Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Determinates vs. Determinables

Boolean Parts of Properties

As noted in Section 5, Dean Zimmerman has also suggested improvements to Searle's treatment of determinables. He uses, in addition to the notion of predicate or property entailment, the notion of the Boolean part of a property.

F is a determinate falling under determinable G =df (1) F implies G, but G does not imply F; (2) there is no property H such that: (a) G&H implies F but (b) neither H nor not-H implies G; (3) every Boolean part of F implies G; and (4) for every property I such that I and G satisfy the preceding three clauses, F and I stand in some logical relation. (Zimmerman, 1997, p. 464)

How does this definition fare for our paradigm, ‘F (red) is a determinate falling under determinable G (colored)’?

Clause (3) requires that every Boolean part of the property red implies the property of being colored. From Zimmerman's discussion (1997, pp. 462–463), it is not obvious whether red has a proper Boolean part or whether its only Boolean part is red itself. Whatever the answer, clause (3) seems to be satisfied for this example. Questions remain, however, about parts of color properties. If the predicate ‘robust yellow’ stands for a property, are strong yellow, moderate yellow, and grayish yellow its Boolean parts? Or is the property of being robust yellow somehow distinct from the properties of being strong or moderate or grayish yellow? On the understanding of ‘disjunctive predicate’ to be recommended below, ‘robust yellow’ is disjunctive if and only if ‘strong or moderate or grayish yellow’ is also disjunctive. An account of disjunctive predicates, in this sense, could be useful in identifying Boolean parts of properties. An appeal to the existence or non-existence of such parts to explain disjunctiveness, on the other hand, appears to assume what it purports to establish.

Clause (1) of the definition above is satisfied and (2), unfortunately, is unsatisfied. Consider the following property:

H: red or (not-colored and square)

G&H implies F, that is, Colored and (red or (not-colored and square)) implies red. H does not imply G, that is, red or (not-colored and square) does not imply colored. Not-H does not imply G, that is, not-red and (colored or not-square) does not imply colored. Zimmerman's formulation does not repair a difficulty in Searle's, namely, that the red-colored paradigm fails to satisfy the definition of the determinate-determinable relation. Predicate H, to be sure, is a hideous monstrosity that stands for something stapled together from Boolean parts of unrelated properties. A goal of the definitional enterprise is to distinguish ordinary, healthy predicates from such monstrosities. So we cannot assume the distinction in order to draw the distinction.

Clause (4) had difficulties of its own. Assign a new meaning to the letter ‘F’:

F: weak yellow

F satisfies clause (1). Pretend F also satisfies some revised and improved version of clause (2). Clause (3) does not stand in the way. But as one would expect, something is lurking in the wings:

I: robust yellow

I satisfies clauses (1), (2), and (3) as well as F. But I and F are logically unrelated. All the following are possible: not-F and not-I, F and not-I, I and not-F, and F and I. An example of the kind that thwarts Searle also impedes Zimmerman.