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Elijah Delmedigo

First published Fri Dec 23, 2005; substantive revision Thu Jan 27, 2011

A Jewish philosopher (also known to his contemporaries as ‘Helias Cretensis’) who was born and died in Candia in the island of Crete, Elijah Delmedigo (ca. 1458–93) achieved fame and influenced many of the leading philosophers and intellectuals of the early Renaissance during the ten-year period of his stay in northern Italy.

Notwithstanding the specific historical circumstances that form the context for the writings of Elijah Delmedigo (hereafter “Delmedigo” for short), his works, whether they be the translations and commentaries on the works of Ibn Rushd, or his book Sefer Behinat Hadat, reflect a systematic philosophic approach dealing with topics which have a perennial interest for philosophers and historians of ideas. We describe Delmedigo's life and work in the following sections:

1. Delmedigo's Life

After a traditional religious upbringing and a broad education in rabbinic learning and Jewish thought in Candia, he came to Padua probably with the intention of completing his medical studies. Early in 1480 we find him supporting himself financially by teaching classes in the peripatetic (Aristotelian) philosophy, first in Venice and thereafter in Padua, to the sons of wealthy and influential families. He found that there existed a great interest in the Aristotelian philosophy as interpreted by Ibn Rushd (called Averroes in Latin), and since he himself was familiar with many of the commentaries of Ibn Rushd in Hebrew translations that had been accumulating during the nearly two hundred year period since the death of that Muslim sage, while many of these works had not yet been translated into Latin, Elijah Delmedigo was able to excite his students with the ideas of this so-called “radical Aristotelianism.” He quickly gained recognition, through his students, as a leading expositor of this very controversial point of view.

Two students, in particular, became his admirers and later on his leading patrons — Giovanni Pico Della Mirandola (hereafter “Pico”) during the first few years of Delmedigo's Italian sojourn, and Domenico Grimani of Venice (who became the Cardinal of St. Marco) during the last few years. The connection with the former was initially particularly valuable since it led to the commissioning of many lucrative translating jobs for Delmedigo. But the meteoric rise to fame of this brilliant young patron, followed by his quixotic conversion to the “new age” religion based on the turn to Neo-Platonic philosophy as the foundation of Christianity, which, when taught and propagated in the Academy of Marsilio Ficino in Florence, was combined with Hermeticism, Kabbalah and Magic, brought considerable grief and disappointment to Delmedigo. Pico's enthusiasm for this new amalgam quickly encouraged him to formulate his own new syncretistic approach and this eventually led to his censure by the papal authorities. Grimani's patronage of Delmedigo was more constant and his encouragement led, in the long run, to the growing list of Delmedigo's writings, manuscript copies of which seem to have enjoyed a fairly wide distribution among philosophical circles in Italy. In the meantime the increasing tension between Delmedigo and some sections of the Jewish community in Italy that did not view with favor his involvement in philosophy or his association with the leading intellectuals of the time, added to the disenchantment he felt in the wake of the Pico affair. His disappointment with the new cultural “return to Plato” in the early Renaissance as well as the pressure of his own more straightened financial circumstances made him decide to return to Candia.

He spent the last 3–4 years of his short life at peace with the more secluded and unchanged cultural surroundings of his youth, and at the request of one of his pupils in Candia named Shaul Ashkenazi, Delmedigo wrote the small book in Hebrew Sefer Behinat Hadat (translated as “An Examination of Religion”) which is his main contribution to Jewish Thought. The book was completed on December 31, 1490. Shaul preserved the manuscript after his teacher's death and took upon himself the responsibility for the dissemination of copies. He added a short introduction praising its author and setting out the main facts regarding the author's life and death. There is some irony in the circumstance that while some of the Latin translations and commentaries written by Elijah Delmedigo for the general public already appeared in print in 1552, his Sefer Behinat Hadat written for his own Jewish readers had to wait until 1629, when it was published in print for the first time by a descendant of the Delmedigo family in Basilia as part of a collection of other works. The collection included a tract written by this descendant replying to Delmedigo's criticism of the Kabbalah in Sefer Behinat Hadat.

Delmedigo's book can be regarded as a milestone in the history of Jewish thought, marking the end of one period and the beginning of another. So far as we know, it is the last in the series of introductions to Judaism in accordance with the medieval rationalist approach, of which Maimonides was the foremost exponent. Such works had been common during the two centuries after Maimonides’ death, reflecting the attacks on this approach which became more and more strident and a part of what historians have called “the anti-Maimonidean controversy” which affected the spiritual life of various Jewish communities. These introductions were written by those who saw themselves as faithful to the rationalist approach of Maimonides in order to defend him and his approach from the attacks of the many critics that arose in diverse Jewish communities in different countries. Elijah Delmedigo explicitly saw himself as a defender of this rationalist tradition, which he regarded as being the most authentic form of Jewish thought since the time of the Geonic period (8th to the 10th) in Babylon. While the non-Jewish students of Delmedigo may have classified him as an “Averroist”, he clearly saw himself as a follower of Maimonides. The association between Maimonides and Ibn Rushd would have been, in his eyes, a natural one, since Maimonides towards the end of his life had been much impressed with the Ibn Rushd commentaries which reached his hands in Egypt and recommended them in a letter to his students. The followers of Maimonides had therefore been, for several generations before Delmedigo, the leading users, translators and disseminators of the works of Ibn Rushd in Jewish circles, and the maintainers of his fame even after his Islamic supporters had left him in view of the official Islamic rejection of his radical views. The Maimonideans regarded the two thinkers, in spite of the known differences between them, as following the same general line. In his book, then, Delmedigo saw himself as a defender of Maimonidean Judaism, and — like many Maimonideans of the previous generations — he emphasized the rationality of Jewish tradition.

His book was in essence a criticism of the “new age” religion represented by Pico and the group of scholars in Florence at the academy of Marsilio Ficino. Hence it contained a trenchant criticism of the irrationality of the doctrines of Christianity, alongside a rejection of the pretensions to authenticity of the Jewish mystic tradition — the Kabbalah — which had been adopted by Ficino's circle as a sister view which could be connected to Christianity through the common neo-Platonic metaphysics espoused by Ficino. Like many of the later Maimonideans, Delmedigo thought that Maimonides himself had erred in publicly supporting and promoting attempts to popularize reconciliations between Aristotelian thought and popular Judaism. Like Ibn Rushd, Delmedigo believed that it was necessary to let simple religious believers retain their childish misunderstandings of true religion, which only the true philosophic scholars could understand to be in essence reconcilable with Aristotelian science. For this reason Delmedigo believed that it was inadvisable to publish philosophic interpretations of the Scriptures and the holy texts even when these could be recognized by the wise as revealing the rational truth in the Scriptural approach. He believed that it was wiser to adopt, in dealings with the wider public, the attitude that religious belief and practice were based on prophecy and tradition and had no need to be defended on rational grounds. Nonetheless, the book makes clear that, in his view, true Judaism and Aristotelian philosophy were basically reconcilable when properly interpreted, and that those who were capable of understanding this should be encouraged to study philosophy and follow the rationalist path.

Delmedigo's book contained one of the first systematic criticisms of the Kabbalistic mystic tradition, which he, like many others, regarded as a derivative form of Neo-Platonism. This criticism also recounted the facts that had led others before him to reject the claims of the Zohar to be a genuinely ancient text, as it falsely claimed. When Sefer Behinat Hadat was printed for the first time, the censors had insisted that all the anti-Christian passages should be omitted. For this reason, many subsequent readers of the book in the centuries after its first printing until the 19th century had been of the opinion that its primary message was the rejection of the Kabbalah. This, in fact, was the main motive for the reprinting of the censored work in 1833 by the Italian scholar I.S.Reggio, who was a supporter of the 19th century Jewish Haskalah (Enlightenment) movement. However, the rediscovery of a complete and uncensored manuscript of the book dating from the seventeenth century and predating the first print of the book, and its re-issue in a critical edition by J.J. Ross, confirmed the view of some modern scholars (David Ruderman) that the main target of criticism in the work was the group of scholars centered round the Academy of Ficino, of which Pico was a member.

2. Natural Philosophy — creation Versus emanation

In two recent studies (1998, 2011) that have been published of Delmedigo's Latin translations of Ibn Rushd's commentaries on parts of Aristotle's book on Physics, to which Delmedigo added his own notes, the author, Josep Puig Montada, has pointed out that the fact that these mark the beginning of his works in Italy is significant. This is because it indicates that for him as well as for the Paduan scholars of those years it was an important issue whether Aristotle's First Mover, which had long been identified as the Biblical God in the medieval Aristotelian tradition of interpretation, moves the outermost sphere of the heavens as a final cause only, or whether this is done also in the capacity of efficient cause, i.e. as the Agent. Ibn Rushd's texts contain some obscurities which Delmedigo proceeds to explicate in terms of a reshaping of Ibn Sinna's (Avicenna's) notion of emanation as based on the dialectics of the possible and the necessary. This enables him to prove that God is above all the First Mover but also the Agent of the “supralunar” non-corruptible spheres of heaven. This agency is analogous to, even though different from, the efficient causation with which we are familiar in our “sublunar” corruptible world. Montada remarks, correctly, that it was impossible for Delmedigo to be fully aware of the evolution in Ibn Rushd's thought which led him away from his Muslim Aristotelian predecessors of the 9th and 10th centuries, Alfarabi and Ibn Sinna, who had absorbed into their philosophies a certain measure of Neo-Platonism without always being aware of the fact. Ibn Rushd's Aristotelianism was as pure he could make it, and he realized that Aristotle's position regarding the origin of the world was basically secular and had no room for an Agent Creator at all since he really believed in an eternal world that had always existed and always would exist. But Elijah Delmedigo did not accept the fully secular Aristotle and tried to give us as coherent as possible a presentation of Ibn Rushd's views. So he siezed upon the residual Neo-Platonism that remained in them and returned to the view of the eternal creation or emanation of the world as the solution to the contradiction between Aristotelianism and popular religion. It emerges from Montada's analysis that the issue at stake, which had long been discussed in earlier centuries, was whether Aristotle's First Mover could really be identified as the Agent Creator of heaven and earth ex nihilo (out of nothing) as in the traditional understanding of the Biblical account, or whether the First Mover was simply the source of all movement and dynamism in an eternal universe. Delmedigo was without doubt aware that some Maimonideans before him (particularly Isaac Albalag) had speculated why Maimonides himself had not admitted to holding this view (eternal creation) instead of presenting himself as rejecting the views of Aristotle regarding the beginning of the world. This suspicion was nurtured by the fact that Maimonides explicitly accepted the Neo-Platonic emanationist view of the eternal effluence (shefa) from the source above as the explanation of the continuous dynamism in the world. So why could he not accept this as the true meaning of the Biblical account of creation i.e. not as a one-time act of creation (“in the beginning”) but an eternal creativity? In view of their probable awareness of the fact that the proposition that “the eternity of the world was true in philosophy though false in religion” was one of the Averroistic doctrines condemned by Bishop Etienne Tempier of Paris in 1277, one can imagine that Delmedigo's students in Padua must have found his discussions of this topic particularly interesting.

3. Monopsychism — Unicity of the intellect versus personal immortality

Another of the Averroist doctrines condemned in Paris was the notion of the unicity of intellect. This is the idea that the intellectual part of the human soul alone was immortal and that when surviving the death of the body it fully rejoined the Active Intellect, which was the source of all knowledge and ordered dynamic activity in the sublunar world. In so doing the individual intellect lost its personality and its individual identity both of which had been given to it by its connection with a particular body. The interpretation of the Active Intellect in Aristotle's De Anima involved in this story has a long history which we have no need to recount here. Most medieval Aristotelians would have accepted its separate status and function as here summarized. What concerned the monotheistic religions was rather the fate of the individual human souls in the hereafter. The traditional view was that God had created individual human souls and attached them to bodies, and that the individual persons thus created would receive their reward or punishment after their death in a “world to come.” Concerning this “world to come” there were many confused and diverse notions in Hellenistic times and in the first few centuries of the current era. Some believed that the reward and punishment would be given to souls alone in a purely spiritual world and this was “the world to come”. Some believed that the souls would be preserved until they rejoined their bodies in a resurrected world, and that this “world to come” was a historical period that would come “at the end of days”. Others believed in some combination or other of both these views. Common to them all was, however, the notion of the immortality of the individual human soul. But could this religious notion be reconciled with the Aristotelian analysis of the soul and the intellect in De Anima? Both Ibn Rushd and Delmedigo wrestled, as religious persons, with the attempt to understand Aristotle's views, and they did so after centuries of attempts to do so by thinkers before them. The question of a possible reconciliation between the religious tradition and Aristotle's views was a constant background to all these efforts.

Delmedigo's expositions of Ibn Rushd's views on this topic have been examined in a recent study (1995) by Kalman P. Bland of Duke University of the Hebrew version of his Two Treatises (Questions) on the Soul, the Latin translation of which (now lost) was prepared for Pico. Delmedigo starts by noting that the traditional religious notion in which God attaches a particular soul to a particular body contravenes several Aristotelian principles, and goes on, relying on Ibn Rushd's Long Commentary to Aristotle's De Anima, to consider the interpretations of Alexander of Aphrodisias (followed later by Ibn Bajja) — who considered the potential human intellect as a mere capacity or disposition in the imaginative faculty of the soul to grasp intelligible forms — and of Themistius — who considered the potential human intellect as a nonmaterial substance which exists independently and joins the physical body of the fetus at birth. Ibn Rushd, and Delmedigo following him, reject both interpretations and suggest an intermediate one according to which the potential human intellect starts out as a mere disposition but becomes a nonmaterial subject by approaching closer and closer to the Active Intellect and finally achieves a conjunction with it. However, in so doing, it loses its particularity and is absorbed within the latter. This view stresses the ultimate unicity of the intellect. In the second treatise Delmedigo goes on to critically examine John of Jandun's interpretation of this process and explains that Ibn Rushd distinguishes between two perfections of the intellectual part of the soul, the first being “cogitation” (hakoah hamahshavi) which is an acquired knowledge based on abstracting universal forms from the individuated products sensed and filtered by the imagination, and the second being “intellection” (haskalah) proper which is already a holding on to these forms as they proceed from the Active Intellect. The first perfection is not merely the efficient cause of the second; the second is already a crucial stage in the achievement of conjunction with the Active Intellect and thus the formal cause of the first, reflecting the emanative pull of the process of this eventual conjunction. Hylic human intellects, at this second state of perfection, are in a transformed epistemic and ontological state of human consciousness, in which they begin to think and know in the way that the Active Intellect thinks and knows. In turn, the Active Intellect resembles in an inferior way the divine mode of thought of God — the First Mover — which transcends the distinction between particulars and universals.

What is specially worthy of note is a statement with which Delmedigo ends his first treatise in which he opines that the ancient doctrine of the transmigration of souls, which is supported by the Kabbalistic tradition, accords more with this view of the unicity of the intellect than does the traditional popular view regarding the immortality of the personal individual human soul. This observation is one which Delmedigo repeats elsewhere and it might seem surprising in view of the general presumption that rationalists would fight shy (as does Saadya Gaon the 10th century initiator of the Jewish rationalist tradition) of so bizarre a doctrine as the transmigration of souls. This becomes a little more understandable, perhaps, when we bear in mind that, as opposed to Saadya's view, it is only the intellectual part of the soul that is said to be immortal in the medieval Aristotelian view. What the notion of the unicity of intellect seems to have in common with the doctrine of transmigration seems to be the fact that this mystic doctrine too regards the bodily possession of intellect as its individuating factor and the intellectual soul's ability to occupy different bodies at different times as consistent with the neutral general character of the intellect as a non-material mind-stuff. But we shall return to this question later on.

4. Rationalism and the so-called “double truth theory”

In the case of these last two topics that we have considered, it might have been possible for some followers of the “radical Aristetolianism” to sum up the situation by saying that “according to reason or science the world is eternal, but according to religion the world is created” or “according to reason or science only the intellect is non-individually preserved, but according to religion the whole soul of man is individually immortal”. We might then have wanted to ask them whether they meant that (i) each position was true in its own realm (the “complementarian” version which we might also call “the double truth theory proper”) or whether (ii) only one was the whole truth whereas the other was just a useful theory or way of putting things for some purposes (the “instrumentalist” version) or whether they thought (iii) they would have liked to be able to prove rationally or scientifically that creation or individual immortality was true, but they had regretfully to admit that such religious truths must be accepted as prophetically revealed truths alone (the “disappointed rationalist” version). The latter two alternatives might be considered versions of a weaker or extended form of “double truth.” What is certain is that Bishop Tempier interpreted the Averroists he was attacking as believing in two contrary truths, and implied that the use of this formula — which he might have supposed to be close to the “complementarian” version, to which some radical thinkers in later centuries might indeed have come much more close — was merely a ruse to mask their heresy. It seemed so obvious to Tempier that there was only one truth, namely, that of religion, that he looked upon the “radical Aristotelian” attempt to back religion up with Aristotelian philosophy with suspicion. While some scholars have doubted whether some or most of those accused by Tempier in the 13th century would have accepted the “double truth” formula (by which they presumably mean, what I have here called “the double truth theory proper”), there have been others who, in view of these later more close versions to this view, have been willing to consider that there might have been such supporters of the “double truth theory” even then. What concerns us here is only the question where Delmedigo stood on this matter.

As opposed to the late 19th century scholarship of Adolf Huebsch who proved (1882–1883) that Delmedigo's Sefer Behinat Hadat had been much influenced by a small, less well-known, but important work of Ibn Rushd called Kitab Fasl Al-Maqal, Julius Guttman wrote in 1927 an interesting paper in which he showed that the direct influence of that work upon Delmedigo had been somewhat exaggerated and, more importantly, claimed that Delmedigo had been more directly influenced by the Christian Averroists. The basis for this claim was his demonstration that there are traces in Delmedigo's work of the “double truth theory” which belongs more specifically to the Christian Averroists such as John of Jandun rather than to Ibn Rushd himself. Guttman argued that in his description of the relations between reason and religion, Delmedigo's view was really closer to that of the Christian Averroists, but he had toned this theory down a little because he wished to present Judaism as more rationalist than Christianity. He therefore described Delmedigo's view as a compromise between the “double truth theory” and the extreme rationalism of Ibn Rushd himself.

The rationalism of Delmedigo in Sefer Behinat Hadat is indeed very much in evidence, notably in one particular passage in the polemic against Christianity in which he writes:

…our divine Torah would never oblige us to believe things which contradict each other, or to deny the first principles, or even principles that are almost like first principles, or the evidence of our senses. If our religion required us to believe such things we would reject the religion. For even if it were assumed to be true that we were so required, no divine punishment could follow our refusal to believe such things, since our intellect, with its nature as constituted by God, would not allow us to accept or to believe them but would constantly picture and inform us of their opposite… (Part I, section 4, p. 81, lines 29–35)

This is one of the most extreme versions of the general line of Jewish anti-Christian polemics characteristic of the “Jewish Averroists”, in which the main thrust is the claim that the fundamental dogmas of the church are irrational.

But, on the other hand, Guttman's assumption that the “double truth theory” is somehow inconsistent with this rationalism is in error. A more careful examination of the way the so-called theory of “double truth” functions, not only in Delmedigo's thought, but also in the writings of all those other “radical Aristotelians” who make use of it, reveals that this theory was designed to defend rationalism rather than to mute it in any way. Both Maimonides and Ibn Rushd, when faced with cases in which there was a clash between the claims of the rational Aristotelian philosophy or science and the accepted beliefs of their traditional religions, had open to them a method by means of which they could find for themselves a fairly easy solution. They could always try to offer a new interpretation of the texts upon which the religious doctrine was based which would be more congenial and consistent with philosophy or science. As Maimonides put it, in a very well-known passage, “the gates of interpretation are not closed.” (Guide of the Perplexed, Part II, chapter 25) Sometimes their new interpretations were readily accepted by their co-religionists, but sometimes the new interpretation might not be so readily accepted. However this was not the case with Christianity in the medieval church. Only the Pope or the top hierarchy could interpret the holy scriptures. The ordinary believer had no right to offer his own interpretation or to question the interpretation that was handed down by the hierarchy. Maimonides and Ibn Rushd were able to develop views regarding the difference between the ways these scriptures were commonly understood by the unenlightened simple believers and the way that they could be interpreted by the intellectuals. Both these philosophers felt themselves entitled to try to fathom the esoteric meanings which the text must be hiding, for they were both convinced, as rationalists, that the texts could not contradict the rational truth. But Christian philosophers of that period could not follow this path. Thus when there was a difficulty in reconciling the views of the rational philosophers with the teachings of the church they could only either try to find some common ground or some conceptual compromise between the philosophical views and the church teachings (and this was the what was attempted by the majority of the theologians) or to reject the views of the philosophers (and this was the intuitive tendency of the majority of simple believers) or to accept the views of the philosophers as perhaps the truth that reason unaided could reach, but not the real truth. The rational truth might then be regarded as something of less value than the religious truth of the church.

This last way was the pathway which led to one or another of the versions that we have set out above as explicating what might be taken as the extended “double truth theory”. It was a pathway followed by a bold minority of “radical Aristotelians” who were regarded with suspicion by the church authorities. Most of this minority found itself exposed to the irate criticisms of Bishop Tempier and others like him between the thirteenth and the fifteenth centuries. However these “radical Aristotelians” managed to maintain themselves in certain localities. And the Italian city Padua, was one of the centers of such a minority view in the fourteenth and fifteenth centuries. So Guttman was probably right in thinking that Delmedigo was exposed to this approach which most of his Christian students imagined to be the views of Ibn Rushd himself. As a Maimonist, Delmedigo was probably sympathetic from the start to such a view, for such Maimonists as Isaac Albalag, Joseph Caspi and Moses Narboni tended to reject the attempts sometimes made by Maimonides himself to offer theological compromises (in which they suspected he did not really believe) for the benefit of the simple believers. They knew that Maimonides had all sorts of views which he would not divulge except privately to mature and sophisticated associates because he was convinced they would be upsetting for the simple believers. The latter-day Maimonideans regarded Ibn Rushd as more consistent in withholding such views from the simple believers of his own faith. This was precisely the attitude that Delmedigo adopted. Pure rationalism was for the philosophic elite who realized that the scriptures were intended primarily for the masses. The scriptures expressed fundamental religious truths which were basically the truths of reason; however these were expressed in a simplified child-like form. But it was not politic to try to get simple folk to understand just how the scriptures should be interpreted in order to see this. The philosophers should keep their interpretations to themselves. So said Ibn Rushd and so, following him, said Delmedigo. In saying so he sometimes used the formulae that were characteristic of the Christian “radical Aristotelians.”

For example since he is of the opinion that the truth of any religion cannot be tested on the basis of doctrinal beliefs alone, but depends also on the way of life which the particular believers are enjoined to live, and this may be based on revelation and tradition, he confesses that:

… I did not choose in my writings on theoretical matters [relating to religion] to argue in a philosophic manner with the philosophers on topics where they do not agree with us. For these matters are not within the power of rational inquiry. I relied instead on prophecy and true tradition. I am of the opinion that those of our religion who preceded me who sought to explain such topics in a rational manner exchanged the special method of inquiry applicable to these topics with empty rhetoric and found themselves like mediators between Torah scholars and non-Torah scholars, that is, neither Torah-scholars nor philosophers. (Ross, p. 83, Part I, section 5, lines 6–11)

This passage echoes the point made in the introduction to his book Sefer Behinat Hadat where he wrote:

No sensible person will doubt that the methods of inquiry vary considerably not only in different subjects but even in a single field of inquiry. For example you will note that the method of extracting the law [from the verses of the Torah] in Talmudic jurisprudence is very different from the method of the grammarian and those who seek to understand the literal meaning [of those same verses]… Let no one ask of us proofs that are necessary and absolute in these matters, but only the proofs that are correct and appropriate in this subject. (Ross, p. 75, Introduction, lines 17–23)

This would seem to indicate a stress on the part of Delmedigo on the context-bound character of different subjects each requiring its own methods, aims and results. What is correct for the grammarian is not necessarily correct for the lawyer. So what is correct as philosophy or science, which bases itself on rational inquiry (e.g. eternity of the universe or the unicity of the intellect), might not be correct for religion, which bases its beliefs on revelation and tradition (e.g. creation or individual immortality).

This type of reasoning might have supported a “double-truth theory proper”. But closer examination reveals that Delmedigo is no more than a “disappointed rationalist”. He would have been very happy if all the fundamental beliefs (sherashim) of true religion could be supported by rational proof, as are, in his opinion, the beliefs in God's existence, oneness and immateriality. But this cannot be the case, since Judaism requires also the acceptance of such fundamentals as the belief in the actuality of prophecy and the uniqueness of the prophecy of Moses as reported in the Torah, as also that there will be reward for the observance of the Torah's commandments and punishment for those that transgress them, that miracles are possible, and so on. None of these can be rationally proven, even though they are not inconsistent with reason, and may even be rendered probable by rational considerations. Therefore Delmedigo insists that all Jews should regard themselves as joined together in their acceptance of all these fundamentals as something given by revelation, prophecy and tradition, even though an elite minority will be able to recognize in them the central core that can be rationally proven as well as the reasonableness of most, if not all, of the others.

5. Neo-Platonism and the Kabbalah

In an enlightening paper published in 1991, Kalman P. Bland studied Delmedigo's attitudes to Neo-Platonism and to the Kabbalah (the Jewish mystic tradition), and came to the conclusion that while his attitude to the former was totally negative, his relation to the latter was more complex. He examined carefully the four texts in which Delmedigo had made remarks on the Kabbalah: the Hebrew version of his Treatises on Intellect and Conjunction composed originally in Latin in1482; the Hebrew version of his Commentary on De Substantia Orbis of Averroes composed originally in Latin in 1485; the Latin-Italian letter to Pico of 1486; and the Sefer Behinat Hadat of 1490. Mindful of Delmedigo's “Averroism”, and the fact that this involves not only a devotion to elitist rationalism but also a concern for the well-being of the people of simple faith, and a readiness to sanction those elements of folk religion which do not contradict reason, and recalling the fact that two Jewish Averroists before Delmedigo — Moses Narboni in the 14th century and David Messer Leon in the generation before Delmedigo — had both tentatively sought some sort of accommodation with some aspects of the Kabbalah, Bland re-examines these four passages with care.

The first is the passage which we have had occasion to note before where Delmedigo writes:

…regarding the opinion associated with the Kabbalists from among our nation which somehow relates to Plato's opinion of the soul and to Ibn Sinna's … the Kabbalists postulate that the Emanator exists and that some souls are old while still others are newly created — not in the strict sense of that term, but only with respect to their relation with body, since all of them were present at Sinai. In the future, however, after all things revert to their Source, a difference will obtain. The refutation of this has not been shown above, for these are true opinions when understood properly. When, however, they are understood as most of the pseudo-savants among our nation nowadays understand them, they become bizarre fancies and rather ancient opinions, the refutation of which is undoubtedly clear to those who know. They seek only to utter words without understanding ideas… If you are wise, you will understand the truth and no doubt will remain to you.

The last sentence reminds Bland of the way Maimonides too invites the reader to read between the lines. So stimulated, he suddenly understands in what way the doctrine of the transmigration of souls can be interpreted as saying, in effect, the same thing as Ibn Rushd's doctrine of the unicity of the intellect. The missing link is the Kabbalistic idea that all the souls of the Jewish people of all generations were present at Sinai on the occasion of the giving of the Torah. “All the souls being present at Sinai” can now be seen to be equivalent to “the unicity of the intellect”; “The Emanator” is equivalent to the part played in cognition by “the Active Intellect”. And the equivalent of “escalation to the Source” is “the scaling of the epistemological ladder whose rungs are constituted by the progressive abstraction of universal forms culminating in the conjunction with the Active Intellect.” So the Kabbalists can be interpreted as really saying the same things that Ibn Rushd said. The only contemporary readers who will not understand this clear parallel between Ibn Rushd and the ancient doctrine of transmigration, according to Delmedigo, are the “pseudo-savants”, the sham Kabbalists of the new school, not the genuine ones of the older and more authentic school. What is it that prevents these contemporaries from seeing the truth?

The answer to this begins to emerge from the second and longer passage regarding the Kabbalists which Band proceeds to analyze. In this longer passage, where the topic in Ibn Rushd is whether there is or is not a force more exalted and higher than the heavens, Delmedigo offers alternative specifications of the “force” responsible for the cosmic order. Here in the Hebrew version he gives the example of the Kabbalists who maintain that there are existents, namely the sefirot , whose rank is inferior to Ein Sof (the infinite source) from which they emanate, but superior to the movers of the celestial spheres. These Kabbalists believe that Ein Sof is above thought and mental conception and above intellect. The sefirot act by virtue of the force of Ein Sof and the order of this world (i.e. our material world) is derived from their order i.e. the order of their rank in emanation. Delmedigo notes that these notions are taken from the ancient philosophers, particularly the Platonists, who also believe in the migration of souls as well as the cosmic aeons- the destruction of the world and its restoration. These Kabbalists merely added divine epithets, cryptic allusions with the alphabet and with the words of the Torah. Maimonides, says Delmedigo, abandoned these ideas, for the ways of the Aristotelian philosophers are far removed from the ways of the Platonists. Delmedigo ends the passage by saying:

…would that the statements of the Kabbalists be understood properly, for this science has almost become non-existent among our people now. They only utter words; they do not understand ideas.

It is clear that Delmedigo here means to imply that the babblers are the sham Kabbalists, who have revised the true Kabbalah and reinterpreted it in the light of Neo-Platonic notions. The main distortion, as Delmedigo points out in this passage, is the rejection of the attribution of intellect to God. Ibn Rushd had insisted in his criticism of Al-Ghazali in his Tahafut Al-Tahafut, that intellect is the most special appellation of His essence according to the Aristotelians, in contrast to Plato's opinion that the intellect is not the First Principle. The principle of intelligible order in the universe, Delmedigo believes, following Ibn Rushd, must be identified with the intellect of God. The intensification of the attack, in this passage, against the Neo-Platonists, shows that the target of his criticism has changed. In the first passage he could be taken to be criticizing those Jews whose obscurantism was blamed for leading Christian scholars to mock Judaism. But in the second passage his target has become those Jews whose doctrines had become fascinating to a group of Christians, i.e. the circle of Ficino. This group included Jewish Neo-Platonists and former Jews (like the one who adopted the name “Flavius Mithridates”) who were adept at “discovering” Christian truths within the Kabbalah.

The third passage comes from Delmedigo's Latin-Italian letter to Pico of 1486 which includes an abbreviated version of the second passage in translation. In this passage Delmedigo casts doubt on the Kabbalah's legitimacy, informs Pico that the emanationist doctrine of the Sefirot is philosophically unjustified, and stresses its departure from true doctrine of Ibn Rushd that the universe is ordered by God alone and not by secondary “spiritual forces”, and that intellect is the most appropriate of God's attributes. He is intent on undermining Pico's confidence in the Platonically corrupted Kabbalah being advocated by its misguided adherents. But he makes no reference there to Christianity as such. It is only in the fourth passage written four years later in Candia, as part of his Sefer Behinat Hadat, written primarily for Jewish readers, at a time when all connections with his former Christian patrons have been severed, that he allows himself to set out his anti-Christian polemic with full force, and also sets out his full measure of disenchantment with the Kabbalah. He sets out his critique of the false claims to antiquity of the Kabbalist tradition. Neither in the Talmudic period nor in the works of the Geonic period do we find any recognition or sympathy with the central doctrines that have become characteristic of the Kabbalistic doctrines which spread since the 13th century. The Sefer ha-Zohar is a forgery. The view of the group of Kabbalists that speak of the sefirot as constituting God himself is plainly heretical. Only the view of the group that introduced the Ein Sof as something transcendent which is above the sefirot can have any legitimacy, and that only when their statements regarding the sefirot have been properly interpreted. So part of the Kabbalistic doctrines may be allowed to retain their hold in the Jewish community, but only when they have been suitably reformed. The notion that the reasons for the observance of the commandments have something to do with their relation to the sefirot and that their observance therefore has a theurgic function in opening the way for spiritual forces above is totally irrational, according to Delmedigo.

What person, upon hearing it, can really believe, if he pays full attention to what he is saying, and strips away imaginary fancies, that the supernal powers can be rectified only by the deeds of human beings? We human beings cannot rectify ourselves, so how could we be able to rectify the supernal powers! (Ross, p. 99, Part II, section 3, lines 5–7)

This last remark is clearly aimed at the Ficino Academy, which saw in the theurgic function of the Kabbalah an important link in their effort to cultivate a new attitude to human beings and their potential powers. It was this that drew them to alchemy and magic as well as to ecstatic religion. But in the Jewish community, it was precisely against this attitude that Maimonides and his followers had been fighting for so many years. Delmedigo here shows himself to be a loyal supporter of the old guard. Judaism for him was a fight for rationality, sobriety and the realization of one's human limitations. One's worship of God must be part of an acceptance of nature and a recognition of the wisdom of the Creator. Its highest manifestation could be only something intellectual, namely the intellectual love of God. And the immortality of the soul could only be, as Ibn Rushd maintained, the conjunction of the intellect with the Active Intellect. Elijah Delmedigo knew that some of these ideas were too abstract and rarified for the ordinary believer to appreciate. He had sympathy for the simple believers and tried to reassure them that he believed the same things that they did. But behind the unified façade they felt that he was different. And different he was — not only from them but also from the newer streams in Renaissance Thought and in later Judaism.


Works by Elijah Delmedigo

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Ibn Rushd | Maimonides | Pico della Mirandola, Giovanni