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Constructivism in Metaethics

First published Tue Sep 27, 2011

Constructivism in ethics is the view that insofar as there are normative truths, for example, truths about what we ought to do, they are in some sense determined by an idealized process of rational deliberation, choice, or agreement. As a “first-order moral account”—an account of which moral principles are correct—constructivism is the view that the moral principles we ought to accept or follow are the ones that agents would agree to or endorse were they to engage in a hypothetical or idealized process of rational deliberation. As a “metaethical account”—an account of whether there are any normative truths and, if so, what they are like—constructivism holds that there are normative truths. These truths are not fixed by facts that are independent of the practical standpoint, however characterized; rather, they are constituted by what agents would agree to under some specified conditions of choice.

In working to provide a more precise definition of constructivism in metaethics, the focus of this entry, one faces two main difficulties. The first difficulty is that constructivism comes in several varieties, each of which claims a different niche within metaethics, and some claim no space at all. The second difficulty concerns where to place constructivism on the metaethical map in relation to realism and anti-realism. These are terms of art, and it is highly contested which views count as realist and which as antirealist.

These two difficulties will be addressed in what follows by focusing on the distinctive questions that constructivist theories are designed to answer. Section §1 defines the scope of constructivism in ethics, in contrast to constructivism in political theory. Sections §§2–5 illustrate the main varieties of metaethical constructivism, which are designed to account for the nature of normative truths and practical reasons. Section §6 presents the main varieties of constructivist accounts of the justification of moral judgments of right and wrong. Section §7 discusses the metaethical status of constructivism, and its distinctive import.

1. Constructivism: political, moral, and metaethical

The term ‘constructivism’ entered recent debates in moral theory with John Rawls’ seminal article “Kantian Constructivism in Moral Theory” (Rawls 1980), wherein Rawls offered a reinterpretation of the philosopher Immanuel Kant's ethics and of its relevance for political debates. According to Rawls, these debates fail to effectively address the problem of ethical disagreements because they adopt inadequate standards of objectivity. The inadequate standards, he explains, are metaphysical and appeal to the independent reality and truth of values. Rawls turns to Kant in order to argue for a conception of objectivity that is not metaphysical, but “political.” He attributes to Kant the idea that we need objective standards in reasoning to solve practical problems about what to do (Rawls 1971, 34, 39–40, 49–52). Rawls is especially concerned with coordination problems that arise in pluralistic contexts, wherein citizens hold different and to some extent incommensurable moral views. Our need for objectivity is practical: it arises in contexts in which people disagree about what to value and need to reach an agreement about what to do.

Rawls' leading idea is that, in justifying the principles of justice to govern the major social institutions (what he calls the “basic structure of society”), it is not necessary to engage in the metaphysical debate about moral truths. Instead, we need to consider which principles all citizens could accept under idealized conditions of choice. He calls the ideal conditions of choice the “original position” (Rawls 1971, 118–162). In the original position, choosers are behind a “veil of ignorance” that blinds them to any information about their identity or social position, thereby preventing them from choosing in a partial way, based on consideration of their own interests (Rawls 1971, 136–142). This idealized procedure, or “procedure of construction,” is a device for identifying what follows from the practical standpoint shared by citizens who accept liberal democratic values, such as the freedom and equality of persons (Rawls 1971, 21; Rawls 1993, 26). By excluding irrelevant information, the original position protects against bias and specifies a “public perspective” from which all citizens who endorse liberal values can deliberate about what justice means and what just institutions are, independently of interests that are specific to their particular position. Judgments arrived at, or “constructed,” according to this reasoning are objective insofar as they are acceptable to all citizens, independently of the particular position they hold in society and the specific interests that accompany such a position. According to Rawls, this is all that is required to address the practical problem of disagreement and is sufficient to warrant a stable system of social cooperation among citizens with different moral, philosophical, and religious views (Rawls 1971, 138).

Rawls' idealized procedure, he tells us, adopts a conception of the person as free and equal, and he emphasizes a similar idea in his interpretation of Kant's moral philosophy (Rawls 1971, §40; Rawls 1980). However, Rawls' own constructivist theory differs significantly from the sort of constructivism he attributes to Kant (to be examined in §2.1). Rawls advocates constructivism as a political conception, which is by design non-committal regarding ontological and metaphysical questions (Rawls 1993, 100; Rawls 1999, 395, 354) and does not rest on any claims about which moral view is correct. By contrast, Kant's ethical theory combines metaethical claims about the nature of moral truths and moral obligations. Rawls' political constructivism is more modest than ethical constructivism in other respects. First, the scope of political constructivism is narrower than constructivism understood as a metaethics. This is because political constructivism concerns only the principles of justice of the basic institutions of society, while metaethical constructivism concerns all normative claims. Second, the audience of political constructivism is more limited, as it addresses the fellow citizens of a pluralist democracy, rather than all rational agents (Rawls 1987, 421–448; Rawls 1999, 473–496; Rawls 1993, 116). Third, the strategy invoked in political liberalism is more limited. For Rawls, rational agreement is “constructed” by imagining how citizens with liberal convictions would choose if they were placed in the original position, where the sources of bias are blocked. If citizens did not know their gender, religious and moral views, and social status, for instance, which principles of justice would they accept? This thought-experiment produces a hypothetical agreement, even among citizens who endorse radically different values and life styles (Rawls 1985; Rawls 1987; Rawls 1993, 49). Embedded in the setup of the original position are certain normative judgments implicit in the public political culture of liberalism—such as claims about the nature of fair bargaining conditions, the freedom and equality of persons, and the irrelevance of certain traits—such as race, sex, class, and natural endowments—to the distribution of rights, liberties, income and wealth. The relevant agreement for Rawls is among “reasonable” fellow citizens living within the boundaries of a specific society, who are already interested in justice and accept the burdens and standards of cooperation (O'Neill 2003a,b; cf. Brink 1989, 303–321; 1987).

By contrast, constructivism in ethics is the view that there are normative truths about what one ought to do, but they depend on how rational agents would reason in an idealized deliberative situation. Disagreements about the relevant standards of practical reasoning generate different varieties of metaethical constructivism: Kantian, Humean, Aristotelian, and conventionalist (§§ 2–5). Some philosophers defend a restricted form of constructivism as an objectivist method of justification for certain normative judgments—typically, moral judgments—without taking an explicit position about the nature of all normative truths (§6).

2. Kantian constructivism

Kantian constructivism names a family of ethical theories inspired by Kant's ethics. The distinguishing feature of Kantian constructivism is that it accounts for the nature of moral and normative truths starting from considerations about the features of rational agency. On this view, reasons for being moral do not spring from our interests or desires; instead, they are rooted in our nature as rational agents. Insofar as they are requirements of practical reason, moral obligations are universally and necessarily binding for all rational beings. Because of its claim to universality, Kantian Constructivism is the most ambitious form of constructivism.

2.1 Kant's constructivism

Whether Kant himself defends constructivism is a matter of dispute (Krasnoff 1999; Audi 2004; Kain 2006b; Irwin 2009). On Rawls' reading, Kant's analysis of obligation commits him to a kind of constructivism, which is best highlighted in contrast to competing views of moral obligations (Rawls 1980, 1989, 2000). Kant holds that all previous ethical theories have failed to account for moral obligation because they have failed as theories of practical reason (Kant G 4: 441–444; C2 5: 35–41, 153, 157). They fail to capture the autonomy and independence of reason, that is, its capacity to produce objective moral ends. These theories are said to be “heteronomous” because they deny the autonomy of reason. Kant holds that heteronomous doctrines have skeptical implications because they cannot make sense of the authority of moral norms. Moral norms are authoritative only if they are “generated” by reason. Kant's charge of heteronomy is directed against all previous moral doctrines, but his arguments are directed against sentimentalism and dogmatic rationalism (or intuitionism). Sentimentalism, championed by Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, and Adam Smith, holds that ethical concepts stem from sentiments and regards reason as incapable of moving us to action. On this view, the role of reason is purely instrumental. That is, reason merely finds the means to satisfy the agent's ends and it is not capable of indicating which ends are worth pursuing. For Kant this claim exposes sentimentalism as a heteronomous doctrine, which fails to establish the objectivity of moral obligations. Sentimentalism treats moral obligations as conditional upon our interests, and thus of limited authority: you have a moral obligation to keep your promise, if (but only if) it suits your interest or desire.

Kant raises the same objection against dogmatic rationalism, championed by Christian Wolff and Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, which holds that there are real moral truths that we apprehend by rational intuition, and independently of our conceptions of the person (Kant G 4, 443; Rawls 2000, 50, 228). On this view, reason recognizes an objective order of values or moral ends that exist prior to and independently of our reasoning and of the kinds of agents we are. In discovering such ends, moral agents do not actively exercise reasoning; they are as passive as in sensory perception. For Kant, dogmatic rationalism fails to secure the conclusion that moral obligations have unconditional authority over us (Kant G, 4: 441). This is because moral truths are supposed to guide us only on the condition that we have a corresponding desire to be guided by what is rational (Rawls 1980, 343–346; Rawls 1989, 510–513).

The critique of heteronomous doctrines is that they hold that moral ends exist and are identifiable prior to reasoning about them. Reason can only recognize them as already there, and can bind agents only with the help of inclination or interest. According to Kant, this is a form of moral skepticism. Constructivism is often taken to be part of Kant's overall argument against skepticism (Korsgaard 1996; Schneewind 1991). Skepticism is avoided only if reason is autonomous, and its authority does not derive from anything outside its domain. Reason is autonomous if its authority is underivative and its objects are constructed rather than passively recognized. The norm governing the activity of reason must be internal and constitutive of the activity itself, rather than dependent on any given value, interest, or desire (O'Neill 1989, 172–173). That is to say that reason is a “self-legislative activity” (Kant G 4: §2). Kant thinks that there is only one way to produce genuine reasons, which Kant calls the “Categorical Imperative.” The Categorical Imperative expresses the autonomy of reason and its governing principle. But the Categorical Imperative is not a mere decision-procedure to determine what to do, but the “constitutive norm” of reason, that is, the basic standard of rationality in thinking and acting (Rawls 1989, 498–506; Rawls 2000, 166, 240–244; Korsgaard 1996a, 36–37; O'Neill 1989, 18–19, 59n, 128, 180; Bagnoli 2002, 131–132; Reath 2006, 221–222; Engstrom 2009, Chapter 5; Street 2010: 364). Kant gives several specifications of the Categorical Imperative, which he regards as equivalent (G 4: 421, 429, 431, 433); but at bottom, it is the requirement that in deliberating we test our motives by considering whether the principle they express can be endorsed as a universal law.

Critics of the constructivist interpretation of Kant's ethics point out that the basic argument for constructivism emerges from the analysis of obligation in Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, but there are also realist strands in Kant's works. In the Critique of Practical Reason, Kant refers to our consciousness of the moral law as “the fact of reason” (Kant C2 5: 46–48). We know the moral law as a “fact”, and we feel its pull in the guise of reverence for the law. This immediate consciousness of the moral law also shows that we have an interest in morality, which arises independently of self-interested motives (Kant C2 5: 42-43). Many interpreters take the argument from the fact of reason to show that Kant's claim about the objectivity of moral obligations ultimately relies on perception of some moral facts (the fact of reason), hence on a realist foundation (Ameriks 2003, 263–282; cf. Kleingeld 2010, 55–72). Contrary to constructivists, they deny that claims about the autonomy of reason or its practical function commit Kant to constructivism. On their view, Kant's defense of the autonomy of reason takes place within a project of identifying the foundation of morality, which is realist in spirit because it appeals to the absolute value of humanity (Wood 1999, 157, 114; Rauscher 2002; Langton 2007; Johnson 2007; Hills 2008; Besch 2008, 2009; Krasnoff 1999; Kain 1999, 2004, 2006b; Larmore 2008, 83–84; Irwin 2009; Galvin 2010).

Constructivists have seldom dealt with the argument from the fact of reason, or they have downplayed its role in Kant's general argument for the objectivity of moral obligations (O'Neill 2002, 81–97; Łuków 1993, 204–221; cf. Engstrom 2009, 243). Rawls, instead, takes the fact of reason to show that Kant develops “not only a constructivist conception of practical reason, but a coherentist account of its authentication” (Rawls 1999, 524; Rawls 2000, 268–273). In his view, the fact of reason indicates that the deliverances of practical reason cohere with our moral experience. This congruence is an integral part of Kant's vindication of ethical objectivity, but it is no commitment to realism. Rather, it simply confirms that there is no discrepancy between the requirements of practical reason (which are expressed by the Categorical Imperative) and our experience of morality (Rawls 1980, 340; Rawls 1989, 523–524; Rawls 2000, 253–272, 268, 273; cf. Kant C2, 5: 15).

Perhaps the most general source of reservations against the constructivist interpretation is that Kant's claims about the nature of objective moral cognitions seem best vindicated by moral realism, while constructivism is sometimes taken to be a form of antirealism (Ameriks 2003, 268, 274; Wood 1999, 167; Wood 2008, 108, 337, 374–375). However, as an interpretation of Kant, constructivism purports to be an alternative to both realism (e.g., rational intuitionism) and antirealism (e.g., sentimentalism). Both of the latter views are objected to on the ground that they lead to skeptical conclusions about practical reason, and thus fail to justify the unconditional authority of moral obligations (Rawls 1989, 516, 518–523; Korsgaard 2003; Reath 2006, 222; O'Neill 1989, 206). The constructivist interpretation claims to have the advantages of capturing the novelty of Kant's insight about the self-authenticating nature of reason as a self-legislative activity and also of making sense of Kant's conception of moral authority as bestowed through the critique of reason. The distinctive character of Kant's constructivism resides in the idea that reason itself should be scrutinized by reason in order for its verdicts to be justified. Constructivists hold that practical reason itself is constructed insofar as its legitimacy and authority are established and instituted by reasoning, rather than by appeal to some facts about the way the world is.

Independently of these interpretative issues, Kant's constructivism raises issues that are relevant to other versions of constructivism, and these will be discussed in §7.

2.2 Procedural realism

Among contemporary philosophers, Christine Korsgaard has developed the most ambitious, and controversial, version of Kantian constructivism. She defines Kantian constructivism as a form of “procedural realism”—the view that “there are answers to moral questions because there are correct procedures for arriving at them”; and she contrasts procedural realism with “substantive realism”—the view that “there are correct procedures for answering moral questions because there are moral truths or facts, which exist independently of those procedures, and which those procedures track” (Korsgaard 1996a, 36–37; see also Engstrom 2009, 119). Substantive realism holds that there are objective criteria of correctness for moral judgments only if such judgments represent matters of fact about the way the world is. By contrast, the constructivist view is that there are objective criteria of moral judgment insofar as there are objective criteria about how to reason on practical matters. There are objective reasons that prohibit deceiving and manipulating others, but such reasons are the result of practical reasoning, rather than discovered by empirical investigation, grasped by the intellect, or revealed by some god. What makes this view “Kantian” is that there is ultimately one criterion for reasoning on practical matters, which is the Categorical Imperative. By reasoning according to this criterion, we objectively ground moral obligation. This is to say, moral obligations are requirements of practical reason.

Korsgaard's case for constructivism parallels Kant's as Rawls reconstructs it. It starts by objecting that substantive realism fails to respond to the skeptical challenge because it simply assumes the existence of objective standards for morality without offering a rational basis for them. As a consequence, the realist also fails to account for the authority of moral obligations—for why we really ought to do as morality says. (Korsgaard 1996a; Korsgaard 2008, 234, 30–31, 55–57, 67–68). Realists are misled by the presumption that, in order to fend off skepticism, one has to anchor practical reasons in facts that are in themselves normative. But no appeal to such “normative facts” can explain how they count as reasons and motivate rational agents. Suppose we agree that it is a normative fact that deception is morally wrong. How does awareness of this fact rationally compel us to refrain from deceiving? This is not only a psychological question about the force that such a fact might exercise on our minds, but also, and most importantly, a normative question that concerns their authority.

According to Korsgaard, “the normative question” arises for humans insofar as they are capable of reflecting on themselves and considering their thoughts and desires from a detached perspective. This reflective distance allows rational agents to call into question the legitimacy of particular thoughts and desires and to suspend their pull. Because they are reflective, rational agents have ideals about the sort of persons they want to be, and they can guide their minds and actions accordingly. That is, they are capable of self-governance. Like Kant, Korsgaard thinks that the appropriate form of self-governance is self-legislation (Korsgaard 1996a, 36, 91, 231–232; Korsgaard 2008, 3).

According to Korsgaard, rational agents are guided by universal principles that they have legislated. The appeal to self-legislation does not make the moral law coincide with the arbitrary decisions of particular agents. The moral law is a principle of reasoning that binds all rational agents, not a decree of any one rational agent (Korsgaard 1996a, 36, 234–236; Korsgaard 2008, 207–229; Reath 2006, 112–113, 92–170). The constructivist claim is that the moral law obliges us only insofar as it is self-legislated. This is not to say that one is bound by requirements because one legislates them; otherwise, evil people would not be bound by the moral law (Korsgaard 1996a, 234–235; O'Neill 2003c; Reath 2006, 112–113, 92–170; Korsgaard 2008, 207–229). Rather, one can autonomously act on such requirements only if one legislates them. This is because universal principles guarantee that action is expressive of an agent's integrity, rather than merely in the service of satisfying preferences or desires. Like Plato and Kant, Korsgaard argues that some kind of integrity is necessary to be an agent and cannot be achieved without a commitment to morality, which is founded on reason (Korsgaard 2009, xii, Chapter 3; cf. Plato Republic 443d-e).

A canonical objection against the attempt to ground morality on rationality is that it fails to account for the special bonds and ties we have with our loved ones and thus fails to capture the nature of integrity and morality (Williams 1981). To address these worries, Korsgaard introduces the notion of “practical identities”, which specify roles as sources of special obligations. For instance, Adam values himself and finds his life worth living and his actions worth undertaking under the description of being a teacher of music, an American citizen, and Robert's friend (Korsgaard 1996a, 101, §3.3.1; Korsgaard 2009, 20). These practical identities govern Adam's choices, sustain his integrity, and are sources of specific obligations to his pupils, fellows, and friends (Korsgaard 1996a, §3.3.1; Korsgaard 2009, 22). However, we do not have obligations just because we occupy certain roles as teachers, citizens, or friends. Rather, such roles become practical identities, and sources of reasons, insofar as we rationally endorse them. Rational endorsement, in turn, requires that we test our loyalties and allegiances according to the principle of universality, which commits us to morality. In order to value ourselves under these specific descriptions, we ought to value humanity in ourselves and in others (Korsgaard 2008, Lecture 6, 25–26).

Korsgaard offers what is called a ‘transcendental argument’ for this conclusion. A transcendental argument is an argument that identifies the conditions under which it is possible for something to be the case. Korsgaard argues that valuing humanity, understood as the capacity for rationality, is the condition of the possibility of valuing anything at all (Korsgaard 1996a, 121–123; Korsgaard 1998, 60–62; Korsgaard 2009). Evaluators bestow value on objects on the basis of reasons, and thus in virtue of their rational capacity. The value of any object thus ultimately depends on the rational capacity of evaluators. ‘Humanity’ is the name of a distinctive value, which is unconditional and counts as the condition of the possibility of valuing anything at all. Since humanity is embodied in all rational beings, we should value humanity in ourselves as well as in others, on pain of incoherence. Special obligations and bonds that derive from local identities are insufficient to sustain our integrity when they are inconsistent with valuing humanity. For instance, the conduct of a Mafioso cannot be coherently justified on the basis of a universal principle. The Mafioso thus fails as a rational agent and leads a life that is not autonomous, since his life is not the product of reflective self-government. A systematic failure to be guided by universal principles of self-government amounts to a loss of agency. We cannot but be agents, and thus we are necessarily bound by the norms of rationality and morality.

Korsgaard's strategy depends on establishing that the norms of rationality and morality can be derived from the constitutive features of agency and that agency is inescapable. Both these claims have been attacked on grounds that will be discussed in section §7.3.

2.3 Abstraction vs. idealization

Onora O'Neill importantly departs from the versions of Kantian constructivism discussed above because she makes no appeal to transcendental arguments and rejects the idealized conceptions of rational agency that are at play in other constructivist theories, such as Kant's, Rawls', and Korsgaard's. She objects that idealization in ethical theory denies the limitations and vulnerability of human agents, and thus it is distorting and possibly dangerous. For instance, Rawls' original position is governed by a particular ideal, which hides some information before the construction of the principles of justice starts. The procedure of construction is thus loaded with heavy moral assumptions about agency and social interactions that are not true of real agents. By contrast, O'Neill's non-idealized constructivism starts with “abstraction,” which is a matter of bracketing, but not denying, some predicates concerning agents. For instance, to construct the principles of justice, she deploys very meager and indeterminate concepts of rationality and abstracts from the circumstances of justice.

This more austere constructivism is closer to Kant's theory (O'Neill 1988). According to O'Neill, Kant's constructivism is motivated by a vivid awareness of human imperfection, finitude, and vulnerability (O'Neill 1989; 1999). Humans are prone to mistakenly rely on claims that are not warranted, and thus they need to check and criticize the unjustified and arbitrary assumptions they make in reasoning. In contrast to realism, constructivism holds that the principles of reason are not available to us by intuition or introspection. Since such principles are not simply given to us, we must use our rational powers to figure out what these principles are. We need principles that can guide agents who are numerous, not ideally rational and not ideally independent of one another. O'Neill's constructivism does not depend on any fixed account of rationality or the degree of mutual independence of agents. She does not aim to address the hypothetical question, ‘What principles would a plurality of agents, with minimal rationality and indeterminate capacities for independence, choose to live by?’ Rather, she addresses the question, ‘What principles can a plurality of agents of minimal rationality and indeterminate capacities for mutual independence live by?’ The Kantian answer, according to O'Neill, is that no plurality of agents can choose to live by principles that aim to destroy or undermine the agency (of whatever determinate shape) of some of its members (O'Neill 1988, 10; see also O'Neill 1985, 2003a, 2004; cf. Darwall et al. 1992, 140).

The process of figuring out what the principles of reason are is avowedly circular; only reason itself can verify the credentials of its own claims. O'Neill argues that this circularity is not vicious because the process of verification can be reflexive, as it involves reason critiquing the claims of reason itself. More specifically, the critique of reason uncovers a basic principle of reasoning: we should rely only on those principles that other rational agents can share. This is a minimal requirement of universality, which demands that we test the credibility of our claims by considering whether they could be endorsed by all relevant others. The authority of reason is thus conferred by public communication among free rational agents, and it consists in the fact that the principles that govern our thoughts are neither self-serving nor self-defeating. We find out what these principles say by submitting our claims to free and critical debates, which constitute “the public use of reason” (O'Neill 1989, 70–71, 206). For instance, the principle that we ought not to harm, coerce, or deceive is a normative principle constructed out of an intersubjective account of practical reason. Since the critique of reason is a continuous, progressive, and reflexive process, on this constructivist account reason appears to have a history, which coincides with the development of practices of tolerance and mutual recognition (O'Neill 1999, 174; 2002). O'Neill's account does not yield any fully shaped system of moral knowledge; and it provides no algorithm for determining a system of morality. But it promises to vindicate reason's ability (and right) to distinguish sound justifications from mere rationalizations.

O'Neill's defense of the virtuous circularity of constructivism raises issues that are relevant to constructivism in general, and that will be addressed in sections §§7.2–3.

3. Aristotelian constructivism

Aristotelian constructivism is the view that normative truths are grounded in an account of practical reason that incorporates substantive standards about leading a good life (Lebar 2008). This variant of constructivism invokes the tradition of Ancient eudaimonism, and defines the good life in terms of virtuous rational agency (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, V 1 1129b2–7, III 4 113a32). Like the Kantian varieties of constructivism, Aristotelian constructivism appeals to constitutive features of practical reason; but, in contrast to Kantians, Aristotelians hold that these principles of sound practical reason are grounded on a substantive account of the good life. To identify such substantive standards, Aristotelian constructivism starts with an account of our rational animal nature, which is distinctively plastic and educable. The key feature of this account is the claim that practical rationality does not merely direct our affective responses toward adequate objects but also structurally transforms our sensibility.

The negative case for Aristotelian constructivism consists in the critique of Kantian constructivism as incapable of offering a credible alternative to moral realism. On his defense of Aristotelian constructivism, Mark Lebar objects that the Kantian attempt to anchor normative truths in some transcendental ideal is a tacitly realist move (Lebar 2008). Whether this charge has merit and Aristotelian constructivism has some decisive advantages over Kantianism depends on three related issues: (i) whether Kantian constructivism necessarily needs a transcendental foundation (cf. §2.3); (ii) whether claims about the structure of reason commit one to realism, and (iii) whether Aristotelian constructivism avoids the problem of circularity that arises for Kantian constructivism with distinctive strategies (§§3.3, §7.2). Like the Humean and Kantian varieties of constructivism, Aristotelian constructivism appeals to constitutive features of practical reason, and like Kantian accounts, it promises to secure a strong objective basis for substantive moral norms by showing that they are grounded in principles of reason.

4. Humean Constructivism

A recent variant of constructivism that is gaining popularity is inspired by David Hume and is thus named “Humean constructivism” (Bagnoli 2002, 131; Street 2008a, 2010; Velleman 2009; Lenman 2010). In contrast to Kantians, Humean constructivists offer a more relativistic account of the nature of normative truths, according to which the truth of a normative claim consists in its being entailed from the evaluative standpoint of particular individuals. The starting points of rational deliberation are contingent commitments, and practical concerns of actual agents (Lenman 2010, 180–181). Consequently, on this view, “truth and falsity in the normative domain must always be relativized to a particular practical point of view” (Street 2008a, 224). Humeans propose a procedure of construction that invokes normative standards that are not epistemic; these standards do not draw their authority “from their reliability in disclosing to us an independently constituted domain of moral truth but rather from their bearing on the distinctive practical concerns to which morality speaks” (Lenman 2010, 180).

The case for Humean constructivism rests on the inadequacy of competing views: “it is what we are forced to by the untenability of realism plus the failure of Kantian versions of metaethical constructivism” (Street 2010). In contrast to realism, Humean constructivism builds upon the Kantian insight that normative truths are not simply “out there,” as realists suppose, but instead follow from the so-called practical standpoint, which is the standpoint of anyone who values anything at all. The standards of correctness in normative judgment are generated by the attitude of valuing just as such (Street 2010, 369). Humean constructivism thus relinquishes the realist claim that normative truths are independent of the deliverances of practical reasoning. But it also abandons the Kantian claim that the demands of morality are requirements of practical reason. Some argue that the constitutive norms of practical reason may favor morality, but do not require it (Velleman 2009, 150–154; Lenman 2010, 192). Humeans maintain, contrary to Kantians, that an internally coherent Caligula who values torturing people for fun is conceivable. Such a person would have reasons for torturing people, which is just to say that the value of humanity is not a constitutive norm of reasoning (Street 2010, 371). Humean constructivism thus rejects the Kantian claim that there are universal moral norms that bind all rational agents. Street argues that “the substantive content of a given agent's reasons is a function of his or her particular, contingently given, evaluative starting points” (Street 2010). She does not exclude the possibility that there are some universal (normative and moral) truths, but if there are, they have to be produced from the potentially different practical standpoints of the agents whose reasons are in question. The possible agreement among various practical standpoints is not guaranteed by facts about the nature of reason or the principles of reason that are authoritative for all rational agents. Humeans hold that there is nothing alarming about the sort of relativism that their position implies (Street 2008a, 245; Velleman 2011). They also suggest that we can count on significant moral agreement based on contingent facts and the existence of a shared human nature.

5. Conventionalist constructivism

Perhaps the oldest form of constructivism is conventionalism, the view that moral claims are based on social conventions, that is, they are constructed by the actual agreement of some groups within specific traditions. Conventionalist constructivism makes the truth of moral claims and the standards of correctness of what one ought to do relative to specific groups or practices; it is thus a form of relativism (Westermark 1932; Harman 1984; Wong 2008). There are constraints on the way moral agents are supposed to form their moral convictions; but such constraints are generated by conventions rather than by universal features of practical reason. The main argument for conventionalism is that it makes sense of persistent and widespread disagreements, which shows that there are no shared principles of practical reason (cf. Velleman 2011). While relativist, this variety of constructivism can explain and justify large areas of moral accord within groups. For instance, it explains why sex with minors is largely agreed to be morally objectionable within contemporary liberal societies but morally permissible within some traditional societies.

6. Constructivist accounts of moral judgments

Some constructivist theories define their aim more narrowly: they seek to provide objectivist accounts of the basic principles of morality, rather than of all normative truths.

6.1 Contractualist constructivism of moral judgments

Most constructivists hold that moral reasons are the product of an agreement that is best captured in terms of a hypothetical contract (Rawls 1980, Scanlon 1998, Hill 1989, Hill 2001). “Contractualism” is thus the normative theory that is typically associated with constructivism, even though it is not accepted by all Kantians (cf. O'Neill 1988, 10; O'Neill 1985, 2003a, 2003b). Hobbesians do not use the term ‘constructivism’, but they use a similar notion of hypothetical contract to explain the nature of morality and of moral truths.

6.1.1 Kantian contractualism

Thomas Scanlon defends a restricted constructivist account of justification for a specific class of moral judgments of right and wrong (Scanlon 1998, 11–12; Chapter 4, §7.2). Scanlon rejects Kantian constructivism as a broad metaethical view on the grounds that moral matters cannot be resolved by appealing to the bare structure of rationality (the constitutive norm of practical reason) and instead need to be addressed by engaging in substantive arguments (Scanlon 2003b, 14–15). His aim is to elucidate the truth of claims concerning right and wrong in terms of their being entailed from the point of view of a certain contractual situation.

Scanlon's view rests on the contractualist formula according to which an act is wrong if its performance under the circumstances would be prohibited by any set of principles that no one could reasonably reject as a basis for informed, unforced, general agreement. This test of rejectability specifies the content of moral principles and tells us why it is rational for us to adopt them. The correctness of moral principles is explained in terms of a hypothetical agreement among the relevant set of individuals specified in terms of their motivation and the process of reasoning they employ. The criterion of rejectability is not simply evidence for true or correct moral principles; rather, the correctness of moral principles is constituted by the fact that they would be agreed upon in the specified circumstances. There are no correct moral principles independently of the rational agreement that the criterion of rejectability specifies. The property of rightness is constituted by what a group of reasonable agents, under certain specified conditions, would find non-rejectable (Scanlon 1998, 380 n. 48).

The test of rejectability is compatible with several kinds of disagreement about right and wrong, in particular, with disagreement about the standards for assessing conduct, and about the reasons for supporting these standards. To acknowledge the latter sorts of disagreement does not lead to relativism: it does not entail that there is no answer to the question of which side is correct about the reasons people have or that all answers are equally valid.

6.1.2. Hobbesian contractualism

Hobbesian contractualism is akin to Kantian constructivism in two respects. First, it views morality as a rational constraint on our interests; and second, it holds that morality is generated out of mere considerations of rational choice (K. Baier 1958, 1995; Gauthier 1974a, 1974b, 1986). The correct moral principles are those that would be produced by rational agreement because they are mutually advantageous. As in the case of Kantian constructivism, rational agreement does not simply show which moral principles are correct; rather, the correctness of moral principles is constituted by the fact that they would be agreed upon in the specified circumstances. In contrast to Kantian constructivism, however, Hobbesian contractualism does not assume an initial disposition to morality; rather, it starts from the assumption that there is a natural presumption against morality, because we are all self-interested. Rational agreement is a hypothetical agreement among real, self-interested individuals who are cooperating to further their own interests. If rational agents act in pursuit of their individual advantage, why do they come to recognize moral constraints on their deliberation? They do so because they agree that the best way to pursue their interests is by introducing impartial restrictions on what to do. While Kantian constructivists build a moral dimension of impartiality into their understanding of reason, Hobbesian contractualists hold a non-moralized conception of rationality understood as the capacity effectively to satisfy one's interests. Cooperation depends neither on common objectives nor on moralized features of rationality, but on common principles of action, determined by agreement. On this view, then, morality and self-interest are ultimately not in conflict.

6.2 Utilitarian Constructivism

While constructivism does not mandate any specific normative ethics and is often found combined with contractualism, as on the Scanlonian and Hobbesian models, some have suggested that Utilitarianism is a natural candidate for being paired with constructivism (cf. Rawls 1971, 251 fn. 29; O'Neill 2009, §2; Timmons 2003, §1). R.M. Hare is probably the Utilitarian philosopher whose view most deserves the label “Utilitarian Constructivism” (Richards 1988). Hare recognizes that his theory about the constructive justification of moral judgments is structurally similar to Rawls', though it arrives at utilitarian results. He objects that Rawls' approach escapes utilitarianism by “a very liberal use of intuitions” and that the appeal to intuitions has no credibility (Hare 1989, 214; Hare 1983, 147–148). To objectively ground moral obligations, one must deploy a deliberative procedure free from intuitions. Hare's ambition is to ground Kant's insight about universalization on the logical grammar of moral language (Hare 1952, 1963, 1981, 1997). The Kantian requirement of impartiality, according to Hare, can be justified by considerations about the meaning of the concepts, rather than a moral assumption. Moral constraints about deliberation are constructed out of a formal procedure, more precisely, what Hare describes as a form of moral reasoning, that combines the semantic feature of universality with another semantic feature, which Hare calls “prescriptivity,” that is, the tendency of moral judgments to prescribe or express a preference for a certain course of action. While this procedure of construction is morally neutral, it is nonetheless of practical importance in that it generates utilitarianism. On the basis of semantic considerations, plus criteria for selecting morally relevant features of the situation, the moral agent is led to considerations about how all sentient beings are affected by his action. In his early work, Hare held that utilitarian arguments can solve conflicts between preferences, which concern people's interests, but have no power to decide conflicts between ideals, which concern human excellences rather than human interests; thus, they have no power to convince the “fanatic,” the person who clings to an ideal regardless of its effects on people's interests, anymore than they can convince the immoralist (Hare 1963, 157–185). To this extent, Hare agrees with Humean constructivists that fictional Caligula cannot be forced to enter morality on pain of inconsistency. In his later works, however, Hare defends a more ambitious view, which purports to solve all moral conflicts, including conflicts between ideals, by treating conflicts of ideals as simply another kind of conflict among preferences, which moral reasoning can resolve (Hare 1981).

6.3 Society-based constructivism

Society-based constructivism—elaborated by David Copp—holds that there are true moral standards, which are the output of a decision procedure that takes into account the needs and values of the society and facts about the society's circumstances (Copp 1995, 2007). Accordingly, the theory holds that moral truth depends on what would be rational for societies to choose. Copp's view shares some important features with Kantian constructivism. First, society-based constructivism holds that societies need their members to endorse some suitable moral code in order to facilitate cooperation. It thus takes morality to be a cooperative enterprise, and implies that the need for objective moral standards is practical (Rawls 1980, §1). Second, this view explains the nature of moral truth in procedural terms, and thus it implies that there are no moral facts independently of the procedure (Rawls 1980: 307). Third, it also shares the Kantian view that to be adequate, any metaethics should make sense of the normativity of moral claims and their practical relevance (Copp 2007, 4–7). This is not taken to imply that we are bound by moral obligations insofar as we are motivated by them. On the contrary, society-based constructivism holds that we are bound by moral obligations independently of our actual motivational states. Finally, society-based constructivism also claims that any plausible metaethics should be at least compatible with naturalism.

However, society-based constructivism differs from Kantian constructivism because of its different account of the decision procedure from which moral standards are said to result, and because it offers a different explanation of normativity. While the procedure specifies a function of practical rationality, it does not commit to any specific view about autonomy. This difference has important consequences.

Unlike Kantian constructivism, society-based constructivism does not hold that only autonomist doctrines make sense of normativity (cf. §2). It also does not hold that constructivism is the only kind of theory that explains normativity. Copp claims that there is a subtler and more interesting difference between constructivist and realist views that make sense of normativity, and views that cannot make sense of normativity. In contrast to the (Kantian and Humean) antirealist varieties of constructivism, Copp defends society-based constructivism as both a decisively realist and naturalistic theory. It is realist insofar as it claims that moral propositions are truth-evaluable, and that some moral properties are instantiated; and it is naturalistic because it claims that such moral properties are natural (Copp 1995). However, Copp agrees with Kantian and Humean constructivism on a more modest claim, which is that normativity eludes mind-independent realism.

7. The metaethical status of constructivism and its import

While constructivism is recognized as a prominent and distinctive position in political philosophy, scholars are divided about its metaethical status and relevance. The appeal of constructivism is often thought to consist in its promise to offer a minimalist account of moral objectivity, which retains the benefits of non-naturalist realism while avoiding its epistemological and ontological costs (Darwall et al. 1992; Shafer-Landau 2003; Timmons 2003; Hussain & Shah 2006; Enoch 2009). But this is hardly distinctive of constructivism as such. Naturalist realism, an alternative to constructivism, also promises objectivity without the epistemological and ontological costs of non-naturalist realism. And defending the correctness of moral judgments on non-ontological grounds has been a constant preoccupation of antirealism (Hare 1952, 1963, 1981; Wright 1992, 6 ff.). Of course, in contrast to antirealists, Kantian constructivists do not see their conception of objectivity as weak or minimalist, because it appeals to the underivative authority of reason (O'Neill 1989). But some critics doubt that the constructivist conception of objectivity answers any interesting metaethical questions and argue that it pertains instead to normative ethics. In assessing the metaethical relevance of constructivism, critics tend to focus on three issues: the question whether constructivism offers a distinctive semantics (§7.1); whether it succeeds at steering a middle way between realism and antirealism (§7.2.), and whether its appeal to constitutive norms in practical reasoning and in the theory of rational agency is tenable (§7.3).

7.1 A constructivist semantics?

Constructivists have not offered a distinctive account of the meaning and logical behavior of moral and normative terms and concepts. Absent a distinctively constructivist semantics, some think that constructivism is best understood as “a family of substantive moral theories” (Darwall et al. 1992, 140; Hussain & Shah 2006; Enoch 2009). On this view, constructivism does not compete with antirealism or with realism, and its metaethical relevance is rather doubtful.

For some constructivists, lack of interest in semantics is motivated by the conviction that the semantic task with which metaethics is mostly preoccupied is positively misguided (Korsgaard 1996a; Korsgaard 2003; Street 2007, 239). The philosophical issue worth worrying about is normativity, and this is not something that we can explain solely on the basis of semantics. Rather, explaining normativity requires philosophers to engage in other sorts of philosophical investigation, for instance investigation into the idea of autonomy and rationality (Korsgaard 1996a).

While preoccupied with explaining normativity, other sorts of constructivists also recognize that the semantic task is worthwhile. In fact, they take themselves to discharge the semantic task with their account of what is constitutive of the attitude of valuing (Bagnoli 2002, Street 2010). By identifying the constitutive norms that one must be following in order to count as a valuer at all, constructivists have sketched a so-called “inferentialist semantics” for normative terms: the meaning of normative terms is explained by identifying the kinds of inferences (for example, about means and ends) one must be making in order to count as employing normative concepts at all” (Street 2010, 239–242).

This reply commits the constructivist to showing that her constitutivist proposal has some advantages over its competitors. Here we shall consider only the alleged advantages of constructivism over expressivist strategies for explaining the meaning of the normative terms. Bagnoli argues that these advantages concern moral phenomenology; that is, constructivism best captures the experience of moral agency and the categorical authority of moral norms (Bagnoli 2002, Bagnoli 2011a). Street holds that the expressivist strategy fails because the state of mind expressed by normative terms cannot adequately be located without implicitly trivially relying on the very normative concepts the expressivist tries to explain (Street 2010, 239–242). More specific objections are made against Blackburn's quasi-realism, the view that moral discourse behaves as the ordinary moral realist says, but without the ontological commitments of moral realism (Blackburn 1984). Some constructivists have entered the ongoing dispute about the capacity of quasi-realism “to earn its right to truth” (Wright 1985, Skorupski 1999). Bagnoli notes that quasi-realism is beside the point if moral judgments are truth-evaluable, but they do not represent facts of the world (Bagnoli 2002, 130–132). Street argues that quasi-realism ultimately leads to the incoherent view that value is mind-independent while projected by valuing creatures (Street forthcoming).

A more specific question is whether constructivism is committed to any theory of truth. According to some constructivists, moral norms develop over time, as result of ongoing rational deliberation and revision. For Kantians, the possibility of revision is connected to the claim that reason is subject to self-scrutiny (O'Neill 1992). Some constructivists are considering whether this claim can be reconciled with the idea that there are moral truths and the idea that moral judgments are truth-apt. While there is not yet a full-fledged constructivist semantics, there are some attempts to deal with these issues (Misak 2000).

7.2 Constructivism in the realism-antirealism debate

Even if constructivists could offer a semantics for normative terms and reconcile their view that moral norms are constructed with the truth-aptness of moral statements, some critics would argue that constructivism nevertheless fails to offer a genuine alternative to realism and antirealism. A reply to this objection, then, would require situating constructivism on the current metaethical map, bearing in mind that the constructivist project, which starts as an account of the scope of practical reason and the nature of practical reasons, is broader than a purely semantic investigation. Efforts to place constructivism in relation to realism and antirealism are complicated by the fact that there are different definitions of ‘realism’ (Dancy 1986; Sayre-McCord 1988, 2009; Miller 2010, Joyce 2009). Realists agree that (a) moral discourse shares the same semantics as non-moral discourse, (b) there are moral properties, such as rightness, (c) moral properties are sometimes instantiated, and (d) moral predicates express properties. But there is a disagreement whether in order to be a form of realism, a theory must hold a stronger claim that (e) moral properties and moral relations are “mind-independent” (Dancy 1986).

A further division, internal to realism, concerns the commitment to naturalism, which includes the claims that (f) moral properties are like any ordinary property and have the same metaphysical status as non-moral properties, whatever that is, and that (g) moral assertions express ordinary beliefs regarding the instantiation of these properties.

Constructivists take different stands in the realism debate. Current Humean constructivists decisively side with antirealism (Street 2008a; Lenman 2010, 181; Velleman 2009). Nevertheless, they take their view to differ from other forms of antirealism.

Aristotelian and Hobbesian constructivists share naturalistic claims (f) and (g). However, in contrast to realism as some characterize it, these constructivists reject (e), holding that the instantiation of moral properties depends on subjective features of our sensibility or rational agency, rather than being mind-independent (Lebar 2008; Copp 1995; Copp 2005, 271).

The position of Kantian constructivism with regard to the realism-antirealism debate is more complex. Some Kantian constructivists bracket the ontological question of the nature of normative truths and disengage from metaethics (Rawls 1980; Hill 1989, 2001, 2008). Others side with realism about reasons, even though they defend a restricted constructivism about moral judgments (Scanlon 1998; Scanlon 2003b, 18). The most ambitious versions of Kantian constructivism, however, attempt to carve out a position between realism and antirealism (O'Neill 1988; Korsgaard 1996a, 36; O'Neill 1989, 206).

One attempt to distinguish constructivism from both realism and anti-realism appeals to the function of concepts (Korsgaard 2003). Korsgaard points to an assumption she believes that realists and antirealists share and that constructivists reject, namely, that the primary function of concepts deployed in judgments that can be true or false is to represent things as they are, so if normative judgments are true, they must represent something real out there in the world. By contrast, constructivists think that normative concepts, which are deployed in judgments that can be true or false, have a practical function: they name solutions to practical problems, rather than represent features of reality (Korsgaard 2008, 302 ff.). For instance, the concept of equity does not stand for a property; instead, it proposes a response to the practical problem of how to distribute goods. Korsgaard draws the contrast between constructivism and other metaethical theories as follows. Unlike substantive realism, which holds that moral judgments are true insofar as they represent a mind-independent normative reality, and antirealism, which denies that there are normative truths because it denies that there are normative properties, constructivists hold that practical judgments can be true or false without representing mind-independent normative facts about the world (Korsgaard 2003, 325 n. 49).

This way of characterizing constructivism, however, fails to neatly mark the contrast between constructivism and several other sorts of metaethics. First, Korsgaard's characterization takes realism to be committed to the claim (e) about mind-independence. But not all define realism in this restrictive way (Sayre-McCord 1988). When realism is defined more capaciously, it includes views according to which moral judgments are made true by properties that depend on some mental states. Second, Korsgaard's way of drawing the contrast seems to overlook the fact that some contemporary versions of antirealism do not deny that moral judgments are truth evaluable. Instead, they adopt a deflationary conception of truth as a semantic notion (Wright 1985, 1992).

Constructivism agrees with forms of realism that hold that moral truths are not independent of the evaluative standpoint (McDowell 1985; see also Wiggins 1976a,b). Constructivism also appears to agree with a form of antirealism called “expressivism,” which holds that normative terms function to guide action rather than represent matters of fact and are used to express states of mind that differ from belief (Blackburn 1988, 169; Gibbard 1990, 107–108; Korsgaard 2003; Street 2010; Korsgaard 2009, 309). At most, then, constructivism stakes out a middle ground between forms of realism that are committed to mind-independent normative truths and forms of antirealism that deny there are any normative truths.

Korsgaard's general point is that by focusing on questions of meaning, the expressivist fails to make adequate sense of normative discourse, which requires a different sort of philosophical investigation about the sources of normativity (Korsgaard 1996a). According to constructivists, normativity is related to our capacity for self-reflection and autonomous agency. It is in virtue of this capacity that we reason and act for reasons. This constructivist view is also proposed in contrast to the realist claim that there are reasons independently of these capacities. For some realists, normativity should be taken for granted and needs no philosophical explanations (Shafer-Landau 2003; Scanlon 2009 Locke Lectures—see Other Internet Resources). Constructivists share the antirealist claim that normativity is not a feature that things possess or that can be identified independently of the practical standpoint that we occupy as evaluators. However, the interesting disagreement between constructivism and competing views concerns what counts as the adequate philosophical explanation of normativity (Enoch 2011a; Copp 2007; Street 2008b).

7.3 Constructivism and constitutivism

Constructivists tend to agree that the importance of constructivism does not depend on its specific contribution to the realism-antirealism debate. It resides in the insight that the nature of practical truths should be explained in terms of the constitutive features of practical reasoning. But critics argue that the constructivist conception of practical reasoning is either circular or parasitic on independent moral values. The objection often takes the form of a metaethical dilemma analogous to the dilemma discussed by Plato in the Euthyphro (10a). Either the practical standpoint is subject to moral constraints or it is not. If it is not, then, “there is no reason to expect that the principles that emerge … will capture our deepest convictions, or respect various platitudes that fix our understanding of ethical concepts” (Shafer-Landau 2003, 42). If it is, then the constraints are not themselves constructed and acceptance of them commits one to realism (Shafer-Landau 2003, 42). Constructivism thus either grounds moral truths on arbitrary standards or collapses into realism.

There are two canonical constructivist strategies for replying to the Euthyphro-analogous objection. These strategies respond to different construals of the objection.

First, the objection can be construed as motivated in part by the fact that some constructivists rely on moral intuitions in justifying their views. Their reliance on intuitions can appear to involve reliance on an “unconstructed” set of normative constraints on theorizing. Constructivists reply, however, that the objection calls into question the role of intuitions more generally and thus raises methodological issues. Constructivists and some of their critics disagree about the role to accord to intuitions in the practice of rational justification. According to Scanlon, a valid method of justification in ethics consists in testing the congruence between theoretical assumptions and intuitive moral judgments, that is, judgments to which we normally accord initial credence. Such intuitive moral judgments play a role in constructivist justification, even though they do not serve as an external foundation for morality. The disagreement between constructivists and their critics partly concerns whether to avoid appealing to intuitive judgments. For Scanlon, however, this is not a goal we should pursue, as it is both doubtful that we could avoid all appeal to intuitions and unpromising (Scanlon 1998, 241–247; 2003a). This is because, Scanlon holds, the purpose of theorizing in ethics is partly interpretative and partly normative. The constructivist project is to advance our understanding of moral principles and their limits by “clarifying our understanding of the reasons that make familiar moral principles ones that no one could reasonably reject” (Scanlon 1998, 246–247; 2003a, 429–435).

Not all constructivists view intuitions as playing a role in rational justification (Hare 1983; O'Neill 1989). But all agree that an adequate metaethics should not be totally reformist; it should be congruent with common understandings of morality.

Second, the objection can be construed as motivated by the fact that some constructivists appeal, in developing their views, to the idea that the norms of rational choice have a constitutive status. This is the route taken by all theories that base the standards of morality on the structural features of practical reason (§3, §5, §6.1, §6.3). It can again seem to involve appeal to an “unconstructed” set of normative constraints. Constructivists reply to the Euthyphro's objection that the appeal to such constraints is neither arbitrary nor does it commit constructivism to moral realism. It is, rather, an appeal to shared features of practical rationality.

Critics object that the appeal to constitutive norms of rationality merely shifts the problem to the level of practical reason. How does constructivism justify the norms it claims to be constitutive of practical reason? Again, either they are arbitrary or they are realist and depend on some normative features of reality. The underlying suggestion is that when Kantian constructivism appeals to constitutive standards, to do so is only to leap into realism about rational agency, since such standards invoke values that are not themselves constructed.

Korsgaard's argument for the value of humanity is the target of more specific criticisms. Critics argue that the Kantian appeal to transcendental arguments is a decisive step toward realism (Crisp 2006, 52–55; Larmore 2008, 121; Galvin 2010). Korsgaard holds that in order to value ourselves we need to value humanity. But it is not logically necessary that the condition of a thing's value be valuable itself (Rabinowicz & Rønnow-Rasmussen 2000; Kerstein 2001; Ridge 2005; Coleman 2006). Humanity may lack value even though it is the condition of possibility for the value of ourselves or our practical identities. The Kantian constructivist defense of the objectivity of moral obligations appears to be based on a realist premise, that is, the absolute value of humanity. If so, then constructivism does not offer a distinctive and novel reply to skeptical challenges.

While this criticism is addressed especially to Kantian constructivism, it threatens other sorts of constructivist views that appeal to constitutive norms of reasoning (Ripstein 1987; Enoch 2006, 2011b). These are norms that not only regulate but that also constitute the activity of reasoning. The constitutivist claim is partly normative and partly descriptive: it says both that there are norms that account for what it is to reason correctly about practical matters, and also that that these norms distinguish practical reasoning from other kinds of mental processes and activities. This way of understanding the constitutive norms raises a further objection: if they are partly descriptive, in what sense are they not part of the world? The issue is whether constructivism differs from realism about constitutive norms.

Is there anything ultimately at stake in calling the appeal to constitutive norms realist, rather than constructivist? Arguably, what is at stake is whether or not we fail to recognize a distinctive way of completing our quest for objective reasons. Kantians claim that we should distinguish between two distinct ways of answering our quest for objective reasons. In addressing the question “Why does x count as a reason for doing y?” both realists and constructivists deploy unconstructed or underived elements. Non-naturalist realists say: “It just does,” it is “simply true” that facts such as x count as a reason for doing y, and “there won't be any illuminating explanation of what makes them true” (Shafer-Landau 2003, 47, 48). With this answer the non-naturalist realist grounds the authority of moral judgments on the authority of other more basic judgments, which cannot be further justified.

Naturalist realists ground the authority of moral judgments in a different way. They hold that normative facts are just natural facts that can be investigated by ordinary empirical methods, for example, facts about the responses of agents under idealized (naturalistically described) circumstances. (Firth 1952; Railton 1986). Constructivists would not endorse this variety of naturalism. Constructivism of the kind that appeals to norms that are constitutive of the activity of practical reason is non-reductive. The key to this kind of constructivist proposal is not the reduction of moral properties to natural properties; rather, the key is a self-authenticating account of the standards of practical reason. For constructivism there are constraints on the kinds of acts that a rational agent would perform, but such constraints are selected on normative grounds, as a result of practical reasoning. To justify moral obligations as requirements of practical reason is a thoroughly normative enterprise. Whereas non-naturalist realists insist on the self-evidence of certain normative truths and naturalist realists emphasize the causal processes that lead us to value something, constructivism focuses on what is entailed from the standpoint of evaluators like us (O'Neill 1989; Korsgaard 2003, 2009; Street 2010; Velleman 2009). For the Kantian constructivist in particular, the only legitimate source of authority is the scrutiny of reason. Moreover, while reductionism of the kind sketched above focuses on the causal processes that lead us to value something the way we do, constructivism of the kind at issue here focuses on what is entailed from within the standpoint of evaluators like us (O'Neill 1989; Korsgaard 2003, 2009; Street 2010; Velleman 2009).

Some sorts of constructivism, such as society based constructivism, are openly defended as realist and naturalist (Copp 1995, 2007). And all constructivists endorse a broad commitment to naturalism, understood as the claim that a plausible account of moral discourse should be compatible with the scientific conception of the world (Korsgaard 1996a, 5; Street 2010; cf. Copp 2007, 278–9). In fact, some Kantian constructivists claim that their ethics of autonomy is the only fit for naturalism (Korsgaard 1996a, 5).

Nevertheless, constructivism claims to offer a distinctive way of accounting for objective reasons. Constructivism relies on a self-authenticating account of the standards of practical reason. In contrast to some kinds of realism, constructivism does not seek axioms or first principles or objective values on which to ground moral truths. Rather than providing an external foundation for morality, it holds that in forming our intentions and beliefs, we are answerable to criteria of correctness that are internal to and constitutive of the very exercise of rationality (Korsgaard 2008, 13–15, 110–126, 207–229). In the Kantian case, for instance, the categorical imperative makes explicit the ideal of moral and rational agency by specifying the requirements of practical reason. Such requirements are not premises in practical reasoning but its norms.

Whether successful or not, the appeal to self-authenticating reason is supposed to provide an alternative to either realism about objective justification or the skeptical denial of it. Constructivist justification is objective but internal to the practice of valuing.

The question is how exactly the constructivist idea of the underived authority of reason escapes the original problem of circularity. Ultimately, the worry is that constructivism builds upon moral assumptions it never justifies. For instance, Kantian constructivism appears to be grounded on the value of moral impartiality, that is, the demand of equal respect for persons (Scanlon 1998, 22–33; cf. 287–290; Rawls 1993, 38–54). The worry is that, in the final analysis, constructivism is vacuous because “its test yields results only by presupposing moral views which can only be established independently of it” (Raz 2003, 358; Timmons 2003). Furthermore, there is “no non-question-begging feature to which the constructivist can help herself in breaking symmetry among the various competing sets of constructed principles” (Timmons 2003, §3).

Kant and Kantian constructivists are keenly aware of the air of paradox surrounding the claim that the moral concepts, such as good and evil, are not determined prior to engaging in practical reasoning, but only as a result of engaging in practical reasoning (Kant C2, 5: 62 ff.). Practical reasoning does not serve the purpose of discovering a moral order of values. Nonetheless, for Kantian constructivists there is some sort of moral knowledge (Rawls 2000, 148, see also 218). So the worry is that one seems to know in advance what the constructivist doctrine must look like (Rawls 2000, 274). This is unsurprising, however. According to constructivists, the vindication of reason is “avowedly circular” (O'Neill 1989, 173; Rawls 1989, 517–528). As O'Neill remarks: “If the standards of practical reasoning are fundamental to all human reasoning, then any vindication of these standards is either circular (since it uses those very standards) or a failure (since it is not a vindication in terms of the standards that are said to be fundamental)” (O'Neill 1989, 29). This kind of reply is offered not only by Kantians, but also by Humean constructivists (Velleman 2009, 138–141).

This brings us to a final set of related objections concerning the constitutivist strategy that derives norms of morality from the basic features of rational agency. Critics raise three objections. First, some critics contend that the Kantian model of rational agency is not rich enough to drive particular agents toward morality (Cohen 1996; Bratman 1998; Gibbard 1999, 149, 152–153; Fitzpatrick 2005; Setiya 2007; Bagnoli 2009c). Humean constructivists (Street 2008a; Velleman 2009, 2011) and some contractualists (Scanlon 2003b, 2009; Hill 2008) offer similar grounds for rejecting Kantian constructivism about practical reasons. They both deny that moral obligations can be derived from universal features of bare rationality and also deny that appeal to constitutive norms of rationality is sufficient to solve moral disputes.

The differences among these views can be illustrated by comparing their respective diagnoses of a fictional Caligula whose state of mind is completely coherent but who values torturing people for fun (Street 2010, 371). For realists, he is in error about some true moral value. There are some reasons—for example, the reason not to torture others for fun—that we have quite independently of our evaluative attitudes and practical reasoning. Kantians agree with realists that fictional Caligula has no good reasons for torturing anyone, but differ in explaining why this is so. Some Kantians think that fictional Caligula is incoherent, even though not obviously so. His incoherence can be shown by spelling out the norms that are constitutive of valuing. Such constitutive norms entail valuing humanity, and this shows that fictional Caligula is making a mistake by his own lights, even though he may never realize this due to poor reflection, ignorance of the non-normative facts or some other limitation (Korsgaard 1996a, 121–123). A more modest Kantian argument establishes that an internally coherent Caligula is conceivable, that is, he can be thought without contradiction, but it is incompatible with the peculiar conditions of moral sensibility (Engstrom 2009, 243, § III.7; Bagnoli 2009c; Engstrom 2011; Bagnoli 2011b). The modest argument agrees that fictional Caligula has no reasons to torture others. By contrast, Humean constructivists hold that an internally coherent Caligula is possible and that such a person has reasons for torturing others.

While Kantian constitutivism faces objections peculiar to it because of its appeal to the value of humanity, other objections apply to all sorts of constitutivism. Critics object that the very idea of constitutive standards is paradoxical. Constitutive standards are supposed to be partly descriptive of the very activity that they have to assess; it thus is unclear whether and how they can be violated (Cohen 1996, 177; Lavin 2004; Kolodny 2005; FitzPatrick 2005). For an agent to be correctly said to have norms, she must be able to break those norms. But if those norms are constitutive of reasoning, it is unclear how one can break them by reasoning. If constitutive norms cannot be violated, constitutivism implausibly implies that only perfect agents can exist, and thus immoralism and irrationality are impossible. In her most recent works, Korsgaard replies that to count as acting at all, we must at least be trying to follow the principles of practical reason, but she allows that we may fail to do so adequately or fully (Korsgaard 2009, 45–49; Korsgaard 2009, 159–176; cf. Barandalla and Ridge 2010).

The constitutivist strategy partly depends on the claim that agency is inescapable, since we cannot but act. Some critics object that agency (on the constitutivist construal) is as optional as any other activity (Enoch 2006, 2011b). In reply to this objection, constitutivists argue that agency is unlike any other activity. It is possible to reflect on ordinary activities while disengaging from them. By contrast, agency continues to operate even when the agent is considering whether she is justified in engaging in activity (Ferrero 2009; Velleman 2009). In this sense, agency is not optional.

These debates show that constructivism faces serious challenges, but also that it has been successful at least in making new places for reflection in metaethics.


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I would like to thank Robert Audi, Annalisa Coliva, Bradford Cokelet, Luca Ferrero, Richard Galvin, Christine M. Korsgaard, Mark Lebar, Elijah Millgram, Andrews Reath, Henry Richardson, Michael Ridge, and Robert Stern. My deepest gratitude to David Copp and Connie Rosati for their invaluable comments on many earlier drafts.