a complete epistemology must feature both faculty-virtues and trait-virtues. Faculty-virtues seem indispensable in accounting for knowledge of the past and the world around us. Trait-virtues seem equally indispensable in accounting for richer intellectual achievements such as understanding and wisdom, which may presuppose knowledge, but which may also exceed it (compare Zagzebski 2001, 248–9). Baehr (2006b) argues that virtue reliabilists should not neglect trait-virtues, because these are  necessary to explain some cases of knowledge. Thus intellectual courage and perseverance, not just good memory and perception, might figure centrally in an explanation of how a knower arrived at the truth.

Battaly (2008, 7) provides a helpful list of questions to guide inquiry into the nature of intellectual virtue:

There are five primary questions that analyses of the intellectual virtues should address. First, are the virtues natural or acquired? Second, does virtue possession require the agent to possess acquired intellectually virtuous motivations or dispositions to perform intellectually virtuous actions? Third, are the virtues distinct from skills? Fourth, are the virtues reliable? Finally, fifth, what makes the virtues valuable? Are they instrumentally, constitutively, or intrinsically valuable?

Jason Kawall (2002a) calls attention to a set of virtues neglected by virtue epistemologists of all stripes. Virtue ethicists have long recognized a difference between self-regarding moral virtues, such as prudence and courage, and other-regarding virtues, such as benevolence and compassion. And they have recognized the importance of both sorts. But virtue epistemologists have overlooked a similar distinction among intellectual virtues. They focus on self-regarding intellectual virtues, such as perceptual acuity or intellectual courage, which promote the individual's own intellectual flourishing. They neglect other-regarding intellectual virtues, such as honesty and integrity, which promote other people's acquisition of knowledge and intellectual flourishing. More complex other-regarding virtues would involve a willingness and ability to articulately communicate one's reasons to others, or the creativity to discover knowledge new to a community. “An epistemic agent who focuses exclusively on self-regarding epistemic virtues,” Kawall (2002a, 260) writes, “could be a deficient epistemic agent to the extent that she is a member of a community.”

4. Conventional and Alternative

Many practitioners deploy VE's resources to address standard questions in standard ways. (Here ‘standard’ means ‘standard for contemporary Anglo-American epistemology’.) They offer analyses or definitions of knowledge and justification. They try to solve puzzles and problems, such as the Gettier problem and the lottery problem. They construct counterexamples. They confront the skeptic. This is conventional VE.

Other practitioners address non-standard questions or use non-standard methods and sources. They shun definitions and tidy analyses. They pursue game other than knowledge and justification, such as deliberation, inquiry, understanding, wisdom, profiles of the individual virtues and their relations (“epistemic psychology”), and the social, ethical and political dimensions of cognition. They ignore the skeptic. They mine literature and drama for inspiration and examples. This is alternative VE.

An example of conventional VE is Ernest Sosa's (1991, section IV) attempt to define knowledge as true belief held “out of intellectual virtue,” or to settle the dispute among internalists and externalists about epistemic justification (Sosa 2003, ch. 9), providing detailed definitions and carefully trying to disarm counterexamples. Another prime example of conventional VE is Linda Zagzebski's (1996, part III) definition of knowledge and attempted resolution of the Gettier problem.

An example of extreme alternative VE is Robert Roberts and Jay Wood's (2007) view that conventional questions and methods have eviscerated epistemology, and we should instead aim to reform intellectual culture by sketching subtle and nuanced pictures (“maps”) of the intellectual virtues, drawing freely on literature, history and scripture. Another example is Jonathan Kvanvig's (1992) argument that VE will flourish only by putting aside traditional questions about the nature and scope of knowledge, and instead focusing on the role virtues play in training and education. A more moderate example is Wayne Riggs's (2003) argument that fertile territory for VE lies beyond the standard “focus on propositions, truth, justification and knowledge,” in the domain of other intellectual values and goods, such as understanding and wisdom.

The foregoing does not imply that VE is a house divided against itself. On the contrary, we find a spectrum of conventional and alternative approaches rather than a simple dichotomy, and among the various practitioners of VE we often see a “live and let live” attitude. Thus while some practitioners of alternative VE counsel a radical, wholesale break from conventional questions or methods, most either blend conventional and alternative elements (e.g. Zagzebski, Riggs, Battaly), or see value in conventional VE (Baehr). Conventional practitioners likewise recognize that “alternative” questions are not only important but as old as philosophy itself, such as questions about wisdom and the social transmission of virtues. The same goes for the “alternative” method of consulting literature, as Plato looked to Homer.

The conventional/alternative distinction to some extent resembles Solomon's (2003) routine/radical distinction within virtue ethics. It also to some extent tracks Battaly's (2008) distinction between virtue “theory” and virtue “anti-theory.” And Baehr (2008) identifies some important differences among alternative forms of VE.

5. Early Developments

This section covers early developments in contemporary VE, primarily from the 1980s and 1990s, with a focus on theories of justification and, to a lesser extent, knowledge.

Contemporary interest in virtue epistemology began with a paper by Ernest Sosa, where he claimed that a turn to virtue theory would allow a solution to the impasse between foundationalist theories of justification and coherentist theories of justification. One way to organize the early literature is to begin with Sosa's paper and the development of his own version of virtue epistemology. We may then look at various reactions to Sosa's seminal work. As we shall see, these may be divided into two categories. While some critics responded with objections to the idea that we should turn to virtue theory in epistemology, another group responded with objections that Sosa did not go far enough in exploiting the various resources of virtue theory.

5.1. Virtue Perspectivism

In “The Raft and the Pyramid: Coherence versus Foundations in the Theory of Knowledge,” Sosa suggested that virtue epistemology would allow a solution to the foundationalism-coherentism problematic in epistemology. We may think of foundationalism on the metaphor of a pyramid: there is a structure to knowledge involving a nonsymmetrical relation of support among levels, with one level having the special status of a foundation which supports all the rest. In the most plausible versions of foundationalism sensory experience plays an important role in the foundation, providing a ground for observational knowledge from which further knowledge can be inferred higher up in the structure. Coherentism counters this account of knowledge with its metaphor of the raft: knowledge is a structure that floats free of any secure anchor or tie. No part of knowledge is more fundamental than the rest to the overall structure, all of the parts being held together by the ties of logical relations.

According to Sosa, both these accounts of knowledge have fatal flaws. The problem with coherentism is that it cannot account for knowledge at the periphery of a system of beliefs. This is because coherentism makes justification entirely a function of the logical relations among beliefs in the system, but perceptual beliefs have very few logical ties to the remainder. This makes it possible to generate counterexamples to coherentism by means of the following recipe. First, take a perfectly coherent system of beliefs that seems to provide good examples of justified belief and knowledge. Second, replace one perceptual belief in the system with its negation, while also making any other slight changes that are necessary to preserve coherence. This will have very little effect on the overall coherence of the system, since that is a function only of the logical relations among the system's beliefs. Accordingly, it will turn out to be the case that the new “perceptual belief” is as coherent as the old one, and is therefore, according to coherentism, equally well justified. This result is counter-intuitive, however, since the person's sensory experience has remained the same. Surely she is not justified in believing that she is not standing in front of a tree, for example, if her sensory experience is as if she is standing in front of a tree. Examples like this one suggest that justification is a function of more than the relations among beliefs. Specifically, it is partly a function of one's sensory experience.

This gives the advantage to foundationalism, which allows a role for sensory experience in justified belief and knowledge. But an equally problematic dilemma arises for foundationalism, depending on how one thinks of foundationalism's epistemic principles. Suppose we agree that there is some true epistemic principle relating (i) a relevant sensory experience to (ii) one's justified belief that one is standing in front of a tree. Is this to be understood as a fundmental principle about epistemic justification, or is it to be understood as an instance of some more general principle? If we say the former, then the foundationalist is faced with a seemingly infinite multitude of fundamental principles with no unifying ground. There would be different fundamental principles for visual and auditory experience, for example, as well as possible principles for beings not like us at all, but capable of having their own kind of sensory knowledge. The more attractive alternative is to think of the foundationalist's principles as derived, but then we need an account of some deeper, unifying ground.

This is the context in which Sosa suggests that virtue epistemology will do the trick. Suppose we think of virtues in general as excellences of character. A virtue is a stable and successful disposition: an innate ability or an acquired habit, that allows one to reliably achieve some good. An intellectual virtue will then be a cognitive excellence: an innate ability or acquired habit that allows one to reliably achieve some intellectual good, such as truth in a relevant matter. We may now think of justified belief as belief that is appropriately grounded in one's intellectual virtues, and we may think of knowledge as true belief that is so grounded. By adopting this position, we can see the foundationalist's epistemic principles as instances of this more general account of justified belief and knowledge. The idea is that human beings possess intellectual virtues that involve sensory experience; i.e. stable and reliable dispositions for forming beliefs about the environment on the basis of experiential inputs. Such dispositions involve various sensory modalities such as vision and hearing. Other cognitive beings might possess analogous dispositions, involving kinds of sensory experience unknown to humans. Accordingly, Sosa argues, virtue epistemology provides the unified account that was needed.

The same idea accounts for the truth involved in coherentism as well. Namely, coherence gives rise to justified belief and knowledge precisely because it is the manifestation of intellectual virtue. In our world, and for beings like us, coherence increases reliability, and therefore constitutes a kind of intellectual virtue in its own right. Moreover, coherence of a certain sort allows for reflective knowledge as opposed to mere animal knowledge. According to Sosa, we rise to a different and superior kind of justification and knowledge when we are able to see our beliefs as deriving from intellectual virtues. This perspective on our virtues must itself derive from a second-order intellectual virtue, one that allows us to reliably monitor and adjust our first-level cognitive dispositions (Sosa 1980).

Notice that the above ideas involve the direction of analysis thesis discussed above. Traditional foundationalism and coherentism try to account for justified belief and knowledge solely by reference to the properties of beliefs; i.e. their logical relations (coherentism) or their logical relations plus their relations to sensory experiences (traditional foundationalism). Sosa's version of virtue epistemology accounts for various kinds of justified belief and knowledge by first defining the notion of an intellectual virtue, and then by defining various normative properties of beliefs in terms of this more fundamental property of persons.

Responses to Sosa have focussed on various objections to the position outlined above, including the general claim that a turn to virtue theory would be a fruitful approach in epistemology. A second group of critics has endorsed Sosa's call for a turn to virtue theory in epistemology, but have argued that he does not go far enough in exploiting the various resources that virtue theory offers.

5.2. Responsibilism I

One early response to Sosa along this second line is by Lorraine Code, who argues for the centrality of epistemic responsibility in epistemology. Code agrees with Sosa's direction of analysis thesis, endorsing the idea that primary justification is best understood as attaching to stable dispositions to act in certain ways, while secondary justification accrues to particular acts because of their sources in virtues. This approach, she argues, appropriately focuses epistemology on persons, their cognitive activities, and their membership in a community defined by social practices of enquiry. The individual knower is now recognized as part of a community, with all the moral and intellectual obligations that this entails. However, Code argues, redirecting epistemology in this way gives the notion of epistemic responsibility central importance. Characterizing Sosa's position as a version of reliabilism, she argues that her own “responsibilism” constitutes a more adequate development of Sosa's initial insights. This is because, in part, the notion of responsibility emphasizes the active nature of the knower, as well as the element of choice involved in the knower's activity. Whereas a merely passive recorder of experience can be described as reliable, only an active, creative agent can be assessed as responsible or irresponsible, as having fulfilled her obligations to fellow enquirers, etc. According to Code, then, Sosa is correct to call for a focus on intellectual virtues in epistemology, with the focus on agency and community that this implies. But the natural way to develop this insight is to understand the intellectual virtues in terms of epistemic responsibility. Code goes so far as to say that epistemic responsibility is the central intellectual virtue, from which all other intellectual virtues radiate.

Another interesting feature of Code's view concerns some theses about the prospects for epistemology. Placing emphasis on virtue and responsibility, she argues, has consequences for both how epistemology should be conducted and the kind of epistemological insights we should hope for. First, emphasizing the contextual and social dimensions of knowledge introduces complexity into theorizing, and in such a way that shows the usual examples and counter-examples in epistemology to be inadequate. Such examples under-describe the relevant epistemic circumstances, leaving out such relevant considerations as history, social role, conflicting obligations, etc. To show how such factors are indeed relevant, it is necessary to replace these thin examples with thickly descriptive narrative. Only stories that tie a whole life together provide an adequate context for epistemic evaluations, precisely because the factors that govern such evaluations are that rich and complex.

Moreover, Code argues, thick narratives are essential for understanding the very nature of intellectual virtue. Echoing a point by Alasdair MacIntyre, Code argues that an adequate understanding of what it is to be virtuous requires placing virtuous selves in the unity of a narrative. A consequence of this is that we should not expect to describe tidy conditions for justification and knowledge. The relevant criteria for epistemic evaluation are too varied and complex for that, and so any simple theory of knowledge will distort rather than adequately capture those criteria. This does not mean, however, that insight into the nature and conditions of justification and knowledge is impossible. Rather, such insight is to be gained by narrative history rather than theory construction of the traditional sort (Code 1987).

5.3. Responsibilism II

Following Sosa, Code tends to think of intellectual virtues as broad cognitive faculties or abilities pertaining to some subject matter. In this respect both authors are following Aristotle, who names intuition, scientific understanding, wisdom and prudence as intellectual virtues. For example, for Aristotle intuition is the ability to know first principles, while scientific understanding is the ability to deduce further truths from these. James Montmarquet has developed the notion of an intellectual virtue in a different direction, conceiving them on the model of Aristotle's moral virtues. Rather than thinking of intellectual virtues as cognitive faculties or abilities, he conceives them as personality traits, such as impartiality and intellectual courage. In sum, intellectual virtues are personality traits that a person who desires the truth would want to have.

Like Code, Montmarquet criticizes Sosa's position for not sufficiently exploiting the resources of virtue theory in ethics. Also like Code, he criticizes Sosa's emphasis on the reliability of intellectual virtues, and wants to replace this with an emphasis on responsibility and other concepts related to agency. According to Montmarquet, it is a mistake to characterize the intellectual virtues as reliable in the sense of truth-conducive. This is because we can imagine possible worlds, such as Descartes' demon world, where the beliefs of epistemically virtuous people are almost entirely false. Alternatively, we can imagine worlds where the intellectually lazy and careless have mostly true beliefs. Suppose we were to somehow discover that ours was such a world. Would we then revise our opinions about which traits count as intellectual virtues and which as vices? Montmarquet argues that we would not. Traits like intellectual courage and carefulness are virtues even if we are unfortunate enough to be the victims of a Cartesian deceiver, and traits like laziness and carelessness are vices even if, contrary to appearances, they turn out to be reliable. But then reliability cannot be a distinctive mark of the intellectual virtues.

A different approach is to characterize the virtues in terms of a desire for truth. According to Montmarquet, the central intellectual virtue is epistemic conscientiousness. To be conscientious in this sense is to be motivated to arrive at truth and to avoid error; it is to have an appropriate desire for the truth. Here there is a parallel with moral conscientiousness, where a morally conscientious person is someone who tries her best to do what is right. This notion of epistemic conscientiousness is closely related to that of epistemic responsibility, or perhaps identical with it. Hence with Code, Montmarquet makes epistemic responsibility rather than reliability central to his understanding of intellectual virtue.

According to Montmarquet, then, epistemic conscientiousness is the central intellectual virtue. However, intellectual virtue cannot be understood solely in terms of a desire for truth, since one's desire for truth must be appropriately regulated. We must therefore countenance additional regulative virtues, which constitute ways of being conscientious. Montmarquet classifies these under three main categories. “Virtues of impartiality” include such personality traits as openness to the ideas of others, willingness to exchange ideas, and a lively sense of one's own fallibility. “Virtues of intellectual sobriety” oppose the excitement and rashness of the overly enthusiastic. Finally, “virtues of intellectual courage” include a willingness to conceive and examine alternatives to popular ideas, perseverance in the face of opposition from others, and determination to see an inquiry through to the end.

Montmarquet suggests that we can use the above account of intellectual virtue to define an important sense of subjective justification. Specifically,

S is subjectively justified in believing p insofar as S is epistemically virtuous in believing p.

This is not the kind of justification that turns true belief into knowledge. This is because Gettier cases show that a person can be justified in believing something in this sense, but still lack the kind of objective relation to the truth required for knowledge. Nevertheless, Montmarquet argues, the above sense of justification is important regarding a different issue. Namely, Montmarquet is concerned with the problem of morally evaluating actions. More specifically, he is concerned with the problem of blaming persons for actions which, from their own point of view, are morally justified. Often enough, the morally outrageous actions of tyrants, racists and terrorists seem perfectly reasonable, even necessary, in the context of their distorted belief system. In order to find the actions blameworthy in such cases, it would seem that we have to find the beliefs blameworthy as well. In other words, we need some account of “doxastic responsibility,” or the kind of responsibility for belief that can ground responsibility for actions. The above account of subjective justification, Montmarquet argues, provides what we are looking for. Precisely because it understands justification in terms of intellectually virtuous behavior, the account allows a plausible sense in which justified (and unjustified) belief is under a person's control. This, in turn, makes the relevant beliefs to be appropriate objects of blame and praise.

One objection to this sort of view is that judgements of responsibility are inappropriate in the cognitive domain. The idea is that judgements of praise and blame presuppose voluntary control, and that we lack such control over our beliefs. Montmarquet responds to this objection by distinguishing between a weak and a strong sense of voluntary control. Roughly, a belief is voluntary in the weak sense if it is formed in circumstances which do not interfere with virtuous belief formation. This kind of voluntariness amounts to freedom from interference or coercion. A belief is voluntary in the strong sense (again roughly) if it is subject to one's will. Montmarquet's strategy is to concede that responsibility requires weak voluntary control, but to argue that we often have this kind of control over our beliefs. Second, he concedes that we do not typically have strong voluntary control over our beliefs, but argues that responsibility does not require it.

The analogy with action is instructive. One can be appropriately blamed for negligent actions and inadvertent actions, and even in cases where there is no actual choice regarding the action in question. In cases of action as well as belief, strong voluntary control is not necessary for responsibility. On the other hand, praise or blame would be inappropriate in cases where action is coerced. However, many of our beliefs satisfy the relevant “no coercion condition,” and so are weakly voluntary in that sense (Montmarquet 1993).

5.4. A Mixed Theory

Greco has argued that intellectual virtue is closely tied to epistemic responsibility, but without rejecting Sosa's position that the virtues are reliable, or truth-conducive. The main idea is that an adequate account of knowledge ought to contain both a responsibility condition and a reliability condition. Moreover, a virtue account can explain how the two are tied together. In cases of knowledge, objective reliability is grounded in epistemically responsible action.

The way this works is as follows. First, we can give an account of subjective justification in terms of epistemic responsibility:

S is subjectively justified in believing p if and only if S's believing p is epistemically responsible.

The notion of responsibility, in turn, can be understood in terms of the dispositions S manifests when S is thinking conscientiously, or is motivated to believe the truth. Such motivation need not be self-conscious, or even univocal. Rather, it is meant to specify the kind of default position that people are usually in, and to oppose this to the alternative motivations involved in such things as wishful thinking, pig-headedness and attention grabbing. This suggests the following account of subjective justification.

S is subjectively justified in believing p if and only if S's believing p results from the dispositions that S manifests when S is motivated to believe the truth.

Finally, this kind of subjective justification gives rise to objective reliability when things go well:

S knows p only in cases where (a) S is subjectively justified in believing p, and (b) as a result of this S is objectively reliable in believing p.

One feature of the above account is that it understands both justified belief and knowledge in terms of the dispositions that make up S's cognitive character. In other words, it makes the notion of virtuous character primary, and then gives accounts of justified belief and knowledge in terms of this. Accordingly, we can define virtuous character in terms of proper motivation and reliability as these notions are understood above, and then given the following (partial) account of knowledge.

S knows p only in cases where S's believing p results from a virtuous cognitive character. (Greco 2000)

5.5. A Social/Genetic Approach

Jonathan Kvanvig has argued for a more radical departure from traditional epistemological concerns. According to Kvanvig, traditional epistemology is dominated by an “individualistic” and “synchronic” conception of knowledge. Accordingly, one of the most important tasks from the traditional perspective is to specify the conditions under which an individual S knows a proposition p at a particular time t. Kvanvig argues that this perspective should be abandoned in favor of a new social/genetic approach. Whereas the traditional perspective focuses on questions about justified belief and knowledge of individuals at particular times, a new genetic epistemology would focus on the cognitive life of the mind as it develops within a social context. From the new perspective, questions concerning individuals are replaced with questions concerning the group, and questions concerning knowledge at a particular time are abandoned for questions about cognitive development and learning. Kvanvig argues that there are at least two ways in which the virtues would be central within the new perspective. First, the virtues are essential to understanding the cognitive life of the mind, particularly the development and learning which takes place over time through mimicking and imitation of virtuous agents. Second, in a social/genetic approach the virtues would play a central role in the characterization of cognitive ideals. For example, what makes a certain structuring of information superior, Kvanvig argues, is that it is the kind of structuring that a person of intellectual virtue would come to possess in the appropriate circumstances (Kvanvig 1992).

5.6. A Neo-Aristotelian Theory

We have seen that both Code and Montmarquet argue for a closer affinity between virtue epistemology and Aristotle's theory of the moral virtues. For example, Montmarquet thinks of the intellectual virtues as epistemically relevant personality traits, and both authors emphasize the close connection between virtue, agency and responsibility. The most detailed and systematic presentation of a neo-Aristotelian view, however, is due to Linda Zagzebski. She argues for a unified account of the intellectual and moral virtues, modeled on Aristotle's account of the moral virtues. Her view should be characterize as “neo-Aristotelian” rather than “Aristotelian,” because Aristotle did not hold that the moral and intellectual virtues are unified in this way.

First, Zagzebski endorses the “direction of analysis thesis” characterized above. The distinctive feature of a virtue theory in ethics, she argues, is that it analyzes right action in terms of virtuous character, rather than the other way around.

By a pure virtue theory I mean a theory that makes the concept of a right act derivative from the concept of a virtue or some inner state of a person that is a component of virtue. This is a point both about conceptual priority and about moral ontology. In a pure virtue theory the concept of a right act is defined in terms of the concept of a virtue or a component of virtue such as motivation. Furthermore, the property of rightness is something that emerges from the inner traits of persons. (Zagzebski 1996, 79)

An epistemology modeled on this kind of ethical theory, then, would analyze justification and other important normative properties of belief in terms of intellectual virtue. Moreover, Zagzebski argues, we can give a unified account of moral and intellectual virtue based on an Aristotelian model of the moral virtues. In fact, she argues, intellectual virtues are best understood as a subset of the moral virtues.

According to Aristotle, the moral virtues are acquired traits of character that involve both a motivational component and a reliable success component. For example, moral courage is the virtue according to which a person is characteristically motivated to risk danger when something of value is at stake, and is reliably successful at doing so. Likewise, we can understand benevolence as the virtue according to which a person is motivated to bring about the well-being of others, and is reliably successful at doing so. Intellectual virtues have an analogous structure, Zagzebski argues. Just as all moral virtues can be understood in terms of a general motivation for the good, all intellectual virtues may be understood in terms of a general motivation for knowledge and other kinds of high-quality cognitive contact with reality. Individual intellectual virtues can then be specified in terms of more specific motivations that are related to the general motivation for knowledge. For example, open-mindedness is the virtue according to which a person is motivated to be receptive to new ideas, and is reliably successful at achieving the end of this motivation. Intellectual courage is the virtue according to which a person is motivated to be perservering in her own ideas, and is reliably successful at doing this.

Understanding the intellectual virtues this way, we can go on to define a number of important deontic properties of belief. Each definition, Zagzebski argues, is parallel to a definition for an analogous deontic property of actions.

A justified belief is what a person who is motivated by intellectual virtue, and who has the understanding of his cognitive situation a virtuous person would have, might believe in like circumstances.

An unjustified belief is what a person who is motivated by intellectual virtue, and who has the understanding of his cognitive situation a virtuous person would have, would not believe in like circumstances.

A belief of epistemic duty is what a person who is motivated by intellectual virtue, and who has the understanding of his cognitive situation a virtuous person would have, would believe in like circumstances. (Zagzebski 1996)

As with the moral virtues, it is possible for a conflict among the intellectual virtues to arise. Thus the intellectually courageous thing to do might conflict with the intellectually humble thing to do. This problem is solved by introducing the mediating virtue of phronesis, or practical wisdom. The practically wise person is able to weigh the demands of all the relevant virtues is a given situation, so as to direct her cognitive activity appropriately. Accordingly we get the following definitions of “all things considered” justification.

A justified belief, all things considered, is what a person with phronesis might believe in like circumstances.

An unjustified belief, all things considered, is what a person with phronesis would not believe in like circumstances.

A belief is a duty, all things considered, just in case it is what a person with phronesis would believe in like circumstances.

Finally, Zagzebski argues that we can give a definition of knowledge by first defining an “act of intellectual virtue”.

An act of intellectual virtue A is an act that arises from the motivational component of A, is something a person with virtue A would (probably) do in the circumstances, is successful in achieving the end of the A motivation, and is such that the agent acquires a true belief (cognitive contact with reality) through these features of the act.

We may then define knowledge as follows:

Knowledge is a state of true belief (cognitive contact with reality) arising out of acts of intellectual virtue.

Since the truth condition is redundant, we may say alternatively:

Knowledge is a state of belief arising out of acts of intellectual virtue.

6. Knowledge

In very general terms, knowledge is non-accidentally true belief. Different theories spell out “non-accidentally” differently. Virtue epistemologists have converged on a common understanding of that important term. Simply put, to know is to believe the truth because of your intellectual virtue. Here are some statements of the thesis in question.

We have reached the view that knowledge is true belief out of intellectual virtue, belief that turns out right by reason of the virtue and not just by coincidence. (Sosa 1991, 277)

[The knower] derives epistemic credit … that she would not be due had she only accidentally happened upon a true belief…. The difference that makes a value difference here is the variation in the degree to which a person's abilities, powers, and skills are causally responsible for the outcome, believing truly that p. (Riggs 2002, 93–4)

[The knower] is successful in accepting what is true because she accepts what she does in a trustworthy way in the particular case. Her trustworthiness explains her success in accepting what is true…. Her trustworthiness and the reliability of it explains her success in the particular case. (Lehrer 2000, 223)

To say that someone knows is to say that his believing the truth can be credited to him. It is to say that the person got things right due to his own abilities, efforts and actions, rather than due to dumb luck, or blind chance, or something else. (Greco 2003, 111)

Thus VE provides an interesting account of the way that knowledge is non-accidentally true belief. Closely connected with this view is what has come to be known as “the credit thesis”: that one deserves credit for what one knows. More will be said about VE's credit thesis below.

Zagzebski (1996, 271–1) argues that we can give a definition of knowledge by first defining an “act of intellectual virtue.”

An act of intellectual virtue A is an act that arises from the motivational component of A, is something a person with virtue A would (probably) do in the circumstances, is successful in achieving the end of the A motivation, and is such that the agent acquires a true belief (cognitive contact with reality) through these features of the act.

We may then define knowledge like so: to know is to believe the truth because you believe (intellectually) virtuously. As Zagzebski puts it, “Knowledge is a state of true belief (cognitive contact with reality) arising out of acts of intellectual virtue.”

One benefit of this theory, Zagzebski argues, is that it solves the Gettier problem. Gettier cases follow a recipe. Start with a belief sufficiently justified to meet the justification condition for knowledge. Then add an element of bad luck that would normally prevent the justified belief from being true. Lastly add a dose of good luck that “cancels out the bad,” so the belief ends up true anyhow. It has proven difficult to explain why this “double luck” prevents knowledge.

Here is a Gettier case (adapted from Zagzebski 1996, 285–6). Mary enters the house and looks into the living room. A familiar appearance greets her from her husband's chair. She thinks, “My husband is sitting in the living room,” and then walks into the den. But Mary misidentified the man in the chair. It is not her husband, but his brother, whom she had no reason to believe was even in the country (bad luck). However, her husband was seated along the opposite wall of the living room, out of Mary's sight, dozing in a different chair (good luck).

Zagzebski's solution to the Gettier problem is that knowledge requires you to believe the truth “because of” your intellectual virtues, but Gettier subjects do not believe the truth because of their virtues, and so do not know. Consider her diagnosis of why Mary doesn't know. Mary exhibits

all the relevant intellectual virtues and no intellectual vices in the process of forming the belief, but she is not led to the truth through those virtuous processes or motives. So even though Mary has the belief she has because of her virtues and the belief is true, she does not have the truth because of her virtues. (Zagzebski 1996, 297)

(Greco 2003 and Sosa 2007, ch. 5 offer similar solutions to the Gettier problem.)

Some critics (e.g. Murphy 1998, Roberts and Wood 2007) complain that Zagzebksi's view is uninformative because we lack an adequate understanding of what it is to believe “because of” or “out of” virtue. Others (e.g., Levin 2004) argue that her view is simply false because there's no notion of “because of” suited to her purpose. Zagzebski (1998, 108 ff.) agrees that a more informative account of this relation would be satisfying.

Jason Baehr (2006a) argues that Zagzebski's theory is both too strong and too weak. It's too weak because it doesn't rule out all Gettier cases, particularly ones where someone gets lucky because they believed virtuously. It's too strong because it rules out much ordinary perceptual knowledge (compare Greco 2002, 296). On Zagzebski's view, acting out of virtue requires your action to be virtuously motivated. A courageous action must be motivated by courageous sentiment toward facing danger when it's worth doing so. Likewise a witting belief must be motivated by an appropriate emotion to achieve “cognitive contact” with reality. But ordinary perceptual knowledge, such as one's knowledge that the lights just went out, involves no such emotional motivation. He one does not act at all, much less act motivated by emotion. Instead one seems to be the passive recipient of a true belief automatically caused by one's cognitive faculties' proper functioning.

Recently Greco (2003, 123, 127–32; see also Greco 2002, 308–11, and Greco 2010) has argued that knowledge is intellectually creditable true belief. Intellectual credit accrues just in case you believe the truth because of your reliable cognitive abilities. Greco provides a detailed and principled account of the relevant “because of” relation, derived from a general theory of the pragmatics of causal discourse. You believe the truth because of your abilities just in case (i) those abilities form “an important and necessary part of the total set of causal factors that” produce your true belief, and (ii) no other factor “trumps” your abilities' explanatory salience.

In favor of this account, Greco argues that it (A) goes most of the way toward solving the Gettier problem, (B) solves the lottery problem, and (C) places epistemic evaluation in a familiar pattern. We'll save explanation of C till the end of this section, focusing presently on A and B.

Although the Gettier subject's abilities are involved in producing her true belief, other factors trump their explanatory salience (Greco 2003, 127–132) . Specifically, “bad luck/good luck” confluence is so odd that it undermines the explanatory salience normally accorded to the believer's cognitive abilities. Thus Mary's true belief is no longer explained, or at least not sufficiently enough explained, by her abilities. It is instead primarily explained by the fortunate presence of her unseen dozing husband. Greco argues that this is akin to a deviant causal chain, where the usual cause of an effect is involved in its production, but in an unusual way. For example a spark causes a fire, but only because it inspires an arsonist to light a match and toss it into a can of gasoline.

Now consider the lottery problem. It seems that we ordinarily gain lots of knowledge by reasoning inductively. For example when I hibernate my computer, I believe it will properly restart. My grounds are inductive; I reason from past experience, of both myself and others. Of course it's possible that it won't properly restart, but it's extremely unlikely. (It's a Mac.) And I can know that it'll properly restart. Contrast that with the following case. I'm given a single ticket in a very large, fair, single-winner lottery. I believe I will lose. My grounds are inductive. It's possible that I'll win, but overwhelmingly unlikely. My odds of losing are even better than the odds that my computer will properly restart. Yet many people have the intuition that I don't know I'll lose. Why the difference? According to Greco, it's because, in general, “salient chance undermines credit,” and in the lottery case the salience of chance is high (Greco 2003, 123–127).

The underlying idea of Sosa's theory of knowledge has remained essentially intact from at least the mid-1980s (see the papers reprinted in Sosa 1991, esp. part IV), but he has recently reformulated his account so as to place it within a more general theory of evaluation (Sosa 2007, chs. 2, 4 and 5). Central to this is his AAA-model of performance assessment.

We can assess performances for accuracy, adroitness and aptness (Sosa 2007, 22–3). Accurate performances achieve their aim, adroit performances manifest competence, and apt performances are accurate because adroit. This AAA-model applies to all conduct and performances with an aim, whether intentional (as in ballet) or unintentional (as with a heartbeat). 

Here's how the model applies in epistemology. Belief-formation is a psychological performance with an aim. For beliefs Sosa identifies accuracy with truth, adroitness with manifesting intellectual competence, and aptness with being “true because competent.” Apt belief, then, is belief that is true because competent. A competence, in turn, “is a disposition, one with a basis resident in the competent agent, one that would in appropriately normal conditions ensure (or make highly likely) the success of any relevant performance issued by it” (Sosa 2007, 29). Sosa identifies knowledge with apt belief, and points out that this is just “a special case” of “creditable, apt performance,” a status common across the gamut of human activities.

Consider the performance of an archer who hits a bulls-eye because she shoots competently. Her shot is apt, and her bulls-eye an achievement. It's possible that she might easily have missed. She might have luckily avoided being drugged before the competition, which would have impaired her competence. Or a strong gust of wind, which would have ruined her shot, might have just been avoided by a rare confluence of local meteorological conditions. In either of these ways, her performance might have been unsafe but still apt (Sosa 2007, 28–9). Sosa (2007, 31) thinks that knowledge is also like this: in some cases you might believe aptly, and thus know, even though you might easily have been wrong

Duncan Pritchard (2009) argues that this feature of Sosa's view opens it up to counterexamples. In particular, he argues that Sosa's view gives the wrong verdict in the fake-barn case: Henry and his son are driving through the country. Henry pulls over to stretch his legs, and while doing so regales his son with a list of currently visible roadside items. “That's a tractor. That's a combine. That's a horse. That's a silo. And that's a fine barn,” he adds, pointing to the nearby roadside barn. But unbeknownst to them, the locals recently replaced nearly every barn in the country with fake barns (they're in “Fake Barn Country”). Henry happens to see the one real barn in the whole county. Had he instead set eyes on any of the numerous nearby fakes, he would have falsely believed it was a barn.

Henry has a true belief because of his perceptual acuity, Pritchard says. So it counts as apt. So Sosa's view entails that Henry knows. But, Pritchard further says, it's obvious that Henry doesn't know. Sosa (2007, 31 ff. and 96 n. 1) deals with such cases by saying that the subject does know, but does not know that he knows — in Sosa's terminology, he has animal knowledge, but lacks reflective knowledge.

Pritchard (2008a, 445) raises a similar objection to Greco's view. Greco's (2009, 25) response has two parts. First, abilities are always environment-relative. For example Tiger Woods has the ability to sink putts in clement weather here on Earth, but doesn't have the ability to sink putts in hurricane-force winds, or on a putting green in the International Space Station. Second, Henry does not have the ability to reliably perceptually identify barns in Fake Barn Country. So, Greco argues, his view predicts that Henry does not know.

We've already looked extensively at VE accounts of knowledge, which proceed from the intuitive thought that knowledge is a kind of achievement or apt performance, and so something for which you deserve credit. Wayne Riggs (2007) arrives at the same conclusion, but from a different angle. He takes as his starting point the intuitive thought that you don't know something if it is “largely a matter of luck” that you believe it. But why does knowledge preclude luck in this way? Riggs says this is best explained by the hypothesis that knowledge is “an achievement for which the knower deserves credit” (Riggs 2009, 341).

An outcome can be lucky relative to you in either of two ways, says Riggs. First, it might not be due to your abilities. Second, you might not intend it. Accordingly Riggs proposes that you know something just in case (A) your abilities produce your true belief, and (B) this is not “inadvertent” (Riggs 2007, 335). To satisfy B, your desire to believe truths rather than falsehoods must be “sufficiently operative” in prompting your belief (Riggs 2007, 336).

To recapitulate, VE's basic idea about knowledge is: to know is to believe the truth because you believe virtuously. This approach to knowledge generalizes. The relationship between virtue, success and credit works similarly outside of intellectual evaluation. You deserve moral credit for an action just in case it derives from your moral character. You deserve credit for an athletic success just in case it derives from your athletic abilities. Epistemic evaluation thus reveals itself as one example of a familiar and pervasive pattern of evaluation. Practitioners see this as a great advantage of their approach.

7. Skepticism

VE was originally put forward by Sosa to resolve the foundationalist/coherentist dispute. Virtue epistemologists also claim that their approach provides powerful tools for diagnosing and resisting skeptical arguments.

According to a familiar skeptical argument, all knowledge must be grounded in good reasons, and this threatens to require an infinite (and impossible) regress of reasons. VE, says Sosa, explains why not all knowledge requires grounding in reasons. Knowledge is true belief grounded in intellectual virtue, and not all intellectual virtues involve grounding in reasons. Some virtues are virtues of reasoning: some intellectual excellences are dispositions to infer conclusions from premises already believed. But not all intellectual excellences are like that. Good memory and accurate perception are intellectual excellences but don't involve inference from believed premises. In healthy human beings, perception reliably produces belief on the basis of perceptual experience, and memory reliably and non-inferentially produces beliefs about the past. Sound reasoning (of various sorts) is also a reliable source of belief, and this explains why sound reasoning is an intellectual virtue. But a virtue theory need not privilege some virtues over others-knowledge is true belief grounded in the intellectual virtues of the knower, reasoning or otherwise. (Sosa 1980)

A different skeptical problem concerns our ability to rule out alternatives to what we claim to know. Consider Descartes's belief that he is sitting by the fire in a dressing gown. Presumably he has this belief because this is how things are presented to him by his senses. However, Descartes reasons, things could appear to him just as they do even if he were in fact not sitting by the fire, but was instead sleeping, or mad, or the victim of an evil deceiver. The point isn't that these other things might well be true, or that they ought to be taken seriously as real possibilities. Rather, it's that Descartes cannot rule these possibilities out. And if he cannot rule them out, then he cannot know that he is sitting by the fire.

What's worse, Descartes's reasoning seems to generalize. In general, I cannot know anything about the world unless I can know that various skeptical possibilities are false. But since I cannot know that, it follows that I do not know anything about the world. More formally, for any claim about the world p and skeptical hypothesis h,

  1. K(p) ⇒ K(not-h)
  2. not-K(not-h)
  3. Therefore, not-K(p)

An ingenious response to this skeptical argument invokes the idea that knowledge-attributions are sensitive to context. Specifically, context determines how high the standards for knowledge claims are set. Using this idea, the contextualist concedes that the skeptical argument is sound and the conclusion true in “philosophical” contexts, or contexts where the standards for knowledge-claims are set very high by the skeptic. On the other hand, premise 2 of the argument is false in ordinary contexts. In everyday life the standards for knowledge-claims are set much lower, and so ordinary knowledge-claims about the world are true.

Sosa (1999, 2000) argues that no such concession to the skeptic is necessary. On Sosa's view, S knows that p just in case (roughly) S's belief is virtuously formed and thereby “safe,” where a belief that p is safe just in case S would believe that p only if p were true. As Sosa points out, on plausible interpretations of the relevant subjunctive conditional, our beliefs about the world typically are safe, and so qualify as knowledge. (Note: as explained above, Sosa (2007, ch. 2) later abandoned the safety condition on virtuous (“apt”) belief and knowledge.)

To see this, we need to make a short digression to consider the truth conditions for subjunctive conditionals. Imagine that Jones is a man of modest means, but who loves modern art. Now consider the following subjunctive conditional: Jones would buy an original Picasso only if he were rich. We think that the conditional is true because we think that Jones wants to own an original Picasso, but that only rich people buy original Picassos. We can imagine circumstances where Jones would indeed buy a Picasso, but in these imagined circumstances Jones is rich. Notice that the conditional is true even though we can imagine scenarios where original Picassos are dirt cheap and where nearly anyone could buy one. But this kind of scenario is not relevant for judging the truth of the conditional. Rather, we judge the truth of the conditional by imagining circumstances that are relatively close to the way things actually stand, and by judging how things would go in those sorts of circumstances. Again, consider the following subjunctive conditional: Jones would have an opportunity to walk on the moon only if he were an astronaut. The conditional is true, even though we can imagine very different circumstances where even ordinary folk have the opportunity to walk on the moon.

Now consider Descartes's belief that he is sitting by the fire. Descartes's belief is safe, in that he would believe that he is sitting by the fire only if it were true that he is. Put another way, if Descartes were not sitting by the fire — if he were in the next room pouring a drink, for example — he would not believe that he was sitting by the fire. What is more, our beliefs that skeptical hypotheses are false are also safe. I believe that I am not a disembodied brain in a vat, deceived by a computer-generated hallucination. And my belief that I am not is safe in the relevant sense: in any circumstances that are relatively similar to the way things are, if I believe that I am not a brain in a vat, I am not. In the language of possible world semantics: in the actual world and in close possible worlds where I believe that I am not a brain in a vat, I am not a brain in a vat. This is so even if there are far off worlds where I am a brain in a vat and believe that I am not. Since that sort of world is not close to the actual world, it is not relevant for fixing the truth of the subjunctive conditional in question.

Sosa's idea (later abandoned) that knowledge is safe belief accords well with a virtue-theoretic approach to knowledge. This is because the intellectual virtues (as here understood) are abilities to judge what is true. And, in general, whether one has an ability is a function of one's success rate across close possible worlds. In other words, to say that someone has an ability to achieve X is to say that she would be successful in achieving X in a range of situations relatively similar to those in which she typically finds herself. But then possibilities that do not occur in typical situations are irrelevant for determining whether a person has some ability in question. For example, it does not count against Barry Bonds' ability to hit baseballs that he cannot hit them if they are thrown two-hundred miles per hour. Likewise, it does not count against our perceptual abilities that we cannot discriminate real tables and chairs from computer-generated hallucinations or demon-induced dreams. The fact that we would be deceived in skeptical scenarios is irrelevant to whether we have the cognitive virtues (or abilities) required for knowledge (Greco 2000).

8. Epistemic Value

What is the nature of epistemic value and how is knowledge distinctively epistemically valuable? In particular, why is knowledge more valuable than mere true belief, especially if true belief serves just as well for action? Such questions have occupied center stage in recent epistemology (see Pritchard 2007 for an overview), nowhere more so than in the writings of virtue epistemologists, for they think their approach is uniquely suited to provide satisfying answers.

Zagzebski (2003) argues that an adequate account of knowledge must explain why knowledge is more valuable than mere true belief. This is known as “the value problem.” And VE is very well positioned to solve it, she argues, because the correct solution must help us see how knowledge possesses value independently of anything “external” to its production. A good cup of coffee is not better simply because it was made by a good, reliable coffee machine. Likewise a true belief is not made better simply because it was formed by a reliable method. The added value must come from something “internal” to it. The solution is to view knowledge as a credit-worthy state of the agent, produced or sustained by her virtuous agency.

Berit Brogaard (2006, 340) objects to Zagzebksi's argument, on the grounds that it presupposes a “Moorean conception of value,” which says that perfect intrinsic duplicates must be equally valuable. Being perfect intrinsic duplicates ensures the same intrinsic value, and the same instrumental value relative to any environment — that is, relative to any specific environment, either would equally well promote any valuable goal. But, Brogaard points out, intrinsic and instrumental value aren't the only sort of value. In particular, things can have additional value in virtue of non-instrumental extrinsic relations. Consider two pens, A and B, which currently are molecule-for-molecule duplicates. Darwin used A to write The Origin of Species, whereas Hitler used B to sign some gruesome order. Surely A is more valuable than B — we value it more for its own sake. Once we recognize the possibility of this type of final, extrinsic value, Brogaard argues, we needn't think that knowledge's added value must come from something “internal” to it, in which case Zagzebski has failed to establish that VE is especially well-positioned to solve the value problem.

Greco (2003, 2010) and Sosa (2003, 2007) contend that knowledge is a kind of achievement — namely, intellectual success through ability, for which you are creditable. And in general, success through virtue is more valuable than mere success, especially accidental success. So knowledge is more valuable than true belief. (Riggs 1998, 2002, 2009 makes a similar proposal.)

The hapless subject of a Gettier example has a justified true belief, and so succeeds in a sense. But he doesn't know, because it's just “an accident” that his belief is true. Its truth isn't properly attributable to his intellectual abilities. Compare the archery shot that hits the bulls-eye, but only because a gust of wind fortuitously pressured it several feet westward. It's an archery success, and thus valuable in a sense. But it's not as valuable or admirable as a shot that strikes the bulls-eye because of the shooter's masterful skill. Knowledge's special value is just a specific instance of this more general pattern.

Aristotle made a related distinction between achieving some end by luck or accident, and achieving it through the exercise of one's abilities or virtues. It is only the latter kind of action, Aristotle argues, that is both finally valuable (valuable for its own sake) and constitutive of human flourishing. “Human good,” he writes, “turns out to be activity of soul exhibiting excellence.” (Nicomachean Ethics, I.7) The successful exercise of one's intellectual virtues is both finally valuable and constitutive of human flourishing, which is also finally valuable. This pertains to moral and intellectual virtue. Assuming the basic VE line on knowledge is correct, we get an elegant solution to the value problem.

The approach's significance is not limited to solving the value problem. It is also plausible that the successful exercise of intellectual courage is also valuable for its own sake, and also constitutive of the best intellectual life. And there is a long tradition that says the same about wisdom and the same about understanding. This suggests that there are a plurality of intellectual virtues, and their successful exercise gives rise to a plurality of epistemic goods. The best intellectual life — intellectual flourishing, so to speak — is rich with all of these (Greco 2004, Riggs 2003, Sosa 2003, Zagzebski 1996). For criticism of this line, and an alternative approach to the value problem within a VE framework, see Pritchard 2010.

9. Credit

As we've seen in the sections on knowledge and epistemic value, a central thesis of VE is that knowledge is a credit-worthy state of the agent. You know only if you deserve credit for believing the truth. Call this “the credit thesis.” The credit thesis helps explain knowledge's value. It also features prominently in attempts to resolve the Gettier problem and explain epistemic luck.

Jennifer Lackey (2007) argues that we do not deserve credit for everything we know, so (a) standard VE definitions of knowledge are false, and (b) VE is not ideally suited to explain knowledge's value. She presents counterexamples involving testimonial and innate knowledge. On Lackey's understanding, to earn credit for a true belief, your “reliable cognitive faculties” must be “the most salient part” of the explanation for why you believe the truth (Lackey 2007, 351). (If they need only be a necessary or important part of the explanation, then Gettier problems immediately arise (Lackey 2007, 347–8).)

Here is a close variant of one of Lackey's cases (Lackey 2007, 352), what she later (2009) calls “CHICAGO VISITOR”:

Morris just arrived at the Chicago train station and wants directions to the Sears Tower. He approaches the first adult passerby he sees ('Passerby') and asks for directions. Passerby knows the city extraordinarily well and articulately offers impeccable directions: the tower is two blocks east of the station. On that basis Morris unhesitatingly forms the corresponding true belief.

Lackey reasons as follows. Morris clearly gains knowledge of the tower's location. But Passerby's contribution is most salient in explaining why Morris learned the truth. Morris's contribution to the process is minimal, and his reliable cognitive faculties are not the most salient part of the explanation for why he believes the truth. So Morris doesn't deserve credit, although he does know. She concludes that the credit thesis is false.

Lackey also asks us to consider “the possibility of natural innate knowledge” (Lackey 2007, 358). Surely such knowledge is possible, so an adequate theory of knowledge must accommodate the possibility. But “it seems highly unlikely that a subject would deserve credit for such knowledge.” For the belief's origin, “such as natural selection or some other evolutionary mechanism,” would be the most salient part of the explanation for why you had the true belief. So the credit thesis is false.

Greco (2007) responds that Morris still deserves credit for learning the truth. Credit for cooperative success can accrue to multiple individuals, even ones who contribute less than others. It generally requires only that your “efforts and abilities” be “appropriately involved” in the success (Greco 2007, 65). Suppose we are playing ice hockey and you make an extraordinarily brilliant play to set me up for a goal. The goalie prostrate outside his crease, the defensemen dizzy and confused behind the net, I simply tap the puck in. Your contribution dwarfs mine, but I still deserve credit for the goal. Likewise, Passerby does most of the work, yet Morris still gets credit because his intellectual abilities were appropriately involved.

Sosa (2007, 95) responds that Morris still deserves “partial credit,” even though his success in believing the truth is primarily attributable to a “socially seated competence” embodied in the people involved in the testimonial chain. This suffices for his belief to be apt, and thus count as knowledge. Partial credit grounded in apt performance is a perfectly general phenomenon, as common in team sport as in testimony. “The quarterback's pass derives from his competence, but its great success, its being a touchdown pass manifests more fully the team's competence.”

Riggs (2009, 209) responds that it isn't clear that Morris does know where the tower is. We aren't compelled to count as knowledge every “casual, unreflective acceptance of testimony” (Riggs 2009, 214). And notice that if we continue the story by having someone soon afterward ask Morris where the tower is, he'd be out of line to simply assert, “It's two blocks that way,” which suggests that he doesn't really know after all (Riggs 2009, 210–11). Beyond that, Riggs distinguishes two senses of credit: praiseworthiness and attributability. Knowledge requires that your true belief be attributable to you as an agent, but not that you be praiseworthy for it. Riggs claims that Lackey's objections wrongly suppose that defenders of the credit thesis think that knowledge requires praiseworthiness, are too closely tied to Greco's particular account of credit (with its emphasis on explanatory salience), and also overlook the possibility of “group effort” in achievements.

Lackey (2009) replies to Greco, Riggs and Sosa. Her response is subtle and multidimensional, but its centerpiece is a dilemma for VE's credit thesis. Either VE's notion of creditworthiness is substantial enough to rule out credit for Gettier subjects or it isn't. If it is substantial enough, then it rules out too much testimonial knowledge, in which case it fails. If it isn't substantial enough, then it suffers refutation by Gettier cases, in which case fails. Either way, it fails. (Compare Kvanvig 2003; Pritchard 2008b.)

10. Contextualism

A popular but hotly contested view in recent epistemology says that the truth conditions for knowledge ascriptions are context-sensitive, due to the context-sensitivity of the verb ‘knows’. Contextualists differ over how to model the context-sensitivity. Some (e.g. Stewart Cohen) say ‘know’ is an indexical, possessing a context-invariant character that is a function from contexts to contents. Others (e.g. Mark Heller) claim that ‘knows’ is a vague predicate, in need of contextual supplementation to predicate a determinate property. Critics complain that we lack independent evidence that ‘knows’ is context-sensitive in these ways, and consequently that leading contextualist proposals are unmotivated and ad hoc.

Greco (2004, 2008) defends a version of contextualism, what he calls “virtue contextualism.” Virtue contextualism emerges from the basic idea, accepted by most leading virtue epistemologists, that to know is to believe the truth because of your intellectual virtue or ability.

When we say “because of your intellectual virtue or ability,” how are we to understand ‘because’? In general, explanatory talk is context-sensitive. It is context-sensitive in two primary ways. First, abnormal features tend to be explanatorily salient. There's a panic in a Manhattan apartment building, which happens very soon after a tiger wanders into the lobby. We have no trouble identifying the panic's cause: the tiger. That's true even though the tiger's presence is not individually sufficient to cause a panic — people must also fear tigers, but they normally do. Second, our interests and purposes single out certain features as especially relevant. We tend to focus on things we can control. If a student asks me why he failed the exam, I'll point out that he rarely came to class and didn't pick up a study guide until the morning of the exam.

If explanatory talk is generally context-sensitive, and knowledge-talk is just a species of explanatory-talk, then knowledge-attributions will be context-sensitive as well. By changing what is normal, or by changing our interests and purposes, we might go from a context where saying ‘S believes the truth because of her virtue’ expresses a truth, to a context where saying the same words expresses a falsehood. And since saying ‘S knows’ is tantamount to saying ‘S believes the truth because of her virtue’, it follows that knowledge-attributions are likewise context-sensitive. By deriving its account of context-sensitivity from the general character of explanatory-talk, virtue contextualism avoids the charge that it is unmotivated and ad hoc.

11. Broadening Epistemology

Zagzebski urges us to pay more attention to understanding. On Zagzebski's view, understanding is an important epistemic state that differs importantly from knowledge in several ways. Understanding is closely tied to mastery of an art or skill, does not pertain to discrete propositions but to patterns or systems, and consequently takes a nonpropositional object. Understanding does not result from mere acquisition of information, as can propositional knowledge. She thinks of understanding as “the state of comprehension of nonpropositional structures of reality” (Zagzebski 2001, 242). She also conjectures that we can define understanding analogously to how she defines knowledge. The main difference would be in the relevant virtues that produce the different states. Whereas knowledge derives from virtues that aim at truth, understanding derives at least partly from different virtues, special ones hitherto “unanalyzed, even unrecognized” (Zagzebski 2001, 248). Looking beyond even understanding, Zagzebski further hopes that epistemologists will return their attention to wisdom. VE, she argues, makes it easier to “recover” interest in and analyze understanding and wisdom.

Another “growth area” in VE is the investigation of individual virtues and vices.

Roberts and Wood (2007, part II) provide in-depth “maps” of several intellectual virtues and many corresponding vices, most notably: love of knowledge, firmness, courage, caution, humility, autonomy, generosity and practical wisdom. The virtue of love of knowledge packages a desire for knowledge, along with a sense of the relative importance of truths, and thus which truths merit pursuit (ch. 6). The social side of the love of knowledge includes a willingness and ability to convey relevant truths to others (165). Intellectual firmness disposes us to “grip currently possessed particular intellectual goods” just tightly enough, so that we are intellectually neither too rigid nor flaccid (206). Intellectual courage and caution are the virtues that dispose us to respond appropriately to perceived threats in our intellectual lives, courage disposing us to not be unduly intimidated, caution disposing us to not take inappropriate risks in achieving intellectual goods (219). Intellectual humility disposes us to be only minimally concerned with our reputation, especially when it would interfere with the acquisition of intellectual goods (250). Intellectual autonomy disposes us to be appropriately dependent on others' intellectual guidance and achievements (261). Intellectual generosity disposes us to happily give “the intellectual goods freely to others, for their own sake” (293). Finally, practical wisdom consists in the ability to balance all relevant considerations, harmonize the demands of the various specialized intellectual virtues, and appropriately resolve any apparent conflicts, such as, for example, when autonomy and generosity appear to require incompatible responses to a situation (311).

Miranda Fricker (2003, 2007) provides a detailed case study of the vice of “epistemic injustice” suffered by the marginalized and less powerful. The vice of testimonial injustice is a disposition to assign too little credibility to someone's testimony, often based on their social status (e.g. gender, ethnicity, class). The virtue of testimonial justice is a disposition to remain aware of and prevent your prejudices from interfering with your estimation of the value of someone's testimony, what Fricker calls “reflexive critical openness” (2003, 154). What is needed is appropriate “training” of our “testimonial sensibility.” The training consists in social conditioning “of the interpretative and affective attitudes in play when we are told things by other people” (2003, 161). Fricker's study is replete with detailed examples from literature, Harper Lee's To Kill a Mockingbird and Anthony Minghella's The Talented Mr. Ripley.

Heather Battaly (2010) provides a detailed study of epistemic self-indulgence, temperance and insensibility, modeled on Aristotle's discussion of their moral analogues. An epistemically temperate person desires, consumes and enjoys appropriate intellectual objects and activities; an epistemically self-indulgent person pursues intellectual objects to excess; an epistemically insensible person has deficient epistemic desires. One interesting application of this view is that (at least some) skeptics are epistemically self-indulgent due to an excessive desire to avoid falsehood.

Jason Baehr (2010) provides a detailed study of epistemic malevolence. Malevolence generally consists in opposing the good as such — that is, making yourself the enemy of the good. Epistemic malevolence consists in opposing intellectual goods as such. Epistemic malevolence doesn't consist merely in denying that we've achieved intellectual goods such as knowledge. Rather, it requires that you willingly oppose “epistemic well-being” and the acquisition of intellectual goods. Intriguing examples include O'Brien from Orwell's 1984, who opposes the epistemic well-being of his victims, and from Frederick Douglas's autobiography, Douglas's master Tom Auld, who opposes slaves' attempts at self-education.


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contextualism, epistemic | ethics: virtue | justification, epistemic: coherentist theories of | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of | knowledge, value of | skepticism