Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Causal Determinism

1. Some philosophers are misled on this point by the fact that some now-defunct presentations of Special Relativity theory seem to be grounded on an ontology of events. But Special Relativity does not need to be so presented, nor were the “events” used anything like common sense events.

2. The talk here of prediction is intuitive but sloppy. What we should say is: none of the states of the world before t = 0, conjoined with the laws of CM, entailed the appearance of the space invader at t = 0.

3. To create a cylindrical, spatially finite version of 2-D Newtonian space-time, one draws two vertical lines (e.g. x = 0 and x = a), cuts and throws away everything to the left of one and to the right of the other, and identifies the two lines, thus making space finite and closed. In this space-time setting, to power the space invader we can't use the non-collision mechanism of Gerver and Xia; see Earman (1986), p. 45.

4. Tachyons are hypothesized faster-than-light particles; there is no experimental basis for them, so ruling them out is no sin.

5. In GTR, a model system consists of a point manifold M on which a metric tensor gab is defined, as well as a stress-energy tensor Tab (which can be everywhere zero), jointly satisfying Einstein's field equations. The mathematical property of general covariance possessed by Einstein's equations entails that from one valid model system <M, g ab, Tab>, we can produce another model in which T ab and gab have been altered by the diffeomorphism h* : <M, h*gab, h*Tab>. This new model is also a valid solution of Einstein's equations, but it describes a model in which the location of the metrical structures and material fields of Tab and gab have been given different locations on the manifold. (They have been "shifted around", one might say, on the space-time manifold.) It is easy to construct a diffeomorphism h* that shifts the locations of T ab and gab only after some global time-slice t = 0 (at least, in models that admit such slices -- i.e., the GTR equivalent of our familiar “state of the world at time t = 0.”).

6. Quantum mechanics describes physical systems by means of states that are, notoriously, in some sense incomplete, a charge leveled against the theory by Einstein, Podolsky and Rosen in their famous 1935 essay “Can the Quantum Mechanical Description of Reality Be Considered Complete?”. This is most commonly illustrated by appeal to the Heisenberg Uncertainty Principle (in one of its forms): if the position of a particle is specified precisely, then its momentum must be unknown (i.e., described by a state such that the probabilities of the particle having a certain momentum are spread out over a wide range of possible values), and vice-versa. Quantum mechanics as normally interpreted says that these states are as complete a description as one can possibly get. A hidden variable theory however postulates the existence of determinate values for system-variables such as position and momentum, despite their being “hidden” from quantum mechanics itself. Einstein believed that ultimately we would find such a theory; David Bohm did precisely that, in 1952 (see below, main article).

7. There are theorems proving that for certain kinds of Hamiltonians (including most of those that may be considered physically realistic), the evolution of the wavefunction under the Schrödinger equation is deterministic. The theorems have other antecedent conditions that may be considered restrictive, however, and see J. Norton, "A Quantum Mechanical Supertask," Foundations of Physic, 29 (1999), 1265-1302 for a case in which determinism breaks down. [I thank an anonymous referee for drawing my attention to these points.]

8. In the 1980s the physicists Girardi, Rimini and Weber developed a revised version of QM that incorporates a physically well-defined collapse mechanism. Their theory solves certain interpretive problems in QM but has remaining difficulties; it is an indeterministic theory.

9. Here I am not referring to the time directions (toward-the-past, toward-the-future), which are certainly legitimate enough in physics and do sometimes play important roles. Rather, I am referring to our intuitive ontological division of history into the past, the present, and the future. “The present” in particular is not to be found in any physical theory's description of the world. And special relativity theory undermines the traditional conception of a non-observer-relative present (see Callender 2000).