Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


First published Wed Jan 10, 2001; substantive revision Tue Sep 11, 2012

Constitutionalism is the idea, often associated with the political theories of John Locke and the founders of the American republic, that government can and should be legally limited in its powers, and that its authority or legitimacy depends on its observing these limitations. This idea brings with it a host of vexing questions of interest not only to legal scholars, but to anyone keen to explore the legal and philosophical foundations of the state. How can a government be legally limited if law is the creation of government? Does this mean that a government can be ‘self-limiting’? Is this even possible? If not, then is there some way of avoiding this implication? If meaningful limitation is indeed to be possible, perhaps constitutional constraints must somehow be ‘entrenched’, that is, resistant to change or removal by those whose powers are constrained? Perhaps they must not only be entrenched, but enshrined in written rules. If so, how are these rules to be interpreted? In terms of their original, public meaning or the intentions of their authors, or in terms of the, possibly ever-changing, values and principles they express? How, in the end, one answers these questions depends crucially on how one conceives the nature, identity and authority of constitutions. Does a constitution establish a stable framework for the exercise of public power which is in some way fixed by factors like original public meaning or authorial intentions? Or is it a living entity which grows and develops in tandem with changing political values and principles? These and other such questions are explored below.

1. Constitutionalism: a Minimal and a Rich Sense

In some minimal sense of the term, a constitution consists of a set of norms (rules, principles or values) creating, structuring, and possibly defining the limits of, government power or authority. Understood in this way, all states have constitutions and all states are constitutional states. Anything recognizable as a state must have some acknowledged means of constituting and specifying the limits (or lack thereof) placed upon the three basic forms of government power: legislative power (making new laws), executive power (implementing laws) and judicial power (adjudicating disputes under laws).[1] Take the extreme case of an absolute monarch, Rex, who combines unlimited power in all three domains. Suppose it is widely acknowledged that Rex has these powers, as well as the authority to exercise them at his pleasure. The constitution of this state might then be said to contain only one rule, which grants unlimited power to Rex. He is not legally answerable for the wisdom or morality of his decrees, nor is he bound by procedures, or any other kinds of limitations or requirements, in exercising his powers. Whatever Rex decrees is constitutionally valid.

When scholars talk of constitutionalism, however, they normally mean something that rules out Rex's case. They mean not only that there are norms creating legislative, executive and judicial powers, but that these norms impose significant limits on those powers.[2] Often these limitations are in the form of civil rights against government, rights to things like free expression, association, equality and due process of law. But constitutional limits come in a variety of forms. They can concern such things as the scope of authority (e.g., in a federal system, provincial or state governments may have authority over health care and education while the federal government's jurisdiction extends to national defence and transportation); the mechanisms used in exercising the relevant power (e.g., procedural requirements governing the form and manner of legislation); and of course civil rights (e.g., in a Charter or Bill of Rights). Constitutionalism in this richer sense of the term is the idea that government can/should be limited in its powers and that its authority depends on its observing these limitations. In this richer sense of the term, Rex's society has not embraced constitutionalism because the rules defining his authority impose no constitutional limits. Compare a second state in which Regina has all the powers possessed by Rex except that she lacks authority to legislate on matters concerning religion. Suppose further that Regina also lacks authority to implement, or to adjudicate on the basis of, any law which exceeds the scope of her legislative competence. We have here the seeds of constitutionalism as that notion has come to be understood in Western legal thought.

In discussing the history and nature of constitutionalism, a comparison is often drawn between Thomas Hobbes and John Locke who are thought to have defended, respectively, the notion of constitutionally unlimited sovereignty (e.g., Rex) versus that of sovereignty limited by the terms of a social contract containing substantive limitations (e.g., Regina).[3] But an equally good focal point is the English legal theorist John Austin who, like Hobbes, thought that the very notion of limited sovereignty is incoherent. For Austin, all law is the command of a sovereign person or body of persons, and so the notion that the sovereign could be limited by law requires a sovereign who is self-binding, who commands him/her/itself. But no one can command himself, except in some figurative sense, so the notion of limited sovereignty is, for Austin (and Hobbes), as incoherent as the idea of a square circle.[4] Though this feature of Austin's theory has some surface plausibility when applied to the British system of government, where Parliament is sometimes said to be supreme and constitutionally unlimited,[5] it faces obvious difficulty when applied to most other constitutional democracies such as one finds in the United States and Germany, where it is abundantly clear that the powers of government are legally limited by a constitution. Austin's answer to this apparent weakness in his theory was to appeal to popular sovereignty, the idea that sovereignty resides in ‘the people’, that is, the population at large. Government bodies—e.g., Parliament or the judiciary—can be limited by constitutional law, but the sovereign people remain unlimited in their powers to command. Whether this appeal to popular sovereignty provides Austin with an adequate means of dealing with constitutional democracies is highly questionable. For Austin's sovereign is supposed to be a determinate individual or group of individuals whose commands to the bulk of the population constitute law. But if we identify the commanders with the people themselves, then we seem inexorably led to the paradoxical result identified by H.L.A. Hart—the commanders are commanding the commanders. In short, we lapse into incoherence (Hart 1994, 73–78; Austin 1995, Lecture VI).

2. Sovereign versus Government

Though there are serious difficulties inherent in Austin's attempt to make sense of the people's sovereignty, his account does reveal the need to distinguish between two different concepts: sovereignty and government. Roughly speaking, we might define sovereignty as the possession of supreme (and possibly unlimited) normative power and authority over some domain, and government as those persons or institutions through whom that sovereignty is exercised. Once some such distinction is drawn, we see immediately that sovereignty might lie somewhere other than with the government. And once this implication is accepted, we can coherently go on to speak of limited government coupled with unlimited sovereignty. Arguably this is what one should say about constitutional democracies where the people's sovereign authority is thought to be ultimate and unlimited but the government bodies—e.g., legislatures and courts—through whom that sovereignty is exercised on the people's behalf is constitutionally limited and subordinate. As Locke might have said, unlimited sovereignty remains with the people who have the normative power to void the authority of their government (or some part thereof) if it exceeds its constitutional limitations.

Though sovereignty and government are different notions, and normally apply to different entities, it nevertheless seems conceptually possible for them to apply to one and the same individual or institution. It is arguable that Hobbes insisted on the identification of sovereign and government insofar as he seemed to require a (virtually) complete transfer of all rights and powers from sovereign individuals to a political sovereign whose authority was to be absolute, thus rendering it possible to emerge from the wretched state of nature in which life is “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish and short.”[6] In Hobbes' theory, ultimate, unlimited sovereignty must reside in the supreme governmental person or body who enjoys unlimited power and authority to rule the commonwealth. Anything less than such an ultimate, unlimited sovereign would, given human nature and the world we inhabit, destroy the very possibility of stable government. So even if ‘sovereignty’ and ‘government’ express different notions, this neither means nor implies that the two could not pertain to one and the same entity.

3. Entrenchment

According to most theorists, another important feature of constitutionalism is that the norms imposing limits upon government power must be in some way be entrenched, either by law or by way of constitutional convention.[7] In other words, those whose powers are constitutionally limited—i.e., the institutions of government—must not be legally entitled to change or expunge those limits at their pleasure. Most written constitutions contain amending formulae which can be triggered by, and require the participation of, the government bodies whose powers they limit. But these formulae invariably require something more than a simple decision on the part of the present government to invoke a change. Sometimes constitutional assemblies are required, or super-majority votes, referendums, or the agreement of not only the central government in a federal system but also some number or percentage of the governments or regional units within the federal system.[8] Entrenchment not only facilitates a degree of stability over time (a characteristic aspiration of constitutional regimes), it is arguably a requirement of the very possibility of constitutionally limited government. Were a government institution entitled, at its pleasure, to change the very terms of its constitutional limitations, we might begin to question whether there would, in reality, be any such limitations. Consider Regina once again. Were she entitled, at her discretion, to remove (and perhaps later reinstate) the constitutional restriction preventing her from legislating on religious matters, then it is perhaps questionable whether Regina could sensibly be said to be bound by this requirement.[9] On the other hand, were there a constitutional rule or convention specifying that Regina is entitled to remove this restriction only if she succeeds in convincing two thirds of her subjects to vote for the change, then one might feel more comfortable speaking of constitutional limitation. Of course this constitutional meta-rule or convention is itself subject to change or elimination—a fact that raises a host of further puzzles. For example, does such an act require application of the very rule in question—i.e., two third's majority vote—or are the sovereign people of Regina's society at liberty to change or expunge it at their pleasure? If we accept the distinction between government and sovereignty urged above, as well as the proposition that sovereignty cannot be self-limiting, (X cannot limit X) then we might be led to conclude that the constitutional meta-rule—and hence the constitutional regime of which it is an integral part—both exist at the pleasure of the general population. Entrenchment may be an essential element of constitutional regimes, but it is far from clear that constitutions can be entrenched against the actions of a sovereign people.

4. Writtenness

Some scholars believe that constitutional norms do not exist unless they are in some way enshrined in a written document (e.g., Rubenfeld 1998). But most accept that constitutions (or elements of them) can be unwritten, and cite, as an obvious example of this possibility, the constitution of the United Kingdom. One must be careful here, however. Though the UK has nothing resembling the American Constitution and its Bill of Rights, it nevertheless contains a number of written instruments which have, for many centuries, formed central elements of its constitution. Magna Carta (1215 C.E.) is perhaps the earliest document of the British constitution, while others include The Petition of Right (1628) and the Bill of Rights (1689). Furthermore, constitutional limits are also said to be found in certain principles of the common law, explicitly cited in landmark cases concerning the limits of government power. The fact remains, however, that historically the constitution of the UK has largely taken unwritten form, suggesting strongly that writtenness is not a defining feature of constitutionalism.

Why, despite the existence of seemingly obvious counter-examples, might someone be led to think that constitutional norms must be written rules, as opposed to more informal conventions or social rules? One possible reason[10] is that unwritten rules and conventions are sometimes less precise and therefore more open to interpretation, gradual change, and ultimately avoidance, than written ones. If this were true, then one might question whether an unwritten rule could, at least as a practical matter, serve adequately to limit government power. But there is no reason to accept this line of argument. Long standing social rules and conventions are often clear and precise, as well as more rigid and entrenched than written ones, if only because their elimination, alteration or re-interpretation typically requires widespread changes in traditional attitudes, beliefs and behaviour. And these can be very difficult to bring about.

5. Montesquieu and the Separation of Powers

Does the idea of constitutionalism require, as a matter of conceptual or practical necessity, the division of government powers urged by Montesquieu and celebrated by Americans as a bulwark against abuse of state power? In Regina's case, there is no such separation: legislative, executive and judicial power all reside in her person. But how, it might be asked, can she be the one (qua judge) who determines whether her legislation satisfies the prescribed constitutional limitation? Even if, in theory, Regina's constitution prohibits her from removing her constitutional restriction at will (because she must observe the 2/3rds meta-rule) can she not always choose to ignore her restrictions, or to interpret them so as to escape their binding force? Perhaps Bishop Hoadly was right when he said (1717) in a sermon before the English King: “Whoever hath an ultimate authority to interpret any written or spoken laws, it is he who is truly the Law-giver to all intents and purposes, and not the person who first wrote or spoke them.” (quoted in Gray 1986, p.12). Although some constitutional limits, e.g., the one which restricts the Mexican President to a single term of office, seldom raise questions of interpretation, many others (particularly those that concern civil rights) are ripe for such questions. Regina might argue that a decree requiring all shops to close on Sundays (the common Sabbath) does not concern a religious matter because its aim is a common day of rest, not religious observance. Others might argue, with seemingly equal plausibility, that it does concern a religious matter and therefore lies outside Regina's legislative competence.

That constitutions often raise such interpretive questions gives rise to an important question: Does the possibility of constitutional limitation on legislative and executive power require, as a matter of practical politics, that the judicial power by which such limitations are interpreted and enforced reside in some individual or group of individuals distinct from that in which these legislative and executive powers are vested? In modern terms, must constitutional limits on a legislative body like Parliament, the Duma or Congress, or an executive body like the President or her Cabinet, be subject to interpretation and enforcement by an independent judiciary? Marbury v Madison settled this question in the affirmative as a matter of American law, and most nations follow Marbury (and Montesquieu) in accepting the practical necessity of some such arrangement. But it is not clear that the arrangement truly is practically necessary, let alone conceptually so. Bishop Hoadly notwithstanding, there is nothing nonsensical in the suggestion that X might be bound by an entrenched rule, R, whose interpretation and implementation is left to X. This is, arguably, the situation in New Zealand where the courts are forbidden from striking down legislation on the ground that it exceeds constitutional limits. Observance and enforcement of these limits are left to the legislative bodies whose powers are nonetheless recognized as constitutionally limited (and subject to whatever pressures might be imposed politically when state actions are generally believed to violate the constitution). It is important to realize that what rule, R, actually requires is not necessarily identical with what X believes or says that it requires. Nor is it identical with whatever restrictions X actually observes in practice. This is so even when there is no superior institution with the power and authority to enforce compliance or to correct X's judgment when it is, or appears to be, wrong.

That constitutional limits can sometimes be avoided or interpreted so as to avoid their effects, and no recourse be available to correct mistaken interpretations and abuses of power, does not, then, imply the absence of constitutional limitation. But does it imply the absence of effective limitation? Perhaps so, but even here there is reason to be cautious in drawing general conclusions. Once again, we should remember the long-standing traditions within British Parliamentary systems (including New Zealand's) according to which Parliament alone possesses final authority to create, interpret and implement its own constitutional limits. And whatever its faults, there is little doubt that Parliaments modeled on the British system typically act responsibly in observing their own constitutional limits.

6. Constitutional Law versus Constitutional Convention

The idea of constitutionalism requires limitation on government power and authority established by constitutional law. But according to most constitutional scholars, there is more to a constitution than constitutional law. Many people will find this suggestion puzzling, believing their constitution to be nothing more (and nothing less) than (usually) a formal, written document, possibly adopted at a special constitutional assembly, which contains the nation's supreme, fundamental law. But there is a long-standing tradition of conceiving of constitutions as containing much more than constitutional law. Dicey is famous for proposing that, in addition to constitutional law, the British constitutional system contains a number of constitutional conventions which effectively limit government in the absence of legal limitation. These are, in effect, social rules arising within the practices of the political community and which impose important, but non-legal, limits on government powers. An example of a British constitutional convention is the rule that the Queen may not refuse Royal Assent to any bill passed by both Houses of the UK Parliament. Perhaps another example lies in a convention that individuals chosen to represent the State of Florida in the American Electoral College (the body which actually chooses the American President by majority vote) must vote for the Presidential candidate for whom a plurality of Floridians voted on election night. Owing to the fact that they are political conventions, unenforceable in courts of law, constitutional conventions are said to be distinguishable from constitutional laws, which can indeed be legally enforced. If we accept Dicey's distinction, we must not identify the constitution with constitutional law. It includes constitutional conventions as well. We must further recognize the possibility that a government, though legally within its power to embark upon a particular course of action, might nevertheless be constitutionally prohibited from doing so.[11] It is possible that, as a matter of law, Regina might enjoy unlimited legislative, executive and judicial powers which are nonetheless limited by constitutional conventions specifying how those powers are to be exercised. Should she violate one of these conventions, she would be acting legally, but unconstitutionally, and her subjects might well feel warranted in condemning her actions, perhaps even removing her from office—a puzzling result only if one thinks that all there is to a constitution is constitutional law.

7. Constitutional Interpretation

As we have just seen, there is often more to a constitution than constitutional law. As we have also seen, constitutional norms need not always be written rules. Despite these important observations, two facts must be acknowledged: (1) the vast majority of constitutional cases hinge on questions of constitutional law; and (2) modern constitutions consist primarily of written documents.[12] Consequently, constitutional cases often raise theoretical issues concerning the proper approach to the interpretation of written instruments—colored, of course, by the special role constitutions play in defining and limiting the authority and powers of government. Differences of view on these matters come to light most forcefully when a case turns on the interpretation of a constitutional provision that deals with abstract civil rights (e.g., the right to due process of law, or to equality).[13] How such provisions are to be interpreted has been subject to intense controversy among legal practitioners and theorists. As we shall see, stark differences of opinion on this issue are usually rooted in different views on the aspirations of constitutions or on the appropriate role of judges within constitutional democracies.

Theories of constitutional interpretation come in a variety of forms, but they all seem, in one way or another, to ascribe importance to a number of key factors: textual or semantic meaning; political, social and legal history; intention; original understanding; and moral/political theory. The roles played by each of these factors in a theory of constitutional interpretation depend crucially on how the theorist conceives of a constitution and its role in limiting government power. Simplifying somewhat, there are two main rival views on this question. On the one side, we find theorists who view a constitution as foundational law whose principal point is to fix a long-standing framework within which legislative, executive and judicial powers are to be exercised by the various branches of government. Such theorists will tend towards interpretative theories which accord pride of place to factors like the intentions of those who created the constitution, or the original public understandings of the words chosen for inclusion in the constitution. On such a fixed view of constitutions, it is natural to think that factors like these should govern whenever they are clear and consistent. And the reason is quite straight forward. From this perspective, a constitution not only aspires to establish a framework within which government powers are to exercised, it aspires to establish one which is above, or removed from, the deep disagreements and partisan controversies encountered in ordinary, day to day law and politics. It aspires, in short, to be both stable and morally and politically neutral. To be clear, in saying that a constitution aspires, on a fixed view, to be morally and politically neutral, I in no way mean to deny that those who take this stance believe that it expresses a particular political vision or a set of fundamental commitments to certain values and principles of political morality. Quite the contrary. All constitutional theorists will agree that constitutions typically enshrine, indeed entrench, a range of moral and political commitments to values like democracy, equality, free expression, and the rule of law. But two points need to be stressed. First, fixed views attempt to transform questions about the moral and political soundness of these commitments into historical questions concerning beliefs about their soundness. The task is not to ask: What do we now think about values like equality and freedom of expression? Rather, it is to ask: What did they—the authors of the constitution or those on whose authority they created the constitution—in fact think about those values? What was their original understanding of them? So stability and neutrality are, on fixed views, served to the extent that a constitution is capable of transforming questions of political morality into historical ones. Second, no proponent of the fixed view will deny that the abstract moral commitments expressed in a constitution tend to be widely, if not universally shared among members of the relevant political community. In that sense, then, the constitution, despite its moral content, is neutral as between citizens and their many partisan differences. Not everyone in a modern, constitutional democracy like the US or Germany agrees on the extent to which the right to free expression demands the liberty to view pornographic images on the internet. But virtually no one would deny the vital importance of expressive freedom in a truly free and democratic society. On fixed views, then, constitutions can be seen as analogous to the ground rules of a debating society. Each sets the mutually agreed, stable framework within which controversial debate (and action) is to take place. And just as a debating society could not function if its ground rules were constantly open to debate and revision at point of application, a constitution could not serve its role if its terms were constantly open to debate and revision by participants within the political and legal processes it aspires to govern. We avoid this result, according to those whose espoused the fixed view, to the extent that we are able to replace controversial moral and political questions with historical questions about the intentions of constitutional authors in creating what they did, or about how the language they chose to express a constitutional requirement was publicly understood at the time it was chosen.

To sum up: the desire for stability and neutrality leads modern proponents of the fixed view to view constitutional interpretation as an exercise which, when undertaken properly, focuses on authors' intentions or on original understandings of the meaning and import of the words chosen to express agreed limits on government power and authority. Only if interpreters restrict themselves to such factors, and do not attempt to insert their own contentious views under the guise of ‘interpretation’, can the role of a constitution be secured. Only then can it serve as the politically neutral, stable framework its nature demands. Theorists who espouse this particular view of constitutional interpretation are generally called ‘originalists’.

Not all constitutional theorists believe that the sole or overriding role of a constitution is to set a stable, neutral framework for the rough and tumble of partisan law and politics. Nor do all theorists believe that constitutional interpretation consists of an attempt to ascertain original understandings or authorial intentions. On the contrary, many constitutional scholars embrace living constitutionalism, an approach that sees a constitution as an evolving, living entity which, by its very nature, is capable of responding to changing social circumstances and new (and it is hoped better) moral and political beliefs. Along with this very different view of constitutions come very different theories regarding the nature and limits of legitimate constitutional interpretation. One strand within living constitutionalism, upon which we will be focus below, stresses the extent to which constitutional interpretation resembles the kind of reasoning that takes place in other areas of the law pertaining to common law legal systems, such as the law of contracts and torts. Just as the law of contributory negligence emerged and evolved in common law countries in a case-by-case, incremental manner, over many decades and as the product of many decisions, the law of equal protection, free expression, due process and the like has evolved in modern western democracies as constitutional cases have been decided over the years.

Disputes between originalists and living constitutionalists are among the liveliest and most contentious to have arisen in constitutional scholarship over the last several decades. Debates have tended to focus on abstract civil rights provisions of constitutions, such as the due process clause of the American Constitution, or Section 7 of the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms, which “guarantees the right to life, liberty and security of the person and the right not to be deprived thereof except in accordance with the principles of fundamental justice.”[14] Given the fixed view to which they are committed, contemporary originalists view anything more than an attempt to discover, so as to preserve and apply, original understandings of such provisions as constitutional revision or construction, often masquerading as the interpretation of an unchanged original.[15] On the other side, we find the living constitutionalists who view originalism as a reactionary theory serving only to tie a democratic community to the ‘dead hand of the past.’ Originalists, their opponents claim, render us incapable of responding rationally and responsibly to changing social circumstances and improved moral views concerning the requirements of the abstract values and principles articulated in modern constitutions. Living constitutionalists, the originalist counters, recommend constitutional practices that threaten a number of cherished values, among them the rule of law and the separation of powers. In effect, they are happy to place the constitution in the hands of contemporary judges who are licensed, under the guise of interpreting it, to change the constitution to suit their own political inclinations and moral preferences. And this, originalists claim, only serves to thwart cherished values secured by having a stable, politically neutral constitution, and may render all talk of genuine constitutional constraint meaningless.

8. Originalism

Originalism[16] comes in a wide variety of forms (Bork 1990; Scalia 1997; Whittington 1999b; Barnett 2004; Solum 2008). An originalist might claim that her view follows necessarily from a more general theory of interpretation: to interpret is necessarily to retrieve something that existed at the time of authorship—an original object. Another might be happy to acknowledge that interpretation could, theoretically, take the form of an innovative or creative interpretation that evaluates or in some way changes an original, as might be the case with a revolutionary interpretation of a play or work of art. But such a theorist might go on to add that, for reasons of political morality having to do with, e.g., the principles of democracy, the rule of law, and values underlying the separation of powers, such innovative interpretations ought never be pursued by constitutional interpreters. The object of constitutional interpretation should, to the greatest extent possible, remain fixed by factors like original public understandings or authorial intentions. Yet another originalist might be content to leave a little leeway here, suggesting something like the following: though there is a presumption, perhaps a very heavy one, in favor of interpretation as retrieval of an original, it is one which can, on very rare occasions, be overcome. For example, this originalist might say that the presumption in favor of retrieval can be defeated when there is a discernible and profound sea change in popular views on some important issue of political morality implicated by an abstract constitutional provision. This was arguably the case in the United States with respect to slavery and equal protection. Presumably ‘equal protection’ was originally understood, both by the authors of the 14th Amendment and by the people on whose behalf they acted, as fully consistent with segregation. This concrete understanding of equal protection is now, of course, widely condemned. Its wholesale rejection served as the main inspiration behind Brown v. Board of Education, whose innovative interpretation of the equal protection clause in effect changed or replaced the original understanding of the notion.[17] Yet another concession, in this case one that seems embraced by all originalists, concerns the force and effect of authoritative court interpretations of the constitution. Many originalists believe that Roe v. Wade[18] rested on a mistaken interpretation of the United States Constitution, one that flew in the face of original understandings and intentions; but virtually no originalist will go so far as to deny that any contemporary interpretation of the First, Fourth, Fifth, Ninth and Fourteenth Amendments is justified only if it can be reconciled with that decision. In other words, virtually all originalists agree that established precedent can sometimes trump original understanding. Whether this apparent concession is in the end consistent with the spirit of originalism is, perhaps, questionable. Such “faint-hearted originalism” (Scalia 1989) may reduce, in the end, to a form of living constitutionalism.[19] Indeed, as we shall see in the next section, the role of judicial interpretations of abstract constitutional provisions is central to that prominent form of living constitutionalism which views constitutional interpretation as a form of common-law reasoning.

Another way in which originalists split is over the identity of the original object of interpretation. One originalist might focus on the retrieval of original understandings, while another might wish interpreters to zero in on the original intentions of the relevant constitutional authors. But one must be careful here. Original public understanding is likely to matter to this second originalist because the primary means of conveying one's intentions in the context of legal enactment are the words chosen to express one's intentions. And those words cannot convey one's intentions unless some standard meaning or common understanding is assumed, a standard public meaning to which both authors and readers have access and in terms of which the latter can, and are expected to, grasp the former's intentions. But that meaning or understanding cannot be anything other than the original one because authors do not have crystal balls and therefore have no access to future understandings. So original intention theorists will have interpreters pay considerable attention to original public understanding. Corresponding things will be true of an originalist whose principal focus is original understanding: she need not dismiss entirely the relevance of original intentions, at least in some cases. Should it turn out, for instance, that original public understanding leads to unforeseen applications or results that we have good historical evidence to believe the authors did not intend, or would have flatly rejected had they known what we now know, an originalist might allow such actual or hypothetical intentions to override original understanding.

Among the ways in which one might be able to determine that constitutional authors did not intend, or would not have wished to endorse, a particular concrete application or result suggested by the original understanding of a constitutional provision is by appeal to the general goals or purposes we have reason to believe they intended to achieve in enacting what they did. Sometimes these goals and purposes, often called further intentions, are explicitly expressed in the preamble to a constitution, as is often true in the case of ordinary statutes. But such statements of purpose in constitutions tend to be very broad and highly abstract and are therefore of very limited use in dealing with the more specific questions that arise under particular constitutional provisions.[20] So appeal is sometimes made to official (and nonofficial) debates and discussions surrounding the drafting, adoption or ratification of the constitution or of the particular provision in question. Sometimes appeal is even made to widely shared beliefs at the time on the relevant issue. It's quite likely that hanging, for example, was widely held in eighteenth-century America to be a quick and relatively humane form of execution. Thus one might have very good historical reason to believe that it could not have been among the intentions of the Eighth Amendment's drafters to ban such a practice. An originalist interpretation of that Amendment might draw support from this fact in an argument purporting to demonstrate the constitutional validity of hanging.

But perhaps things are not quite this simple. Suppose we agreed that the goal of the Eighth Amendment's authors was to ban cruel and unusual punishments, and that they, along with virtually every other American of the day, believed that hanging did not fall within the extension of that phrase. In other words, what we might call their concrete understanding of the abstract notion ‘cruel and unusual punishment’, was such as to permit the use of hanging. If so, and if a contemporary interpreter believes that all forms of capital punishment, including hanging, is in actual fact cruel and unusual, then she might fashion an argument of the following sort, one which has, at least superficially, an originalist flavor. Respecting the general intentions of the authors—to ban cruel and unusual punishment—actually requires that hanging be deemed unconstitutional, even though the authors (and those on whose authority they acted) would have rejected this claim. The intentions of the authors of the Eighth Amendment might have been that government bodies observe an abstract, partly moral standard forbidding governments from acting in a manner properly characterizes as cruel and unusual. This was actually their purpose in framing the Eighth Amendment in the way that they did, as expressing this abstract principle as opposed to a more detailed provision listing the specific kinds of concrete practices they wished to forbid, that is, elaborating their concrete understanding of ‘cruel and unusual punishment’. Respecting their intentions, therefore, requires holding as unconstitutional whatever truly does come within the extension of the relevant provision, that is, whatever truly does constitute penal behaviour that is cruel and unusual. Imagine that one could bring an author of the Eighth Amendment to life and that one could convince him, via good empirical and moral argument, that capital punishment of all forms is in actual fact cruel and unusual. How might he respond to the claim that the only way to respect his intentions is to continue to accept, as constitutional, the practice of hanging? His likely response would be to say: “We meant to ban punishments that are cruel and unusual, not what I can now see we, along with everyone else, incorrectly understood that ban to entail. If we had wanted specifically to ban hanging, we would have said so explicitly.” Whether appeal to intentions in this way is enough to render one an originalist—if only a faint-hearted one—is perhaps questionable, however. Such an appeal may well transform the resultant theory of constitutional interpretation into something very close to a form of living constitutionalism.[21]

In any event, originalists can differ on the role, in constitutional interpretation, of goals and purposes, often referred to as further intentions. Some originalists might be prepared to allow some further intentions to override original concrete understandings in some cases, while others might reject the use of such intentions altogether. One reason for the latter's reluctance—and for the focus by most contemporary originalists on ordinary public meaning, as opposed to original intentions—is likely to be that the historical evidence concerning the existence and content of such intentions tends to be highly unreliable or inaccessible to later interpreters. One of the essential functions of law is the guidance of behavior. Yet one cannot be guided by a law unless one understands it, knows what it means. And if its meaning depends on factors about which there is great dispute, or which are largely inaccessible, as is more often than not true when it comes to the intentions of long-dead authors, then one cannot be guided by the law. Hence, rule-of-law arguments can be used to justify precluding (significant) appeal to authors' intentions (further or otherwise) in all but exceptional cases. A second reason for rejecting appeal to further intentions is the fact that there is an important difference between what a constitution actually says or means and what those who created it might have wanted or intended to achieve in creating it. Interpretation is an attempt to retrieve so as to conserve or enforce the former, not the latter.

Originalism, as a general family of theories which ties constitutional interpreters to original understandings and/or intentions, is subject to a number of objections. For example, original intentions and understandings are often very unclear, if not largely indeterminate, leaving the interpreter with the need to appeal to other factors.[22] Sometimes the only things upon which joint authors can agree are the words actually chosen. Yet another serious difficulty faced by originalism is one alluded to above: contemporary life is often very different from the life contemplated by those who lived at the time of the constitution's adoption. As a result, many concrete applications or results suggested by original intentions and understandings may now seem absurd or highly undesirable in light of new scientific and social developments and improved moral understanding. Furthermore, modern life includes countless situations that our predecessors could not possibly have contemplated, let alone intended or meant to be dealt with in a particular way. The right to free speech that found its way into many constitutions in the early modern period could not possibly have been understood (or intended) by its defenders to encompass, e.g., pornography on the internet.

In response to this latter difficulty, an originalist might appeal to what might be called hypothetical intent or understanding. The basic idea is that an interpreter should always consider, in cases involving new, unforeseen circumstances, the hypothetical question of what her predecessors would have intended or wanted to be done in the case at hand had they known what we now know to be true. We are, on this view, to put ourselves imaginatively in the shoes of those who went before us. We are to determine, perhaps in light of their general beliefs, values and intended goals and purposes, and perhaps by way of analogy with concrete applications we have reason to believe they clearly accepted at the time, what they would have wanted done in the new circumstances we now face. But this move is problematic. First, it presupposes that we can single out one, consistent set of purposes, values and concrete applications attributable to our predecessors. Yet people invariably have different things in mind even when they agree on a constitutional text. Second, even if we could single out an acceptable set of purposes, values and applications from which our hypothetical inquiry could proceed, it seems unlikely that there will always be a uniquely correct answer to the counterfactual question of what the authors would have wanted or intended to be done in light of these factors. If so, then it is likely that a modern interpreter will, in the end, have to be guided by his own moral views is selecting an answer to this counter-factual question. What the interpreter believes the authors would have decided may well end up being nothing over and above what he believes they should decide were they with us today. So we are left with the question of why we should speculate about what a long-dead group of individuals might have intended or wanted done were they apprised of what we now know. The main appeal of originalism is that it appears to tie constitutional interpretation to morally neutral, historical facts about actual beliefs, intentions and decisions of individuals with the legitimate authority to settle fundamental questions concerning the proper shape and limits of government powers. If we are now to consider, not what they did decide, believe or understand, but what they should decide were they to exist today and know what we now know, then the main appeal of originalism vanishes. And so the question naturally arises: Why not just forget this theoretically suspect, counterfactual exercise and make the decisions ourselves?

But if we are not to be tied in these ways to the so-called dead hand of the past when we engage in constitutional interpretation, how are we to proceed? The dominant alternative, living constitutionalism, takes its inspiration from the difficulties in originalism sketched in the preceding paragraphs. It does so by construing a constitution—or at least those parts of it that incorporate abstract principles[23]—as a living entity whose limitations are sometimes open to revisiting and revision in light of those changing times and (one hopes) improved moral/political understandings that tend to cause originalists so much trouble.

9. Living Constitutionalism

Whatever else might be said of law, this much is undeniably true: where law exists, our conduct is subject to various forms of restriction. But in many instances, the relevant restrictions can be removed or changed, as when a common-law precedent is overturned, or a statute repealed or amended because it no longer serves useful purposes. Not so with constitutions. As noted above, they tend to be heavily entrenched. They are also meant to be long lasting, so as to serve the values of securing continuity and stability in the basic framework within which the contentious affairs of law and politics are conducted. And, finally, modern constitutions tend to include very abstract, moral provisions limiting the powers of government bodies in significant ways. These special features of constitutions combine to give rise to a fundamental question, one that causes the originalist so much difficulty and to which living constitutionalism purports to provide a better answer: How can one group of people justifiably place entrenched constitutional impediments of a decidedly moral nature in the way of a second group of people who might live in radically different circumstances and perhaps with radically different moral views? How, in short, can one generation legitimately bind the moral choices of another? A satisfactory answer to this intergenerational problem, living constitutionalists contend, requires that we recognize that constitutions can grow and adapt to ever-changing circumstances without losing their identity or their legitimacy.

According to living constitutionalists, the meaning or content of an entrenched provision like section 3(1) of the German Basic Law, which proclaims that “All persons shall be equal before the law,” consists in the rights or principles of political morality they express, not what those rights or principles were generally understood to require at the time of enactment or were believed or intended to require by those who chose to include them in the constitution. The choice to employ abstract moral terms (e.g., ‘cruel and unusual punishment’) instead of more concrete, non-moral terms (e.g., ‘public hanging’ or ‘drawing and quartering’), is presumably made in recognition of at least four crucial facts: (1) it's important that governments not violate certain important rights of political morality; (2) constitutional authors do not always agree fully on what concretely is required in the many scenarios and cases in which those rights are, or will later be seen to be, relevant; (3) constitutional authors can anticipate neither the future nor the many scenarios and cases in which these important rights will be in some way relevant; and (4) even when they do agree on what those rights concretely require at the moment of adoption, and are comfortable binding themselves and their contemporaries to these concrete understandings, they are not particularly comfortable doing so in respect of future generations who will live in very different times and may think very differently. And so the decision is made to express constitutional commitments in very abstract terms—‘cruel and unusual punishment’ versus ‘drawing and quartering’—leaving it to later generations to substitute their possibly different concrete understandings for those of the authors or those who lived at the time of authorship. The result is that as concrete understandings of the entrenched constitutional-rights provisions evolve, the results warranted by these provisions can legitimately change right along with them. And importantly for the living constitutionalist who does not wish to surrender to the charge that she counsels infidelity to the constitution, these changes can occur without the constitution having changed, as would be true were a process of formal amendment successfully invoked and an abstract, rights provision removed from the constitution.

Despite its undoubted appeal, (at least to many) living constitutionalism is subject to a number of significant objections. Perhaps the most prominent ones are these: (a) the theory renders all talk of constitutional interpretation, properly understood as the retrieval of meaning, utterly senseless: constitutional interpretation becomes nothing more than unconstrained, constitutional creation or construction masquerading as interpretation; (b) living constitutionalism robs the constitution of its ability to serve its guidance function—how can individuals be guided by a constitution whose application to their conduct and choices will be determined by the unconstrained views of later so-called interpreters?; and (c) living constitutionalism violates the separation of powers doctrine—if the constitution and its limits become whatever contemporary interpreters take them to mean, and if those interpreters tend to be found almost exclusively in courts, then democratically unaccountable judges end up deciding what the proper limits of government power shall be, a task for which they are eminently unqualified and which ought to be reserved for individuals (e.g., the authors of the constitution) chosen to serve that function. Hence the appeal of originalism.

Living constitutionalists have a number of responses to these objections. For instance, it might be argued that the theory in no way results in the unconstrained, arbitrary exercise of judicial power its opponents often portray it to be. Living constitutionalists like Strauss (2010) and Waluchow (2007a) suggest that the ongoing interpretation of a constitution's abstract rights provisions is a process much like the process by which judges develop equally abstract, common-law notions like ‘negligence’ and ‘the reasonable use of force.’ According to Strauss, the U.S. constitutional system

has become a common law system, one in which precedent and past practices are, in their own way as important as the written U.S. Constitution itself…[I]t is not one that judges (or anyone else) can simply manipulate to fit their own ideas. (Strauss 2010, 3)

On this view, constitutional interpretation must accommodate itself to previous attempts to interpret and apply the abstract rights provisions expressed in the constitution's text. And just as the traditional rules of precedent combine respect for the (albeit limited) wisdom and authority of previous decision makers (legislative and judicial) with an awareness of the need to allow adaptation in the face of changing views, and new or unforeseen circumstances, so too must constitutional interpreters respect the wisdom and authority of previous interpreters, while allowing the constitution to adapt so as to respond to changing views, and new or unforeseen circumstances. Living constitutional interpretation, though flexible and adaptive, is no less constrained and disciplined than reasoning under common law.

Another response open to living constitutionalists is to deny that their theory of interpretation ignores the special role played by a constitution's text and its authors. The text plays a key role insofar as any constitutional interpretation, innovative as it may be, must be consistent with that text, until such time as it is formally changed via some acknowledged process of constitutional amendment. There is no reason to deny that original understandings of a constitution's abstract provisions can also be highly relevant to later interpretations. This is especially so for interpretations that occur shortly after the constitution's adoption, when worries about binding future generations is not in play. Original understandings simply cannot be dispositive, at least not in perpetuity. In the end, the relative importance of factors like textual meaning, original understandings, later interpretations, and intended purposes, may be, as Joseph Raz suggests (1996, 176–91), fundamentally a question of political morality which cannot be answered in the abstract and without considering what it is that justifies, at that particular moment of interpretation, having an entrenched constitution at all, let alone one with such and such particular content. Sometimes, retrieval of an existing concrete understanding will be required, especially when the constitution is in its infancy and was partly meant to settle a range of concrete moral questions as to the proper limits of government power, at least for a while. But if an interpreter has good reason to believe that this settlement function has been overtaken by other more pressing concerns, perhaps the need to adapt in light of dramatically changed circumstances or much better moral understanding, then a more innovative interpretation may be called for. And once again, to say that constitutional interpreters must sometimes be innovative is not to say that a constitution can be interpreted to mean whatever the interpreter wants it to mean.

10. Critical Theories

Although constitutionalism has been widely embraced round the world, it is by no means without its detractors. This is especially true when we turn to those constitutions that not only create and regulate the offices of government but also purport to protect abstract rights of political morality. Some critics—we'll call these the hard critics—assert that such apparently rights-protective constitutions cannot effectively and legitimately serve to protect individuals against the oppressive forces of governments.[24] On the contrary, they only serve to mask legal and political practice in a false cloak of legitimacy. Other critics—we'll call these the democratic critics—are not so utterly dismissive of rights-protecting constitutions. Rather, their main concern is to challenge the role that democratically unaccountable judges typically play in the interpretation and application of such constitutions.

According to hard critics, factors like original understandings and the supposed discipline of common law reasoning seldom, if ever, succeed in fixing meaningful limits upon government power. As a result, reliance on such factors in constitutional adjudication only serves: (a) to rationalize the purely political decisions of judges pursuing, consciously or not, their own political ideologies. Further consequences include: (b) a serious affront to democracy. Small groups of unelected, elitist judges end up substituting their own, highly contentious views about the proper limits of government power for the considered judgments of the people's representatives, e.g., those members of Congress or Parliament duly elected to exercise, on behalf of the people, the latter's sovereign right to participate in political decisions affecting their basic rights. And possibly (c): suppression of those—women, minority racial groups, the poor, and so on—whose interests are not adequately recognized and protected by the dominant, mainstream ideologies to which these elite judges have an affinity. Instead of the curbing of rights-threatening government power for which the idea of constitutionalism is supposed to stand, we have political suppression disguised in a cloak of false constitutional legitimacy.

So hard critics are highly skeptical of constitutional practice and of those theories that applaud constitutionalism as a bulwark against oppression.[25] As noted at the outset, a key element in the idea of constitutionalism is that government can/should be limited in its powers and that its authority depends on observance of those limits. We further noted that the authority of constitutions in liberal democracies is generally thought to rest with ‘the people’. One further implication of hard critical theories is: (d) that the concept of ‘the people’ is very much a fabrication. Instead of being composed of a group of individuals united in their concern for basic rights, western societies are comprised of various groups competing either for domination (e.g., white males and the wealthy) or for recognition and the elimination of oppression (e.g., the poor, women, and racial minorities). The law, including constitutional law, is a powerful tool which has, historically, been utilized by dominant groups to secure and maintain their superior status. As such, a constitution is anything but the protection from unwarranted government power that its champions have heralded over the centuries. What is taken to be the obvious meaning of a key term like ‘equal before the law’ is what the dominant group understands or claims it to be. What is taken to be the obvious original understandings or historical intentions of the constitution's authors are whatever understandings or intentions fit the ideologies of the dominant groups. What is taken to be the best articulation of the right to equality emerging from a fair and disciplined common-law analysis of that right, is nothing but a rationalization of current social structures, all of which systematically oppress the interests of women, minorities and the poor.

As noted above, democratic critics tend not to be as utterly dismissive of constitutions and constitutional rights protections as their more hard-line cousins. Their principal objections revolve around a practice with which these aspects of modern constitutional regimes are typically associated: judicial review. This is the general practice whereby courts are sometimes called upon to review a law or some other official act of government (e.g., the decision of an administrative agency like the US Food and Drug Administration or the Canadian Radio-television and Telecommunications Commission) to determine its compatibility with the constitution.[26] Particular instances of this practice vary considerably. In many jurisdictions, such as the United States, France and Canada, judicial review includes the power to ‘strike down’ or nullify a law duly passed by a legislature body or administrative body, while in other jurisdictions, powers of review are more limited. For example, United Kingdom courts do not have the power to invalidate Parliament's legislation, that is, declare it void and of no force and effect. But they do have the authority, under section 4 of the Human Rights Act 1998, officially to declare legislation incompatible with The European Convention on Human Rights. Upon such a declaration, Parliament usually undertakes to amend or repeal the offending legislation. But should it chose not to do so, the legislation remains valid and the courts have no further legal recourse.

Among the most influential of contemporary democratic critics is Jeremy Waldron. Waldron is, to put it mildly, no fan of judicial review. Nor is he enamored of the grandiose constitutional charters and bills of rights which serve as the most contentious ground in terms of which that power is often exercised by courts. According to Waldron and his fellow democratic critics, judicial review under a constitutional charter is fraught with both theoretical and practical difficulty. It threatens democracy and is both fundamentally unfair and politically dangerous. It also relies on outmoded views about the nature of moral rights—that there are objective, universal rights of political morality to which charters make reference, upon which there is widespread agreement within democratic communities, and to which judges can sensibly and justifiably be asked to appeal in protecting citizens against recalcitrant exercises of government power. While it is true that judicial review need not be based on an appeal to abstract rights of political morality—it could, for example, be restricted to questions such as whether an administrative agency has followed proper procedure—and true that it need not include the ability actually to strike down legislation, the main focus of democratic critics has been on forms of judicial review which exemplify these two features.

According to democratic critics it is difficult to underestimate the considerable power which judicial review under a constitutional charter of rights places in the hands of judges who are, in modern constitutional democracies, typically unelected and hence not directly accountable to the democratic community. Despite their lack of accountability, these judges are assigned the task of providing authoritative answers to the deeply controversial questions of political morality that arise under judicial review and with respect to which there is so much deep disagreement. On the basis of these highly controversial answers they end up determining what shall be deemed lawful in the community. This is far too much political power for a small group of unelected people to wield over an entire democratic community, no matter how learned and wise they might happen to be. But perhaps more importantly, the granting of such power is fundamentally undemocratic in principle: individual citizens have, in effect, been disenfranchised by this arrangement. Each citizen of voting age should have an equal right, in a democratic society, to contribute to the creation of the laws by which she is governed. This she exercises directly via the ballot box and by whatever contributions to public discourse and debate about controversial issues she chooses to make. She also does so indirectly via the legislative votes of her elected representatives, whose task is to represent her interests and opinions. Yet with judicial review all this has been replaced by subjection to the pronouncements of judges. The duly considered views of citizens and their representatives about the laws by which they are to be governed, arrived at (it is hoped) through fair processes of democratic decision-making, have, in effect, been set aside in favour of the contentious moral pronouncements of a handful of democratically unaccountable, elite judges. This unhappy situation is further exacerbated by the undeniable fact that judges on appeal courts often disagree vehemently among themselves about rights of political morality and must often, in the end, rely on majority voting to settle their own disagreements. It is not at all uncommon to see split votes when a court deals with a contentious issue of moral principle like affirmative action, abortion or pornography. And often these split votes follow patterns which are closely correlated with the all too discernible political leanings of judges.[27] Add to this the fact that judges render decisions which all too often appear to conflict not only with views widely shared in the community at large, but also with their own previous decisions in earlier cases, and what might seem like a marvelous idea in the abstract—constitutionally guaranteeing moral rights and fundamental interests against the abuse of government power—is transformed into a living nightmare. A nightmare in which democracy, fairness and the rule of law have, in effect, been abandoned and replaced by the rule of a few men and women, by a kind of ‘judicial oligarchy’. And no matter the high esteem in which we tend to hold our judges in modern constitutional democracies, this is not a form of government to be eagerly embraced.

Critical theories, both hard and democratic, represent a serious challenge not only to conventional theories and established practices of constitutional interpretation, but to the very idea of constitutionalism itself—the idea that government can and should be limited in ways that serve to protect us from unwarranted state power. According to originalism, the constitution protects us from judges and other officials by restricting them (largely) to politically and morally uncontroversial, neutral decisions about historical intentions and understandings. According to one strand of living constitutionalism, our evolving constitution can do the same while at the same time allowing the constitution to grow and adapt to changing circumstances and (it is hoped) better moral understandings. It can effect this balancing act so long as the judges, in whom the power of constitutional interpretation and enforcement has largely been placed, are willing to subject their deliberations to the discipline of common law reasoning. Critics, however, remain highly skeptical. Ordinary judges are not, critical theorists will insist, Platonic kings and queens, dispensing justice in the light of objective moral truth. We must always remember, critics insist, that our judges are ordinary, flawed human beings with all the intellectual and moral shortcomings, weaknesses and biases of their fellow human beings. They are also, more often than not, members of a dominant group (e.g., wealthy, white males) who share the social background, education, perspective, and values of that group. But if constitutions are all at the mercy of dominant ideologies and the whims and convictions of elite judges, then the kind of protections heralded by the idea of constitutionalism may be a myth, and a harmful one at that.

So what is the solution according to critical theorists? The proffered solutions can vary considerably, depending on how hard-line the theorist tends to be. A revolutionary communist might advocate the complete overthrow of constitutional, democratic government, while a liberal feminist critic might be content to work within existing constitutional systems to eradicate the vestiges of patriarchy which have survived recent feminist movements (Strossen 1995). Waldron and his fellow democratic critics ague that we should abandon the practice of judicial review of legislation under constitutional bills of rights and leave political decisions where they belong: the people and their elected and accountable representatives. But whatever the preferred solution, all critics of constitutionalism seem to agree that progress can be made only if the myths surrounding constitutional protection—the constraining force of original understanding, intention, history, the discipline of common law, and so on— are all exposed, and that the true political forces at work in constitutional practice are acknowledged and dealt with openly. Whether the idea of constitutionalism can survive the lessons of such critical scrutiny is a very good question.[28]


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