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Dietrich of Freiberg

First published Wed Feb 23, 2005; substantive revision Fri Apr 20, 2012

The extraordinary long life and active teaching career of Albert the Great (c.1193–1280) produced many benefits for the inception of philosophy in medieval Germany. Besides the vast corpus of his writings that fostered a generation of Dominican scholars in the German-speaking province, Albert lived long enough to impart continuity to this generation, which included Ulrich of Straßburg (c.1225–1277), Dietrich of Freiberg (1250–1310), and Meister Eckhart (c. 1260–c. 1327). All of these men made extraordinary contributions to medieval philosophy, theology, and in the case of Dietrich of Freiberg, natural science. However, of all those who were formed in the shadow of Albert, Dietrich showed the most marked tendency to Albert's universality of interests.

1. Life of Dietrich of Freiberg

Little is known with certainty about the life of Dietrich of Freiberg. He was born in Freiberg in Saxony around the year 1250. He is sometimes referred to as “Dietrich of Saxony,” and often as “Theodoricus Teutonicus.” He is also mentioned in medieval documents as “Magister” or “Master,” indicating that he had advanced university training. He joined the Dominican order at a young age. We know that he was still a youth when Albertus Magnus was coming to the end of his career. But it is not known whether Dietrich studied under Albert or ever met him. Around the year 1271 he served as lector in the Dominican convent at Freiberg in Saxony. That he studied at Paris is clear, that it was sometime during the period between 1272–1274 is probable. But it is not known with whom he studied. There is evidence provided by Dietrich's own hand, found in chapter thirty of the second part of his Tractatus de intellectu et intelligibili and in other places in his works that suggests he may have studied under Henry of Ghent. Dietrich mentions a certain “solemn master” whom he heard dispute in Paris. Henry was known to his students as “doctor solemnis” and perhaps “magister solemnis” as well. An examination of Dietrich's writings suggests some themes that could possibly owe their origins to Henry of Ghent. But the matter is uncertain, and it does not seem that a careful study of the writings of either of these great masters will reveal their historical relations to one another.

Dietrich returned to Germany in 1280 and held the post of lector in the city of Trier until 1281. He returned to Paris in 1281 in order to hold lectures on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, perhaps at Saint-Jacques. He may have remained in Paris until 1293. Although the documents are not clear, most historians agree that he was appointed prior of the Dominican convent in Würzburg. In 1293 he was named Provincial Superior of his order for the province of Germany, Albert the Great's old post. Somewhere between 1296 and 1297 he was made “Master of Theology” at Paris. He continued to teach in Paris until 1300. In 1304 he was present at the general chapter of the Dominican order held at Toulouse. His name last appears in the acts of the general chapter of the order held in Piacenza in 1310. There he was appointed Vicar Provincial of Germany. After this time his name drops out of the documents.

2. Philosophical Works

Dietrich was a prolific writer. His writings include compositions on nearly every branch of theology, philosophy, and natural science known to his period. His philosophical and scientific works far outnumber his strictly theological treatises. His Opera omnia, published in the Corpus Philosophorum Teutonicorum Medii Aevi, occupy four volumes. Among his theological writings are included his treatises on the beatific vision (De visione beatifica), on the nature of Christ's body after the crucifixion (De corpore Christi mortuo), on the nature of glorified bodies (De dotibus corporum gloriosorum), on spiritual substances and the resurrection (De substantiis spiritualibus et corporibus futurae resurrectionis).

His philosophical writings, allowing that some may be classified also as scientific works, include: De habitibus, De ente et essentia, De magis et minus, De natura contrariorum, De cognitione entium separatorum et maxime animarum separatarum, De intelligentiis et motoribus caelorum, De corporibus caelestibus quoad naturam eorum corporalem, De animatione caeli, De accidentibus, De quiditatibus entium, De origine rerum praedicamentalium, De mensuris, De natura et proprietate continuorum, and the De intellectu et intelligibili.

Dietrich's scientific treatises are famous. His treatises on light (De luce), on color (De coloribus), and on the rainbow (De iride) contributed greatly to the development of optics and were composed in the scientific spirit of Albertus Magnus. Fr. William A. Wallace in his The Scientific Methodology of Theodoric of Freiberg, one of the few studies of Dietrich in English, demonstrates the dependence of Dietrich's scientific methodology on his philosophical theories, and particularly his logical writings. This dependence reveals the Albertist tendency in Dietrich, leaving no doubt that in some way he was influenced by the writings and spirit of Albert the Great.

It is important in the consideration of any of Dietrich of Freiberg's writings to remember that he was the kind of philosopher who constructed his various works from a metaphysical point of view, whether they were scientific studies on light or theological treatises on the beatific vision. For care and attention to developing a correct account of the nature of being, he tells us, will allow the philosopher to avoid many errors. The concept of being (ens), he notes, is the most fundamental of notions, distinguishing a thing from nothingness. Indeed, one can find many places in his writings where an important philosophical point or crucial distinction hinges on what Dietrich understands to be the correct notion of being, or essence, or quiddity. It is best then to begin the development of an account of Dietrich as a philosopher by attending to his metaphysics.

Fortunately Dietrich concentrated his analysis of the key concepts of his metaphysics in two relatively short treatises, De ente et essentia and De quiditatibus entium. As a result it is not necessary to reconstruct his metaphysics by searching for the metaphysical presuppositions of the entire body of his philosophical writings, as is often the case with other philosophical writers. In fact one of the characteristics of Dietrich as a thinker is the systematic way in which he not only orders his thoughts but his treatises as well. And so we need only consider these two works in order to discover his particular view of being, essence and quiddity that specifies his philosophical thinking.

3. Existence and Essence

Dietrich's De ente et essentia which bears the same title as Thomas Aquinas' opuscule is indeed a work that gives much evidence of having been prepared as a kind of rebuttal to certain doctrines of Aquinas. Both works open with a reference from Aristotle to the effect that care and caution must be taken early in the study of metaphysics with regard to fundamental notions. In fact Dietrich divides his treatise into two parts, devoting the first part to an analysis of the key metaphysical terms esse, ens, entitas, quid, and quiditas. In opposition to Aquinas he proposes the thesis that there is no real distinction between existence (esse) and essence (essentia). The existence of a thing expresses its essence and vice versa. The two notions differ only in the way they denote the thing of which they are predicated (in modis significandi)—existence expressing being in the mode of an act, essence in the mode of a possession and the term of an act.

The second part of the De ente et essentia proposes arguments, mainly based on Aquinas that deny the identity of essence and existence. Dietrich refutes each one of these arguments. The principal argument from Aquinas that Dietrich refutes is based on the premise that it is possible to understand what something is without knowing that it exists. Thus it follows according to Aquinas that esse is not included in the understanding of a thing's essentia, and therefore must be distinct from it. Dietrich responds to this argument by challenging its premise. An essence is such only because it refers to an existent. That this is so is seen from the very etymology of the word “essence” as accounted for by St. Augustine who argued that “essentia” is derived from “esse”. But the issue that lies between Dietrich and his confrere is not one of words but of principles. Armand Maurer, in his important article “The De Quidditatibus Entium of Dietrich of Freiberg and its Criticism of Thomistic Metaphysics”, sums the matter up well when he observes:

For St. Thomas, essence is a principle in created being other than esse and receptive of it. As potential to, and receptive of esse, essence is thus a principle through which and in which a thing exists. Not so for Dietrich. Essence, in his view, is not subject to an influx of esse. It is the very beingness of the thing, and hence that through which it may be said to be outside of nothingness.

Dietrich correlates his thesis of the real identity of existence and essence with his concept of being, both in its concrete form as ens or particular being and its abstract form as entitas. Ens denotes the essence of whatever is a determinate existing individual, while entitas denotes the same thing in abstraction. Ens is the most basic of all metaphysical concepts for Dietrich. It is that which first distinguishes a thing from nothingness. Both ens and entitas identify with essence. So one could say according to Dietrich that in considering a white ball for example, its ens is white, its entitas is whiteness, and its essence is that through which it is white and participates in whiteness.

4. Quid and Quiddity

Dietrich's account of quid and quiditas is more limited. He takes up these concepts in his De quiditatibus entium. Where ens, entitas, esse, and essentia are all existential terms answering the question whether something exists, in the De quiditatibus he considers the question “What is it that exists?” He begins the treatise by distinguishing quid and quiditas from the existential terms, and then proceeds to consider the differences with respect to being in substance, in logical concepts or intentions, and in accidents. Again, unlike Aquinas who equated essentia and quiditas, Dietrich sees these metaphysical concepts are being different, but not totally unrelated.

The analysis which De quiditatibus provides is subtle. The term “quid” denotes the essential mode of the being of a thing, that is, the mode of being by which it exists as a being of a certain kind. It answers the question “What is it?” On the other hand, quiditas denotes the formality by means of which a thing is a quid. It is tempting to see a connection here between ens, entitas and quid, quiditas such that the second is the condition of the first. This may lead unwary reasoners, as Dietrich no doubt felt Thomas Aquinas and others were, into equating entitas and quiditas. But quiditas denotes the formal determination of a thing. This is something over and above the being of the thing. It is a form, the form of a thing. But it is not the same as the thing. Hence it cannot be equated with either the ens or the entitas of the thing. Of course quiddity presupposes ens and esse; without its existence there could be no determination of a thing.

According to Dietrich quiddity is properly defined as the formal determination of a being, giving it its specific intrinsic character by means of which it can also be known. Strictly speaking, therefore, quiddity is found only in composite beings since it implies a formal aspect of a being. Unlike Aquinas Dietrich will not allow quiddity to designate the whole composite, even if the designation is understood to be abstract. Strictly speaking, therefore, quiddity is not applied to simple beings. Maurer suggests that the reason for this is Dietrich's adhering closely to Aristotle who in the seventh book of the Metaphysics maintains that predication with respect to quiddity must be of another thing, hence of a composite, because it answers the question why “this” of “that”? There must be a “that” in order meaningfully to ask the question “why this?” In everything having a quiddity it is thus necessary that there be a distinction between the quiddity and that which possesses the quiddity.

One consequence of Dietrich's metaphysics of quiddity is that God and what the medievals call the “intelligences” do not have quiddities since they are simple beings. Aquinas on the other hand insisted that for God essentia, esse and quiditas are identical while for all creatures the esse is other than the quiddity or the essence. Indeed, this is how Aquinas distinguishes a creature from the creator. The essence of the creator alone is the same as his act of existing. But, besides the arguments Dietrich has raised against Thomas concerning the lack of such identity in creatures Dietrich finds that Aquinas' system fails to properly account for intelligences because as simple beings there is nothing that distinguishes their essence from their act of existing—nothing except their being creatures. But to introduce creaturehood as the distinguishing feature is to render useless the importance of defining creatures in terms of the lack of identity of their essence and their act of existing. This is not a problem for Dietrich. For him some creatures are composite, some not, but in both simple and composite beings esse is the same as essentia. What remains problematic is the distinction of simple and composite creatures in terms of quiddity. To solve this problem Dietrich turns to the traditional Christian Neoplatonic notion of the hierarchy of being.

5. The Universe of Being

Dietrich did not devote any one specific work to an analysis of hierarchy. However, he makes extensive use of the notion in three treatises in particular: the De animatione caeli, the De visione beatifica, and the De intellectu et intelligibili. It is clear from reading these works as well as Dietrich's other scientific and philosophical writings in which he established the nature of the metaphysical elements of esse, ens, entia, and quiditas that he concerned himself with what might be called the metaphysical structure of reality.

A consideration that is an ever occurring theme in Dietrich is the unity of being, both created and uncreated, a unity he expressed in the term universitas entium, or universe of being. Dietrich does not tell us why he chooses the term universitas over the more common term universum. Universitas of course can mean “universality” so that universitas entium would mean the universality of being. But from the contexts in which Dietrich uses the terms such a meaning does not seem to be implied. Of course the term was used in the Middle Ages, just as it is today, to refer to an institution of higher learning, a university. Such an institution traditionally has the goal of turning (from the Latin versus) all the disciplines toward one thing or one state (unum meaning one), which is wisdom. But to render universitas entium as university of beings with its heuristic connotation would have an odd or confusing connotation. But the term universitas can also mean a whole community or a commonality of things. This is very close to the modern term universe and it seems to fit the context of Dietrich's own usage. Consequently, we have rendered Dietrich's term as universe of beings.

But why did Dietrich insist on this particular term? It is interesting to notice that the term is not found in the works of St. Thomas Aquinas. Perhaps Dietrich wanted to emphasize that the universe as he understood it included all beings, even the divine being. For Aquinas, universum was synonymous with creatura, there being a radical difference between creative being and created being, a distinction that Aquinas highlights by equating the totality of created being with the universe. Dietrich, however, does not do this. He wishes to emphasize the unity of being, created and uncreated. There is thus a community, or if you will, a university of being. And so he most likely used this term universitas to express this community of being.

6. The Distinction between God and Creatures

How then does Dietrich distinguish God from creature? We have already seen that according to his basic metaphysics Dietrich insists on the equation of existence and essence for all beings. The Thomistic distinction of essence and existence will not be permitted. Nor does Dietrich wish to distinguish God from creatures by postulating a theory of universal hylomorphism, which is the view that all creatures, even spiritual ones, are marked as creatures by the possession of some form of materiality. Spiritual creatures, Dietrich argues in a question devoted to this topic, possess no form of materiality. How then do we distinguish uncreated being from created being and the various forms of created being? The answer involves a reference to their essential relations to each other in the universe of beings, that is by the essential place they occupy in the chain of beings in which every being is essentially ordered to some other being as either its cause or its effect. God is at the top of this chain. “God,” Dietrich tells us in the first part of De intellectu et intelligibili, “means that than which nothing is superior, which stands in need of nothing with respect to either being or operation.” All other beings are ordered under God and to each other in an essential ordering. This is what Dietrich means by place. He does not mean some accidental relation like being to the left or to the right of something—a relation that can change without changing the nature of the being enjoying the relation. Hierarchical location for Dietrich is essential. It might be referred to as the dignity of beings, denoting the unique set of relations a being occupies. We can see this concept of place or dignity in the definition of God mentioned above: God means that than which nothing is superior. This description uniquely defines his place in the hierarchy of being. Following an ancient tradition Dietrich also tells us that God is called unity and is the first cause because he is beyond all human language to describe. In other words Dietrich identifies God with the ineffable One that he found mentioned in the Liber de causis. But even this ineffability defines God's place with respect to the universe of beings.

Of course the simplest answer to the question of how God is distinguished from the rest of the universe of beings is in terms of God's being its creator. Dietrich is careful to preserve the philosophical intention of his exposition when he refers to the creative nature of God within the context of Proclean Neoplatonism. God as the One, he says, exhibits an interior overflowing (interior transfusio). “By means of this super-blessed nature (superbenedicta natura) he overflows through his own fecundity beyond himself into the whole of being, establishing it out of nothing through creation and governance.” The whole of being then is created out of nothing by God. Dietrich is careful not to say the universe of being because he then would leave himself open to the theological error of implying that God's being is created, albeit self-created. Furthermore, by introducing creation into his hierarchy with respect to the One he avoids the charge of pantheism that so often plagued earlier Christian Neoplatonists such as Scotus Eriugena. Dietrich was perfectly capable of identifying God and his creatures as he does in his treatise on measurement, the De mensuris, where he writes, “…all things insofar as they are in him are God himself and he for his part is in a certain way all things…” But he is quick to point out to the reader that the way God is all things is in the mode of an essential cause (per modum causae essentialis), meaning that whatever is in the effect, even the being of the effect, is in the cause in a more eminent mode. Dietrich explains this principle in the second part of De intellectu when he tells us that “… an agent as an agent can contain in itself its own act or what is caused by it not only virtually, but also essentially, insofar as it is the same as its effect, but with a distinct existence (aliud esse).” Thus God and creatures do not enjoy the same being. God's being is not created, but creative. And this property is unique to God. No creatures can create because as a creature it has a non-creative being which is different from God's being, an aliud esse.

Some creatures have the capacity to produce things, but this is not the same as the power of creation. Here Dietrich is following a distinction he finds in the Liber de causis, where creation is understood as the bestowal of being while production is taken to be a formative causality proper to creatures. The ability to produce or reproduce things is vital to Dietrich's metaphysics of the intellect. For in the order of things intellect comes immediately after God and is a mirror of divine omnipotence insofar as it is the universe of beings in the order of knowing; as God can create the totality of beings, the intellect can reflect or reproduce this totality, including God himself, as ideas.

7. The Hierarchy of Being

Dietrich of Freiberg thus presents us with a bifurcated universe of beings, but one that is nonetheless a hierarchy of beings. For he describes in the very opening words of his De visione beatifica the traditional hierarchy of the Christian Middle Ages, even invoking the great authority of Dionysius the Areopagite:

We have it from Saint Dionysius that the universe of beings is divided into the highest, the middle, and the lowest with respect to the disposition of its order; its tripart division being capable of even greater distinction in relation to the most general modes and grades of beings. Thus in each of these three divisions there is clearly found a higher, a middle, and a lower. This does not go on to infinity, but must reach its limit at two extremes, at something highest on the one hand and something lowest on the other. On these depend the grade and order of all the things located between the two according to the proximity to or distance from these extremes.

R.D. Tétreau calls attention to the fact that the invocation of the Ps-Dionysius is vague and somewhat deceptive. He notes that no specific text of Dionysius is cited. Furthermore the great Church Father is not mentioned again throughout the rest of the treatise and is not cited at all in the De intellectu and the De animatione caeli. E. Krebs in his study, Meister Dietrich: Sein Leben, seine Werke, seine Wissenschaft, notices that in the De animatione caeli Dietrich cites Boethius in establishing the procession of beings that marks his hierarchy. Dietrich, he argues, identifies himself with a particular school of Neoplatonists which sees the One as the ultimate and final principle of not only hierarchy but of created being itself. This school includes Proclus and the author or authors of the Liber de causis.

Dietrich develops a particular version of the hierarchy of being based on this Neoplatonic One. By identifying the One of Proclus' Elements of Theology with the creative God of Christian theology he introduces a dynamic element into the hierarchy of being whereby God brings beings into existence out of nothing and marks them with a resemblance or similitude to himself. The universe is thus like God and each productive being in its hierarchically ordered series of causes is also like God. Dietrich specifically cites propositions 146 and 147 of Proclus which emphasize the rôle of similitude in this hierarchy:

Prop. 146: In the procession of all divine things the ends are assimilated to their beginnings, sustaining a circle without beginning and without end by turning to the beginning.

Prop. 147: The highest of all the divine orders are assimilated to the last of those positioned above them

Comment to Prop. 147: For if there must be continuity of the divine procession and each order must be connected by the proper middle terms, it is necessary that the highest terms of the secondary ranks be joined to the last terms of the first ranks. Conjunction, however, occurs through likeness. Thus likeness occurs between the first of the lower ranks and the last of the higher ranks.

Proposition 146 makes it clear that at each stage of the hierarchy of being the effect is like the cause just as each creature is like God. Furthermore, just as there is a built-in bias, as if were, of an effect in relation to its cause in terms of a “turning” to its principle, so all creatures have a bias to return to the source or principle of their being. Proposition 147, along with its comment, assures Dietrich that his hierarchy is continuous and that this continuity is due solely to the likenesses that exist between the ranks of being. But in addition to assimilating the Proclean doctrine of similitude in order to secure continuity of being, Dietrich introduces his own astonishing principle of linkage in the De intellectu. There he identifies the operation of a creature with its end. “This operation,” he tells us, “is the end of the thing, for the sake of which the thing exists.” Then he goes on to reveal how he conceives this operation to link one being with another: “By means of this operation a thing tends beyond itself. It is due to this operation that there is found in each thing not only being and truth, but also goodness. Thus each thing is interchangeably being, true, and good. Consequently, it is a being with respect to itself, true as ordered to the intellect, and good insofar as it actively overflows into something beyond itself.” This is a remarkable view of operation and end. The operation of a creature always lies in moving beyond itself and this is its end or purpose. Nothing is static in Dietrich's universe, everything is moving, attempting to return to its initial principle. Creatures do not have their end in themselves; everything is for the sake of something else and that something else is ultimately God. Insofar as a creature follows its proper operation it will be led out of itself and back to God.

There is something worth pausing and reflecting about here; the natural means of salvation, if you will, are built right into the very structure of things. The opus restaurationis is located within the opus conditionis. While it initially sounds odd to say that a thing's operation is its end, the oddness disappears as soon as one realizes that all operations are ultimately reditive. And as such they must lead a being beyond itself. One could put it another way by saying that for Dietrich the proper operation of every creature is to return to God. Dietrich's use of the Augustinian triad of being, truth and goodness confirms this. A thing's being gives it self-reference and dignity with respect to the hierarchy of being. Its truth gives it reference to intellect, thus opening it up to what Dietrich calls ens conceptionale, being as conceived by the intellect, which in its own way reflects the universe of beings. But in its goodness, a thing is like God, overflowing into another, imparting itself to those below it in an act which might be called a cooperation with the redemption of all things.

Similitude thus gives a dynamic structure to the entire hierarchy of being and at the same time acts as the essential link between the intellect and the rest of the hierarchy. It is thus at one and the same time a principle of being and a principle of knowing. But the similitude to the whole of being is not something that the intellect acquires by some effort on its own part; rather, such similitude is part of the very nature of intellect. “One should consider,” Dietrich remarks in the De intellectu, “that every intellect is a likeness of the whole of being, or of being as being, and it is such by reason of its essence.”

8. The Procession and Reversion of Beings

In distinguishing the various kinds of beings that constitute the hierarchical universe, Dietrich again follows Proclus. First there is God, Proclus' One, followed by the intelligences, then souls and finally bodies. Using material found in Proclus, the Liber de causis, and Avicenna's Metaphysics, Dietrich explains the order of the procession of these four kinds of beings as follows: From God there proceeds that which is called the first intelligence. Here the first stage in the procession has been reached and a kind of rank is established which corresponds to the traditional noûs of classical Neoplatonism. From the first intelligence the second intelligence flows forth along with the soul of the first celestial sphere and the first celestial sphere itself. This is the second stage. Then the process is repeated with the procession of the third intelligence, the soul of the second heaven, the second heaven itself, on down through all the celestial worlds until the intelligence and soul of the lowest heaven and the lowest heaven itself is reached. This intelligence, Dietrich informs us, causes the substance of the sublunary beings that undergo generation and corruption, that is, bodies. Thus all four kinds of beings are accounted for and are ordered according to their place in the celestial procession.

The entire universe of beings is thus in a state of active procession of all creatures from God. Each of the four orders of being is in a dynamic state, even God when viewed as the creator. God exhibits a “certain interior relational overflowing” which of course is his creativity. He establishes the rest of the universe of being out of nothing, Dietrich tells us. And at the lowest rank of the order of beings, at the level of bodies there is also a dynamic at work. For bodies in their natural desire for form are in the process of returning to their source. Consequently there is a hierarchical principle at work that consists in God who is an eternal outpouring who, being the source of all emanation, has no need to return, bodies that are only in the state of return but have nothing further into which they can proceed, and intellects and souls that are both in the state of procession and reversion, since they both receive being and pass it on to those below.

Dietrich seems to suggest that reditive activity is not found in God. He says that all things are turned back to God, but he does not say that God in any way turns back upon himself. One should remember, however, that by restricting himself to giving a purely philosophical account of the nature of being and the universe Dietrich was not free to speculate theologically about whether exitus or reditus had any rôle to play in the life of the Trinity. That Dietrich is very close to making the commonplace identity of the second hypostasis, the first intelligence, with the Second Person of the Blessed Trinity is hinted at when he talks about intellect and desire being the principles of return. Quoting directly from Proclus he remarks that what is desirable to all things is intellect and that all things proceed from intellect as well as return through it. But he restrains himself from making any theological identity. It is clear, however, that love marks all the ranks of the hierarchy, every member of which is driven to return to its source by desire for intellect. Tacitly he has left the door open for the interpretation that the God who is love as reported in Sacred Scripture has left the mark of that love in the universe of beings and that intellect (often identified by the earlier Christian Neoplatonists with the Second Person of the Trinity) is the crucial agent in both the unfolding and retrieval of being.

9. Conceptional Being

The tie between the intellect and the rest of Dietrich's universe is thus very close. This explains why the treatise on the intellect and the intelligibles is of such importance in understanding his metaphysics and cosmology. The identity of ens reale and ens conceptionale is essential to the very nature of things as Dietrich understands them. Dietrich tells us in the De visione beatifica, that the distinction between conceptional and real being is the first division of being. Furthermore, conceptional being includes for Dietrich not just the objects of the intellectual act but the act itself. This act is not simply a reception or a reproduction in some fashion of an object coming to it from outside, but is what might be called semi-creative, that is, the act of the intellect is the act of conceiving its object. Intellectual conception is analogous to the conception of offspring by living things in the sense that a new reality is brought into being. Of course the intellective act is also reproductive, it does establish a mirror of external reality (the meaning of ens reale for Dietrich). Tétreau points out that ens conceptionale is really coextensive with the universe of beings because it exemplifies in itself all the modes of natural being. That is, intellect exhibits the distinctions of act and potency, oneness and multiplicity, cause and effect and so on. Furthermore, ens conceptionale forms a conceptional hierarchy of its own, a hierarchy which mirrors the greater one and at the same time causes and participates in it. At the bottom of this conceptional order are the external senses, followed by the interior senses, the discursive power, the possible intellect, and finally the agent intellect at the very top.

The procession of creatures in the order of conceptional reality moves through three modes of being (specific character, ideal form, and image) culminating in beings that are specific in character, and are images, but without the proper character of individuation. These are the intelligences. They proceed from God as an image of God and constitute the very flower of the universe. The agent intellect of man, Dietrich tells us, belongs to this mode of being. The various modes of being within the entire hierarchy of being as well as the three kinds of beings subordinate to the first being all bear a likeness to God; indeed, intellect, the very apex of the universe, is an image of God. But the various members of Dietrich's hierarchy of being are also bound together into a universe of beings by the similitude they bear to each other. This similitude, however, is the result of the essential order of causation, according to which every being in the universe of beings is ordered to every other being either as cause or effect. Thus the totality of beings are bound together making up a universe where every creature bears a relation of similitude to every other creature and to the primary unifying principle from which they emanate, God.

God's power of emanation, which is creative, although simple in its origins and principle, is complex in its effects. Divine emanation gives rise to the vast complexity of both ens reale and ens conceptionale. We have already seen that Dietrich viewed this vast complexity as itself a likeness to God—the world in all of its wonderful complexity revealed something of God to a mind willing to inquire into it. It gives glory to God in its very complexity. Perhaps Dietrich's metaphysical vision of the universe explains his keen interest in science, an interest that led him to write treatises summing up his research into light and color and into the material elements of the universe. All these things revealed something of the first cause to him. There was no chasm between his metaphysics and his science. The link between the two is perhaps discovered in his theory of mind. For it is mind that is most like God. And thus, just as God as first cause is the source of a creative emanation so is the intellect.

Intellect gives rise to an order of emanation that is just as vast as that of the creative emanation of God in the order of real beings. In fact intellect mirrors this order perfectly. It is itself identified with the universe of beings. Furthermore, it is like God's creativity in that it does not depend upon a pre-existing material substratum from which ideas are formed by abstraction. But it does depend upon God having made it the kind of being that in the order of understanding, the ens conceptionale, is able to “conceive” being. For no other being except God can do this.

10. Intellect

So intellect in its similitude to divine creation possesses an emanative activity. But in its unlikeness to God and its dependence upon him it is a confined or restricted emanation. Dietrich calls this emanatio simplex and he claims that it constitutes an analogy to the creative emanation of God. Intellect is obviously a crucial aspect of Dietrich's metaphysics. It would be well then to say something about his view of intellect in general before turning specifically to an analysis of his De intellectu.

In the realm of intellects, Dietrich tells us, we discover a fourfold order in which intellectual reality stands: at the top of this order is found what Dietrich calls intellects existing through their essence, followed by intelligent spiritual substances that are called angels, and then species and finally the individual realities included in species that are known to mind. There are three kinds of intellects that exist through their essence: the separated intelligences, celestial bodies, and human intellects.

Intellects possess unique attributes according to Dietrich. We have already remarked on one of these: their likeness to God and to the universe of beings—a property shared by no other creatures. We have seen that intellect is like God in that it is what we have called semi-creative or conceptional. In what way, however, can intellect be the likeness of the universe of beings, and to such a degree that it becomes identified with it so that we can say that the intellect is the universe of beings in the order of ens conceptionale? One could answer of course by saying that the intellect is this likeness by its very act of knowing the universe of beings. But there is a difficulty here—one that Dietrich is well aware of from studying Aristotle. For the question how the intellect knows the universe of beings is like the question how the eye can see colors. If the eye were any one particular color, then it would see only that color. Aristotle, who raises this question, replies that the eye must be colorless so it can see every color. Likewise for the mind or intellect. Thus it is wrong to say that the intellect is the likeness of the universe of beings by its very act of knowing the universe of beings because the very reverse is true. The intellect is no one of the beings it knows. It is truly the universe of beings, but in the conceptional order. Thus it can be like the universe of beings in the so-called real order. Its nature then must be general and universal. Noting its object provides evidence for this:

The intellect is a general and universal nature in accord with the property of its intellectual essence, which is not determined to understand only this or that thing. This is clear from its object, which is not this or that quiddity, but universally any quiddity and being as being, that is, whatever possesses the character of being.

One should notice that Dietrich does not raise a question which may appear obvious: if the intellect is not identified with any one being, is it proper to call it a being at all? Nor does he formally consider the hypothesis that Meister Eckhart advanced in his Quaestiones parisienses, namely that intellect might belong to a different order than being. But, of course, this is just where the answer lies. The intellect belongs to a different order of reality than being. In effect, Dietrich's categories of ens reale and ens conceptionale imply as much. In fact, the way Dietrich uses the notion of ens conceptionale as a superior mode of reality is exactly the position Eckhart takes.

11. The Resplendence of the Intellect

Due to its superiority and to the fact that it is no being, the intellect is resplendent with the universe of beings. “All beings shine forth (resplendent) in its essence,” he says. One must be careful here, however, not to misunderstand what Dietrich means by beings “shining forth”. He is not advocating a doctrine of divine illumination of the intellect. To be sure this phrase might be rendered “All beings are intellectually illuminated in its essence,” and then interpreted to mean that Dietrich holds some doctrine of divine illumination for the intellect. When Albertus Magnus refers to resplendence it is usually safe to construe what he says in terms of some form of divine illumination. But this will not do for Dietrich of Freiberg. He simply does not hold a doctrine of illumination—at least not in the sense that Albert or other earlier medieval philosophers did. Martin Grabmann made the observation many years ago that the doctrine of divine illumination was used less and less as the 13th Century drew to a close. Dietrich shows evidence of disavowing the doctrine in his philosophical study of the intellect and its normal operations. In the passage mentioned above we have to clearly understand that Dietrich is trying to say that the intellect reflects all things—they shine forth in it, not because the intellect is undergoing an act of divine illumination, but because in the order of ens conceptionale the things are in the intellect first as conceptions and are exemplified there as part of the nature of intellect. The conclusion that Dietrich wishes to draw is that the intellect, being always in act through its essence, contains in itself the whole universe of beings, which shine forth from it into the cosmos.

Dietrich makes a very interesting and important application of this doctrine of the resplendence of the intellect. Man, according to Dietrich, is cut off from his own intellect. He does not explain why this is, but no doubt it involves the theological doctrine of the fall. He does say, however, that man is not fully joined to his intellect, an intellect that is always in act and resplendent with the universe of beings. Were he to be fully joined to his intellect, were the intellect to become man's form, then man would understand everything all at once. This, Dietrich suggests, is exactly what happened in the famous vision of St. Benedict in which he saw the whole universe.

12. Empirical and Transempirical Consciousness

Does the disassociation of man from his intellect mean that human beings have knowledge of which they are unaware? How is this possible given that the intellect has the property of consciousness? After all, it does not make any sense to say that one knows something of which he is totally unaware. And yet this is precisely what Dietrich claims. Burkhard Mojsisch draws attention to the fact that in identifying the agent intellect with the abditum mentis (the hiddenness of the mind) of St. Augustine Dietrich establishes a distinction between what Mojsisch calls “transempirical consciousness” and empirical consciousness. Mojsisch argues that Dietrich held such a position because it is the agent intellect itself that grounds empirical consciousness. Since empirical consciousness is the function of the possible intellect according to Dietrich, and since in his Neoplatonic hierarchy the agent intellect being the cause of the possible intellect must be superior to it, it follows that empirical consciousness is due to the causal action of the agent intellect. Although this is not the place to pursue a detailed philosophical analysis of Dietrich's theory, it should be pointed out that his position fits the facts of common sense and is concordant with some contemporary theories of mind. We surely maintain that we know things that we are unaware of when we are, for example, asleep or simply not thinking of them at the moment but could recall them from memory. Peter Geach in his book Mental Acts develops an analysis of concepts as capacities that are exercised or consciously manifest themselves in acts of judgment. And capacities, one could argue, need not be continuously exercised to be capacities. Thus it is with regard to Dietrich's theory of the agent intellect; it need not always and everywhere be completely operative upon the possible intellect. Indeed, it can remain a “hiddenness of the mind” for the entirety of a person's life and still be a reality about the person. Anyone who has ever had the dubious privilege of teaching in a modern university knows this to be a truism that borders on the obvious.

13. The Agent Intellect and the Soul

Dietrich's account of the relationship of consciousness to the agent intellect in terms of causation raises another question for his theory of intellect, namely, what kind of causal relationship exists between the agent intellect and the soul? Dietrich gives a very precise answer to this question based no doubt on his acceptance of Proclus' exposition of the principles of generation within the hierarchy of being. The agent intellect, according to this explanation, is the intrinsic efficient cause of the soul. That it cannot be the material cause Dietrich thinks is self-evident. It cannot be the final cause since a final cause perfects a thing, but does not establish it in being, which is what the agent intellect does for the soul. But it is more important to understand, Dietrich insists, that the agent intellect cannot be the formal cause of the soul—at least not in the natural order of things. He argues that if it was the formal cause of the soul, given that the soul by definition is the formal cause of the human person, then it would follow that there would be a form of a form in the same genus, man. But this is contrary to the natural order of things because whatever is the form of something in the genus of substance is by the whole of itself the act of its subject. Thus the same thing cannot be in potency to more than one form in its genus. Perhaps we can understand Dietrich's remarks about the vision of St. Benedict mentioned above in terms of this analysis. Man is not “fully joined” to his intellect in the sense that the intellect is not his form. If it were his form, he, like Benedict, would understand the entire universe of beings in a single mental act. But such a vision belongs to the order of grace, not to the order of natural providence.

The soul of man, then, living in time, only participates in its agent intellect. It acquires the universe of beings only piecemeal as it were. More and more with each act of understanding it approaches the understanding of the universe of beings, a universe that is its universe, which it possesses as a capacity of its own nature.

14. The Separation of the Intellect

The causal relationship that the agent intellect enjoys with respect to the soul of man raises one last question for Dietrich: to what extent if any is the intellect separated in its existence from man? This question of course had been debated in the schools by the generation of scholars that immediately preceded Dietrich. But it was still a question that attracted attention in his own day. There were philosophers then, as there probably always will be, who wanted to argue that the intellect was a function of the soul, having no existence outside of the soul. Dietrich, however, basing his position squarely upon an old Augustinian tradition, argued just the opposite. Separation is a characteristic of intellect as such, and in man it is identified with the “interiority” which Augustine claimed was not joined to the body as its form. Tétreau points out that Dietrich never attempts to prove his doctrine of separation, but assumes it on the basis of a passage in Aristotle's De anima (III, 5, 430a17–18) where Aristotle claims that mind and its act of thought cannot be subjected to temporality. This, however, is not exactly accurate. It has already been shown that Dietrich has in mind Augustine's notion of a separate interiority in man that he identifies with his agent intellect. But the fact that Dietrich does not offer a proof for his doctrine is not due to his appeal to the authority of Aristotle and Augustine. Rather, as Mojsisch shows, the separation of the intellect is due to its essential intellectuality. Since Dietrich claims that the agent intellect is intellect through its own essence, he need not demonstrate its property of separateness when it acts as efficient cause of the human soul. Separateness is a property of its essential intellectuality.

15. Conclusion

On the basis of the survey of Dietrich of Freiberg just given one might surmise that his philosophy in general is consummated in his doctrine of intellect. Such a conclusion, however, would not be strictly correct. Although Krebs in his study of Dietrich concludes that the theory of the intellect was the culmination of his entire philosophical project, William Wallace has shown that Dietrich's qualitative methodology, especially as applied in his optical studies, is a valuable contribution to scientific methodology, a fact that can be appreciated independently of his theory of the intellect. It is also possible to argue that his contribution to the discussion concerning the metaphysical status of essence and existence in creatures can be understood without reference to his analysis of intellect. And yet one would not wish to undervalue the importance of Dietrich's doctrine of mind not only in terms of his own philosophical enterprise but also in terms of its influence on the later course of medieval German philosophy, beginning with Meister Eckhart and ending with Nicholas Cusanus.

Kurt Flasch attempts to put Dietrich's contributions to the philosophy of mind in its proper perspective. To see what Dietrich has accomplished we must try to understand how he introduces a new element into medieval scholastic speculations concerning mind. To begin with, Flasch notes, Dietrich's distinction between ens reale and ens conceptionale replaces the old scholastic distinction between ens naturae and ens rationis in such a way that it is no longer possible to claim that being as found in the mind is dependent upon extra-mental reality. Where Thomas Aquinas claimed an exclusive distinction between the two categories of being, Dietrich with his doctrine of coextentionality insists on an inclusive distinction. The result of this new perspective on the priority of ens conceptionale, Flasch argues, not only grounds a new metaphysics but also establishes a new methodology for studying nature based upon an inclusive understanding of natural being. Looked at in this way Dietrich's theory of mind can indeed be seen as the culmination of his philosophy.


A. Works by Dietrich von Freiberg

B. Secondary Sources

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Albert the Great [= Albertus magnus] | Augustine, Saint | binarium famosissimum [= most famous pair] | divine: illumination | medieval philosophy | Meister Eckhart | Neoplatonism | Proclus | Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite