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Walter Burley

First published Sun Jul 11, 2004; substantive revision Tue Feb 22, 2011

Walter Burley, or Burleigh, (ca. 1275–1344) was one of the most prominent and influential philosophers of the fourteenth century. He had a very long career in both England and France, becoming Master of Arts at Oxford by 1301 and Master of Theology at Paris by 1324. He produced a large body of about fifty works, many of which were widely read in the later Middle Ages. Especially prominent were his last commentaries on the Ars Vetus and Physics, which were studied all over Europe and particularly at Italian universities during the latter half of the fourteenth and the whole of the fifteenth centuries. His semantic and ontological views evolved during his career in response to Ockham's acute criticism of traditional realism, moving from the moderate realism typical of thirteenth-century theologians such as Thomas Aquinas and Henry of Ghent to the extreme realism of his later writings, which posit the existence of extramental universals really distinct from individual things, extramental propositions as significates of true sentences, and real distinctions among the ten categories. According to Burley, all of this is necessary to preserve the validity of our knowledge of the external world, which he believed can be made evident without falling prey to Ockham's criticisms.

1. Life and works

1.1 Life

Burley was born in 1275, probably in or close to the village of Burley-in-Wharfedale, Yorkshire. He studied at Oxford University, where he was a fellow of Merton College, though he may have studied first at Balliol. His regency as Master of Arts at Merton College was long, from 1300 to 1310. Burley's clerical career began in 1309, when he was admitted as rector of Welbury, Yorkshire. Along with the income from his first rectory, he received permission to study and take holy orders at Paris, where he became associated with Thomas Wylton, whom he refers to as his socius and reverend master in his De comparatione specierum (On the Comparison of Species). He held a quodlibetal disputation at Toulose in 1322, became Master of Theology at Paris in 1324, and entered the service of Edward III in 1327. Around 1333, he joined the circle of Richard de Bury, Bishop of Durham. In 1341, he held a quodlibetal disputation in Bologna. He died in 1344 or shortly thereafter.

1.2 Works

Burley's philosophical and theological production is very impressive. Unfortunately, his Parisian commentary on the Sentences has not survived, but almost all of his works on logic and philosophy are extant, among which the following can be listed, along with their approximate dates of composition (if known):

2. Preliminary Remarks

Burley's views are especially interesting for the historians of logic and metaphysics because of their originality, wide influence, and development. Twice during the course of his academic career, in the first and third decades of the fourteenth century, Burley worked out slightly different versions of the same semantic theory in connection with two different conceptions of reality. The first version (elaborated in De sup., QP, the middle commentaries on Aristotle's Categories and De interpretatione, and Ean) is somewhat less sophisticated than the second (elaborated in De puritate artis logicae, tractatus longior, the last commentaries on the Physics and Ars Vetus, and theTdU). Whereas in his early works Burley was able to differentiate the intension of an expression (the universal form) from its extension (the individuals instantiating that universal form), in his last commentary on the Ars Vetus he distinguishes between sense (the mental universal existing in the mind as an object of understanding) and reference (significatum) of an expression, which in turn is divided into its intension (the universal) and extension (the individuals).

Nevertheless, the three main principles of his semantic theory remained the same throughout his academic career:

  1. An abstract term, such as ‘humanity’ (‘humanitas’) or ‘whiteness’ (‘albedo’), signifies a common form, which is part of the essential nature of numerous individuals, and which has the same kind of existence (extramental or mental) as these individuals.
  2. Concrete accidental terms do not signify simple objects, but aggregates composed of a substance and accidental form.
  3. A sentence is true if and only if it is the sign of “the truth of things” (veritas rerum), that is, if it describes how the things are in the world.

But in developing the ontology behind his first semantic system, Burley did not subscribe to the same theses that eventually came to characterize his radically realist ontology, but different ones, consistent with the canons of the moderate realism:

  1. Only absolute categories (substance, quantity, and quality) are real things; the other categories are said to be “real aspects” (respectus reales) of the absolute categories
  2. Universals have being in individuals, as constitutive parts of their essence
  3. Real propositions (propositiones in re) properly exist in our mind “objectively” (obiective), that is, as objects of its act of judgment

On the other hand, Burley's approach to the matter does not differ from the one he took in his late maturity. It can be defined as analytical, since he believes that ontologies must be developed in relation to the resolution of semantic problems, and that a philosophical explanation of reality must be preceded by a semantic explanation of the structure and function of our language, even if we can only give meaning to linguistic expressions by correlating the expressions of our language with objects in the world.

Burley's change of mind about universals was brought about by Ockham's critique of the traditional realist conception, which demonstrated that the common moderate realist account of the relation between language and the world is inconsistent. There is no sign in Burley's works prior to 1324 that he regarded Ockham as an opponent, but beginning with the prologue to his final commentary on the Physics (a work presumably rewritten in response to Ockham's criticisms), his main writings on logic and metaphysics always feature an analysis of Ockham's views together with a serious attempt to refute his arguments.

What Ockham had argued was that the common realist account of the relation between universals and particulars is inconsistent with the standard definition of identity, and also that particular substances and qualities have only an extramental kind of existence, whereas the ten Aristotelian categories serve to classify mental, written and spoken terms, but not things outside the mind. Two facts prove clearly that Burley changed his mind because of his having come into contact with Ockham. First, the problem of universals is not even mentioned in his first commentary on the Physics (before 1316), but receives extensive treatment in the prologue of his second commentary on the Physics, where he quotes, analyses, and rejects arguments advanced by the Venerabilis Inceptor. Second, Burley's final commentaries on the Physics, Ars Vetus, and the TdU contain critiques of Ockham's views on universals, truth, and categories, as well as replies to his arguments against the standard moderate realist doctrine.

The result was a new theory of reality based on the following theses:

  1. Universals and particulars are really distinct (EPhys, prol., fol. 9rb; EP, ch. de substantia, passim; EPh, ch. de oppositione enuntiationum, fol. 74rb-va; TdU, pp. 14-40);
  2. The external world contains real propositions that are the significata of true sentences (EP, prooem., fols. 17vb-18va; ch. de priori, fol. 47va; EPh, prol., fol. 66ra-b);
  3. The categories are really distinct from each other (EP, ch. de sufficientia praedicamentorum, fol. 21ra-b).

In fact, Burley seems to believe that Duns Scotus's strategy of drawing formal distinctions does not work, since it implies a a rejection of the standard definition of identity according to which two things are identical if and only if whatever is predicated of one is also predicated of the other (EP, ch. de oppositione, fol. 44rb; TdU, p. 22).

This suggests a kind of identification of logic and metaphysics, especially since Burley wanted logic to be the theory of discourse on Being. Logic must be metaphysically grounded in the correspondence between the structural features of discourse (both between the subject and predicate of a proposition, as well as between the premises and conclusion of a syllogism) and the structure of reality. Burley maintains that logic is nothing but an analysis of the general structures of reality. In discussing the nature, status, and subject of logic in the introduction to his final commentary on the Ars Vetus (fol. 2rb-va), he claims that logic is about things of second intention as such, second intentions being those concepts of things (conceptus rei) that arise when we see the common nature in relation to the things that instantiate it. Logic is accordingly about structural forms, which are, as forms, independent of the mental acts through which they are acquired. Through these structural forms, the connections between the basic constituents of reality (individual and universals, substances and accidents) are disclosed.

3. Ontology (before 1324)

The first important feature of Burley's earlier ontology is his belief that apart from substances, quantities, and qualities, the categories do not contain entities in the full sense of the term, but respectus reales,i.e., real aspects of absolute things. In the fourth chapter of his middle commentary on the Categories (de sufficientia praedicamentorum, fols. 175rb-176rb), Burley mentions two previous accounts of the problem of the number and distinction of the ten categories. The first (from Simon of Faversham's commentary, q. 12) claims that the categories really divide entities according to their modes of being. The second, inspired to Henry of Ghent, admits that being-in-relation-to-something-else (esse ad aliud), i.e., the mode of being of the seven non-absolute categories, does not involve a res distinct from substance, quantity, and quality, but only their real aspects. Although Burley does not explicitly endorse either interpretation, he is not exactly neutral on the matter. In fact, his introductory comments together with the amount of space he devotes to each suggest that he agrees with those authors who think that, properly speaking, only the three absolute categories are fully things (res). Consequently, Burley presents Henry's interpretation as emerging from the lack of supporting proof for Simon's thesis (TsP, de sufficientia praedicamentorum, fol. 175vb). Moreover, he states that the ten categories can be ordered in terms of their degrees of reality and independence, since the non-absolute categories are caused by and grounded in the three absolute ones (TsP, ch. de sufficientia praedicamentorum, fol. 176ra).

At the beginning of his philosophical career Burley seems to have been attracted by Henry of Ghent's theory rather than by the more radical one he was to support some thirty years later. As far as the constitutive and distinctive principles of the categories are concerned, however, in the middle commentary on the Categories Burley advances the same ideas that he defends in his final commentary. He thinks that what characterizes each category is its peculiar mode of being and that this is much more important than the differentiation of essences (TsP, de substantia, fol. 176rb — the formulation of this thesis corresponds almost verbatim to that of the last commentary).

Regarding the relation of the ten categories to being (ens transcendens) and the determination of what properly belongs in the categories, Burley's position is unchanged between his earlier and later commentaries on the Categories and Physics. On the former question, his Categories commentaries are influenced by Albert the Great. They contain only the brief remark that being, as a transcendental, is predicated analogically of the categories (see the ch. de aequivocatione). By contrast, the two Physics commentaries provide an exhaustive treatment of both questions, with some terminological differences. With regard to the first (see the question from book I, utrum ens sit aequivocum ad decem praedicamenta — whether being is equivocal in relation to the ten categories, pp. 192–94), Burley affirms that being is both univocal and analogical with respect to the categories: univocal because the items falling under the categories are called ‘beings’ according to a single concept, and analogical because being is possessed by the categories in different ways — directly by substance and secondarily by accidents. In his final commentary on the Physics (book I, fols. 12vb-13ra), Burley maintains that being is both univocal and equivocal with respect to the ten categories: univocal broadly speaking because a single concept corresponds to it (even though categorial entities are subsumed under it in different ways), and equivocal, though not most strictly, because this single concept is attributed to beings (entia) according to a hierarchy of value. In short, the two commentaries differ only in their use of the terms ‘analogical’ and ‘equivocal’. In the first commentary, Burley uses the term ‘equivocal’ for those terms Boethius, in his own commentary on the Categories, defines as equivocal by chance (a casu), and the term ‘analogical’ for those Boethius calls deliberately equivocal (a consilio). In the second, Burley calls ‘equivocal properly speaking’ (proprie) those terms Boethius refers to as ‘ deliberately equivocal’, and ‘equivocal most strictly’ (magis proprie) those Boethius calls ‘by chance’.

More interesting is Burley's solution to the problem of which entities properly fall under which categories. Unlike most medieval thinkers, he was well aware of the importance of this question, which he discusses in his middle and final commentaries on the Categories (ch. de relatione), as well as in his LsP (ch. de quando, fol. 57va). According to the common realist view, not only simple accidental forms (such as whiteness), but also the compound entities they cause when inhering in substances (a white thing — album) belong to the nine categories of accident. Burley denies this, since he regards the entities resulting from the combination of substance and accidental forms as mere aggregates: accidental beings (entia per accidens) lacking in any real unity. He claims that what is signified by abstract terms, i.e., simple forms such as whiteness and fatherhood, properly falls under the categories, whereas what is signified by concrete accidental terms does not. An aggregate may be said to belong, improperly and reductively, to the category to which its accidental form belongs (Tsp, ch. de relatione, fols. 183vb-184ra; EP, chs. de relatione fol. 35va, and de qualitate, fol. 41rb). Concrete substance-terms (such as ‘man’) are different, however. For even though they signify composites, they signify beings with a real, per se unity that properly belongs to the category of substance. In this case, the abstract forms connoted by concrete substance terms (e.g., the form of humanity by ‘man’) do not lie outside the nature of the things themselves, i.e., the individual substances for which the concrete substance-terms supposit. Thus, both the form and its substance belong to the same categorial field (EP, ch. de denominativis, fol. 19va-b). In this case the individual substances are the bearers (supposita) of the form and not its subject (subiecta), as they are instantiations of it and not mere vessels of inherence (TdU, p. 58; see also De relativis, p. 168).

Burley's earlier position on the question of the number of categories implies a ‘soft’ attitude towards the problem of defining and classifying the types of identity, since it is evident that the non-absolute categories could be considered similar to the absolute ones. Burley does not deal with this subject in his middle commentary on the Categories, however, but in the Quaestiones in librum Perihermenias (q. 4), following Henry of Ghent, he maintains that (1) there are three different kinds of identity: real (realis), notional (secundum rationem), and intentional (secundum intentionem); (2) intentional difference is something between real and notional difference; and (3) two things differ intentionally if and only if they are constitutive of the same thing without their definitions overlapping, such that each can be understood independently of the other, and even together with the negation of the other (QP, q. 4, p. 273). Even so, he does not use this logical machinery to explain the relationship between absolute and non-absolute categories, but only to clarify the relations between genus and difference, essence and being (esse). He maintains that there is no real distinction between essence and being (as Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome had taught), but that they are only intentionally distinct.

The most important feature of Burley's early ontology is his claim that the being (esse) of universals coincides with the being of their instantiations as particulars, so that universals can be said to be everlasting because of the succession of these particulars, not because of a peculiar kind of esse (TsP, ch. se substantia, fol. 177va; see also Ean, the question in book I, utrum universale habeat esse extra animam — whether what is universal has real being outside the mind —, fols. 9ra-11ra). In his middle commentary on the De interpretatione (pp. 53–56) Burley also speaks of mental universals, i.e., the concepts through which our mind relates general names to their significata. We might sum up his position on universals in these texts as follows: (1) universals exist in a twofold way, as common natures in extramental reality and as concepts in our minds; (2) real universals are naturally suited to be present in many things as their primary metaphysical components; (3) mental universals are partially caused in our minds by common natures existing outside our minds; and (4) real universals have no being (esse) outside the being of their particular instantiations.

Burley's theory of universals is obviously a form of moderate realism, but it differs from that defended by other authors such as Thomas Aquinas. According to Aquinas, universals exist in potentia outside the mind, but in actu within the mind, whereas on Burley's account they exist in actu extra animam, since their being is the same as the being of individuals, which is actual. For Burley, a universal is in actu if and only if there is at least one individual instantiating it. Therefore our mind does not give actuality to universals, but only a separate mode of existence.

4. Semantics

The basic idea of Burley's theory of meaning is that the simple expressions in our language (i.e., names) are distinct from complex expressions (i.e., sentences) by virtue of their own significata, that is, by virtue of the different kinds of objects they signify. In fact, the objects signified by complex expressions are composites of those signified by simple expressions, together with a relation of identity (or non-identity, in the case of a true negative sentence) holding between them. A simple object is any item in a category: a particular substance, substantial form, or accidental form (De sup., p. 31; TsP, ch. de subiecto et praedicato, fols. 173vb-174ra; EPhys., prol., fol. 5vb; EP, ch. de subiecto et praedicato, fol. 20ra). Furthermore, only complex expressions can be literally true or false, whereas simple expressions are true or false only metaphorically (TsP, ch. de substantia, fol. 179ra-b; QP, q. 3, p. 248; EP, ch, de oppositione, fol. 45va; Eph, prol. fol. 66rb). As a result, Burley assumes that every simple expression in our language is like a label naming just one object in the world, and that semantic distinctions are derived from ontological differences between signified objects. He recognizes that general terms such as ‘man’ name a set of objects, whereas proper names such as ‘Socrates’ and expressions such as ‘a certain man’ (‘aliquis homo’), name just one object belonging to a set. This difference is explained not by appealing to some semantic distinction between terms, but by means of the different modes of existence of their significata. Proper names and individual expressions name individuals (i.e., object tokens), but general terms name common natures (i.e., object types), which are the metaphysical constituents of the set of individuals instantiating them. For instance, the general name ‘man’ names and can stand for each and every man only because it primarily signifies the universal form of humanity that is present in each and every man and constitutive of his essence (TsP, ch. de substantia, fol. 178ra-b; EP, ch. de substantia, fols. 25vb-26ra). In his middle commentary on De interpretatione, Burley remarks in connection with the opening lines of the chapter seven of Aristotle's text (17a38–b7) that a linguistic expression is a general name (nomen appellativum) if and only if it signifies a universal, that is, a thing (res) common to many individuals (p. 85). The same idea is expressed in his final commentary on De interpretatione (ch. de oppositione enuntiationum, fol. 74rb-va; see also EP, ch. de substantia, fol. 26ra).

Since the criterion for distinguishing linguistic expressions is based on ontological differences among their significata, Burley's semantic system includes a third kind of expression falling between the simple and complex. These are concrete accidental terms (such as ‘white’ or ‘father’), whose significata are not absolutely simple but not exactly complex either. Quite often in the middle (fols. 173ra, 173va, 174va, 177rb, 178rb, 183vb, 188va) and final commentaries on the Categories (chs. de sufficientia praedicamentorum, fol. 21ra; de substantia, fol. 24rb; de relatione, fol. 34rb; see also LsP, ch. de ubi, fol. 59vb) he affirms that instead of signifying simple objects, concrete accidental terms signify aggregates of substance and along with the accidental form primarily signified by the term itself. Such aggregates are lacking in numerical unity and hence do not fall under any of the ten categories; they are not properly beings (entia). For this reason, although concrete accidental terms are not simple from a grammatical point of view, they do not count as names (TsP, ch. de subiecto et praedicato, fol. 174va; EP, chs. de relatione, fol. 37ra-b; de qualitate, fol. 41rb). The metaphysical constituents of such aggregates (substance and accidental form) are related to the concrete accidental term in different ways: on the one hand, the form is the primary significatum, even if the concrete accidental term is not the name of the form; on the other, the concrete accidental term can only supposit for the substance. In other words, concrete accidental terms name substances, but indirectly, through the accidental forms from which they take their names, so that they name substances only insofar as they are subject (subiecta) to a form. This fact accounts for both the difference between the general names of the category of substance (such as ‘man’) and concrete accidental terms, and the presence of the relation of identity (or non-identity) in so-called ‘real propositions’ (propositiones in re). General names in the category of substance are concrete terms as well, but the form they primarily signify is really identical to the substances they name. Therefore, in this case, the name of the form is the same as the name of the substance (TsP, ch. de substantia, fol. 178rb; EP, ch. de denominativis, fol. 19va-b). This implies a difference in meaning between abstract and concrete substantial terms (‘humanity’ vs. ‘man’). ‘Humanity’ is not the name of the form considered in its entirety, but only of its essential principle, that is, the intensional content carried by ‘man’, seeing that abstract substantial terms signify substantial forms apart from their own being (esse). In the extramental world, this being coincides with those token-objects (i.e., individual substances) which instantiate the form (QP, q. 4, pp. 271–273).

These differences mean that in Burley's system a distinction can be drawn between the intension and the extension of an expression. We usually think of the intension of a term as the set of essential properties that determines the applicability of the term itself, and its extension as the set of things to which it is properly applied. From an epistemological point of view, this makes our ability to pick out the extension of a term dependent on our knowledge of its intension. If we treat common natures and particular things as the intension and extension of terms, respectively, we come very close to Burley's account, with the possible exception of the ontological status of intensions (if we are ‘nominalists’), since Burley regards both common natures and particular things as entities in the world. Hence Burley distinguishes what a term signifies (id quod terminus significat) from what it denotes (id quod terminus denotat), which is reflected in the distinction between simple and personal supposition. According to him, the sentence ‘the father and the son are simultaneous by nature’ is true if the two subjects have simple supposition and so refer to their significata, i.e., the two aggregates compounded by substance and accidental form. On the other hand, if we assume that the subjects have personal supposition and so refer only to the two substances, ‘father’ and ‘son’, then the sentence is false (TsP, ch. de relatione, fol. 186vb; EP, ch. de relatione, fol. 37ra-b). In the De suppositionibus and De puritate the same idea is expressed by the definition of the formal supposition as the supposition that a term has when it supposits for its significatum or for the singular objects that instantiate it. In the first case, we properly speak of simple supposition, and in the second, we speak of personal supposition (De Sup., pp. 35–36, De puritate, pp. 7–8).

This kind of approach to the problem of the meaning of simple expressions has two interesting consequences: (1) proper names have no intension, unlike individual expressions (such as ‘a certain man’ — ‘aliquis homo’); and (2) abstract terms in the category of substance (such as ‘humanity’ — ‘humanitas’) are like proper names of intentions, as they have intension but no extension.

As far as the problem of the meaning and truth of complex expressions is concerned, Burley thinks that real propositions (propositiones in re) are the significata of true sentences, just as individuals (both substantial and accidental) are the significata of singular names and universals the significata of general names. The real proposition is the last of the four kinds of propositions mentioned by Burley: written, spoken, mental, real.

According to his first theory, (elaborated in the first decade of the 14th century), these so-called ‘real’ propositions do not properly exist in the extramental world, although they do exist in our minds as objects of acts of intellection or judgment. Burley clearly states that whereas mental propositions exist in our minds as subjects of inherence (habent esse subiectivum in intellectu), real propositions exist in our minds as intentional objects (habent esse obiectivum in intellectu solum) (QP, q. 3, pp. 248–49; CP, p. 61; see also QPo, q. 2, p. 63). Real propositions are complex entities formed by the things to which their subjects and predicates refer, together with an identity relation (if the proposition is affirmative) or a non-identity relation (if the proposition is negative). The things signified exist in the extramental world, but the identity relation is produced by our minds and exists only in them. This identity relation is a sort of intellectual composition by which we understands that the thing (res) signified by the subject term and the thing signified by the predicate term of a proposition belong to the same substance(s) (QP, q. 3, p. 250). On the other hand, it is correct to call the significatum of a sentence a ‘real proposition’, since the fact that two or more things share the same substance does not depend on our minds (CP, pp. 61–62). As the subject of a standard philosophical sentence must be the name of a substance and the predicate a general expression signifying a substantial common nature or an aggregate of substance and accidental form, it is clear that the identity relation can hold only between the things which the subject and predicate of a true affirmative proposition stand for in personal supposition, i.e., between the particular substances named by the subject and predicate expressions of the proposition. In a standard proposition, the significata of a subject and predicate are diverse, but what they stand for has to be the same if the proposition is true. Since the things a term stands for are not established a priori but dependent on propositional context, the analysis of the structure of a proposition in terms of the identity relation requires a correspondence theory of truth. In his middle commentary on the De Interpretatione (pp. 59–60), Burley speaks openly of truth in terms of the “adequation” or congruity between thought and reality (adaequatio intellectus ad rem — see also EPh., prol., fol. 66ra). Every being (ens) is true (verum) in itself, insofar as its structure and inner organization are plainly revealed to the mind. This structural truth (veritas rei) corresponds to a mental truth (veritas in intellectu) (CP, p. 60): when our minds successfully reproduce the internal structure of what is signified by a simple expression or when they grasp the lack of any relationship between the significata of two simple expressions, a diminished being (ens diminutum), which has our mind as its subject of inherence, is generated by the mind. This diminished being is the veritas in intellectu, which corresponds to the veritas rei. If our attempt fails, falsity (falsitas) is generated instead (CP, p. 61).

It is to Burley's credit that he is also able to distinguish between the intension and extension of complex expressions, as indicated by his distinction between a proposition habens esse subiectivum in intellectu and habens esse obiectivum in intellectu. In fact: (1) although the mental proposition exists in the mind as in a subject, the real proposition is present in the mind only qua object of the act of understanding; (2) the real proposition provides the objective content which the other kinds of proposition aim to express; and (3) the mental proposition is the semantic link between the spoken and written propositions on the one hand, and the real proposition they refer to on the other.

Burley's first semantics of complex expressions runs into difficulties on some fronts, however. If no real proposition matches spoken, written, and mental propositions that are false, what is grasped when we understand the meaning of a false proposition? Moreover, real propositions have an indeterminate ontological status, since they exist partly inside the mind, partly outside, and are yet entirely independent of it. In this last case, the problem can be traced to deficiencies in his ontological system, which does not allow him to bring into focus the relation between the substantial unity and the multiplicity of real aspects of a thing (res). Thus, the real proposition, the ultimate significatum of a sentence that exists in our minds qua object of an act of judgment, can be equated with a state of affairs only in relation to its structure and semantic value, but not ontologically. In this way, Burley's first theory of meaning, as far as the semantics of propositions is concerned, looks to be a compromise between the theories of Walter Chatton, who treats meaning as an individual thing (res), and Adam Wodeham, who argues that the meaning of a proposition is the state of affairs signified by the proposition (complexe significabile), which is not a thing.

It was in order to solve the problems mentioned above that Burley modified his theory of semantics in his final commentary on the Ars Vetus — as we are going to see in the next section.

5. The Ontology (and Semantics) of the Macro-objects (after 1324)

Although he defended moderate realism at the beginning of his career, Burley turned to an original form of radical realism after 1324. This can be found in the prologue to his final commentary on the Physics, in his final commentary on the Ars Vetus, and in TdU, where he fully develops and explains his new semantic and ontological view. As noted above, the change was brought about by Ockham's critique of the traditional realist view. In his Summa Logicae (pars I, chs. 14–15, and 40–41) and Commentary on the Categories (prologue, and chs. 7, §1 and 8, §1), the Venerabilis Inceptor had shown that many unacceptable consequences follow from the idea that universals are something existing in re, really identical with their particulars considered as instances of a type (e.g., the universal man qua man is identical with Socrates), but different considered as properly universal (e.g., man qua universal is different from Socrates). That is because whatever is predicated of the particulars must be predicated of their universals too, and so a unique common nature would possess contrary attributes simultaneously via the attributes of different particulars. Also, God could not annihilate Socrates or any other singular substance without at the same time destroying the whole category of substance and therefore every created being, since every accident depends on substance for its existence. For these and other similar reasons Ockham concluded that the thesis that universals exist in re must be rejected.

Burley was persuaded that Ockham's objections are sufficient to show that the traditional realist account of the relation between universals and particulars is unacceptable, but not that realism as a whole is untenable. Thus, in his later years he developed an ontology of macro-objects based on a threefold real distinction between categorial items or simple objects and state of affairs (his propositiones in re), between universals and individuals, and among the ten categories.

On Burley's view, macro-objects (i.e., what is signified by a proper name or definite description such as Socrates or some particular horse) are basic components of the world. They are aggregates made up of primary substances together with a host of substantial and accidental forms existing in them and through them. Primary substances and substantial and accidental forms are simple objects or categorial items, each possessing a unique, well-defined nature. These simple objects belong to one of ten main types or categories, each really distinct from the others. Although they are simple, some of these components are in a sense composite because they are reducible to something else — for example, primary substance is composed of a particular form and matter (EP, ch. de substantia, fol. 22ra). Primary substance differs from the other components of a macro-object because of its peculiar mode of being as an autonomous and independently existing object — in contrast with the other categorial items, which necessarily presuppose it for their existence (EP, ch. de substantia, fol. 22ra-b). Primary substances are therefore substrates of existence and predication in relation to everything else. The distinction between substantial and accidental forms derives from their different relations to primary substances, which instantiate substantial forms (which in turn, qua instantiated, are secondary substances), so that such universal forms disclose the natures of particular substances. By contrast, those forms that simply affect primary substances without being actually joined to their natures are accidental forms. In Burley's words, the forms in relation to which particular substances are the supposita are substantial forms (or secondary substances), whereas those forms in relation to which particular substances are the subiecta are accidental forms (TdU, pp. 58–59). As a result, the macro-object is not simply a primary substance but an orderly collection of categorial items, so that primary substance, even though it is the most important element, does not contain the whole being of the macro-object.

The main feature of this metaphysical conception is Burley's claim that universals fully exist outside the mind and are really distinct from the individuals in which they are present and of which they are predicated. According to him, if universals are no longer actual constitutive parts of their particulars, then the inconsistencies pointed to by Ockham vanish. Furthermore, from a metaphyisical point of view, causes must be proportional to their effects. But the causes of a particular thing must be particular, whereas those of a common nature must be universal. Therefore, individual substances cannot be composed of anything except particular forms and matter, whereas universals are composed of a genus and specific difference as well as by any other universal form above the genus. Consequently, the lowest species is not a constitutive part of the individuals in which it is present and of which it is predicated, but only a form coming together with their essences, making their metaphysical structure known (EP, ch. de substantia, fol. 23rb-va). Hence, Burley sharply distinguishes between two main kinds of substantial form: one singular (forma perficiens materiam) and the other universal (forma declarans quidditatem). The former affects (a particular) matter and, together with it, brings the substantial composite (or hoc aliquid) into existence. The latter, the lowest species, discloses the nature of the particular substance in which it exists and of which it is predicated, but it is not one of its constitutive parts. So particular substances are in and of themselves really distinct from their species and from each other. Every individual really differs from its species because the latter is not part of its essence, but a form existing in it, as well as really distinct from other individuals belonging to the same species because of its own particular form and matter (EIs, ch. de specie, fol. 10va; EP, chs., de substantia, fol. 23va-b; de quantitate, fol. 31rb; see also Tractatus de formis, pp. 9–10). Secondary substances belong to the category of substance only insofar as they are predicated of the essence of particular substances (in quid)(EP, ch. de substantia, fol. 22ra), whereas particular substantial forms and particular matter do not properly belong to the category of substance because they do not fulfill the above conditions for being a substance (EP, ch. de substantia, fol. 22ra).

Burley uses the standard 13th-century division of universals into ante rem, in re, and post rem (LsP, ch. de forma, fol. 53rb; TdU, passim), but he follows Auriol and the earlier Ockham in positing another mental universal, distinct from the act of understanding (the ‘standard’ post rem conceptual universal), and existing in the mind only as its object (habens esse obiectivum in intellectuEP, ch. de priori, fol. 48vb; TdU, pp. 60–66). By introducing a second mental universal existing obiective in the mind, Burley hopes to account for the fact that we can grasp the meaning of a general noun even though we have not experienced any of its supposits, and thus without properly knowing the universal it directly signifies.

Burley identifies secondary substance with the quale quid and primary substance with the hoc aliquid, but quale quid and hoc aliquid are what are signified by general and discrete nouns, respectively, of the category (EP, ch. de substantia, fols. 25vb-26ra). Therefore, he argues that secondary substances are metaphysical entities existing outside our minds that are necessary conditions for our language to be meaningful, as general names would be meaningless if they did not signify something that both exists in reality, and have the peculiar feature of being common to (i.e., present in) many individual things. Only by associating general names with such objects as their proper significatum did Burley think we could explain how a general name can stand for many things at once and name all of them in the same way. According to him, a general name supposits for and names (appellare) a set of individual things only through the common nature or universal which it directly signifies and which is present in that set of individuals (EP, ch. de substantia, fol. 26ra). Since common natures connect general names with their extensions by determining the class(es) of the things to which they are correctly applied, and since they are what general names stand for when they have simple supposition (see De puritate, tr. 1°, pars 1a, ch. 3, pp. 7–9), they are actually the intensions of general names — or rather, the hypostatizations of these intensions, seeing that they are independent entities existing outside our minds. On the other hand, from a merely ontological point of view, universals and particulars are connected by the relation of instantiation, so that primary substances are tokens of secondary substances, since each particular instantiates its associated universal and is recognizable as a token of a given type by virtue of its conformity to it and its likeness to other particular substances (EP, ch. de substantia, fol. 26ra-b). Therefore, in Burley's system, common natures (i.e., universals) and particulars (or simple objects) are related both as intensions to extensions and as types to tokens. A certain type or universal is nothing but the intension of a general name when it is considered in relation to the extension itself, and conversely, the extension of a general name (i.e., a class of individuals) is nothing but the set of tokens of a given type considered in relation to the simple expressions that name them. Thus, the relation holding between the intension and extension of a term is the same as between types and tokens. It is a sort of categorization, which can be described in terms of the elaboration and acquisition of patterns of identification. Moreover, since Burley now admits two kinds of mental universals, the first of which is an act of understanding and the second of which is the object of the former (i.e., its semantic content apprehended by the mind), the intension and the extension of a general term (i.e., the universal nature and the individuals which instantiate it), considered together, are the significatum of the general term, while the concept habens esse obiectivum in intellectu provides its sense, or cognitive meaning. Therefore, according to Burley's final view, the sense/significatum dichotomy is not equivalent to the intension/extension dichotomy, the latter being a sub-division of the former. This result makes his theory of meaning very similar to the one developed recently by R. Cann (Formal Semantics, Cambridge 1993; see especially pp. 10–12; 215–224; and 263–69).

An analogous schema holds for complex expressions, since Burley adds a fifth kind of proposition to the ones he recognized before, correlating them in a similar way, since he now admits spoken, written, two kinds of mental, and real propositions.

As we saw above, the distinction between simple and complex objects, or (roughly) between objects and states of affairs, is fundamental to Burley's ontology. This distinction is the objective counterpart of the linguistic distinction between simple and compound expressions (i.e., nouns vs. sentences or propositions). Thus, Burley can view states of affairs as propositions existing in re. In the prologue to his final commentary on the Categories, he claims that a mental proposition is what is signified by a spoken (or written) sentence. The mental proposition in turn signifies something else, because it is composed of concepts, which are themselves signs. As a result, the ultimate significatum of this chain must be something that is signified but does not signify, and which has the same logical structure as the mental proposition — i.e., it must be a proposition in re (fols. 17vb-18ra; see also ch. de priori, fol. 47va). Such a real proposition is an ens copulatum formed by the entity for which the subject and the predicate stand together with an identity-relation, if the proposition is affirmative, or a non-identity relation, if the proposition is negative (EP, prooem., fol. 18va; EPh, prol., fol. 66ra-b). These complex objects differ from aggregates (the significata of concrete accidental terms), which are also made up of items belonging to different categories since mere aggregates do not include the identity (or non-identity) relation, and, like simple objects, cannot be true nor false (EP, ch. de oppositione, fol. 45va). In the chapter de priori, he maintains that there are four kinds of proposition, written, spoken, mental, and real, and specifies that the mental proposition is twofold: the first, existing in the mind as in a subject (habens esse subiectivum in intellectu), is composed of acts of understanding; the second, existing in the mind as the object of the preceding complex act of understanding (habens esse obiectivum in intellectu), is what we grasp by means of the mind and compare with reality to determine the truth or falsity of a proposition. This is the semantic link between the written, spoken, and (first) mental propositions on the one hand, and the real proposition (the state of affairs) they signify on the other. It exists even if the written, spoken, and (first) mental propositions are false and nothing corresponds to them in reality (fol. 48vb). Accordingly, the proposition habens esse obiectivum in intellectu is now the sense of a sentence, and not its extension. On the other side, the new real proposition is the significatum of the sentence and its truth-maker, since those sentences that signify a complex object existing in reality are true, whereas those sentences that do not signify such a complex object, but to which only the two (simple) objects designated by the subject and predicate correspond in reality, are false.

The problems connected with his first theory of the semantics of propositions are thereby solved. The real proposition of his first theory is split into the mental proposition habens esse obiectivum in intellectu and the (new) proposition in re, both of which have a well-defined semantic and ontological status. In addition, false propositions have meaning (i.e., the mental proposition habens esse obiectivum in intellectu), but no reference, as no real proposition matches them. However, a new question could arise: if universals and singulars, and the ten categories, are really distinct, how can Burley maintain that there must be an identity relation holding between the things signified by the subject and predicate of every true affirmative sentence?

Burley's solution is the same as in his first version of the theory: in a true, affirmative statement, the significata of the subject and predicate are different, but the things for which they stand in personal supposition (i.e., the individual substance or substances) are the same (EP, prooem., fol. 18va; ch. de relatione, fol. 37ra; EPh, prol., fol. 66ra-b). This obviously implies that an affirmative proposition is true if and only if its extremes have personal supposition for the same thing or things. For example, ‘Sortes est homo’ (‘Socrates is a man’) is true if and only if ‘homo’ in this context has personal supposition for Socrates, that is, if the abstract form of humanity (humanitas) is present in Socrates. In this way, the real distinction between universals and particulars, and among the ten categories, is safe, without affecting his theories of correspondence and identity.

Complex objects (or states of affairs — Burley's propositiones in re, the ultimate significatum of a written, spoken or mental proposition) and what we have called ‘aggregates’ (the significatum of a concrete accidental term) are not identical with macro-objects, but definite aspects of them. An aggregate is nothing but the union of one of the countless accidental forms of a macro-object with its primary substance, and a complex object is the union of two forms of a macro-object (one of which, i.e., the one designated directly or indirectly by the subject-term of the proposition, must be substantial) with and by means of the primary substance. This is trivially true not only for propositions in re, such as hominem esse animal (man being an animal) or hominem esse album (man being white) — where the two connected forms are humanity and animality or whiteness respectively, and where what unites them is each particular substance that instantiates both of them in the case of man being animal, and which instantiates the form of humanity and is the substrate of inherence of the form of whiteness in the case of man being white — but also for propositions in re, such as Sortem esse hominem (Socrates being a man). In this case, the two forms involved are the forma perficiens materiam of Socrates (i.e., his soul) and the related but distinct forma declarans quidditatem (i.e., the species man). What unites them is Socrates himself, since he has the forma perficiens materiam as an essential element and instantiates the forma declarans quidditatem.

6. ‘Regional’ Ontologies (after 1324)

Since Burley conceives of primary substances as the ultimate substrates of existence and subjects of predication in relation to anything else (EP, ch. de substantia, fols. 24va-b, and 25va), the only way to demonstrate the reality of beings in other categories is to treat them as forms and attributes of substances. Since Burley wanted to preserve the reality of quantity and its real distinction from substances and other accidents, he insists that quantity is a form inherent in the material part of a composite substance (EP, ch. de quantitate, fol. 29rb). This is problematic, however, for if the highest genus of the category is a form, Aristotle's seven species of quantity (line, surface, solid, time, space, number, and speech), mentioned in the sixth chapter of the Categories, are not. Burley tries to meet this difficulty by reformulating the notion of a quantified thing (quantum). Encouraged by the Aristotelian distinction between strict and derivative quantities (Categories 6, 5a38-b10), he distinguishes two different modes of being quantified: in-itself (per se) and in-virtue-of-something-else (per accidens). The seven species of quantity are quantified by themselves, whereas other quantified things (for example: corporeal substances) are quantified in virtue of one or more of the seven species (EP, ch. de quantitate, fol. 29va). In other words, Burley considers the seven species not as quantitative forms, but as the most proper and primary bearers (supposita) of the quantitative properties revealed by the supreme genus of the category. Any other kind of quantified thing is simply a subject (subiectum) of quantitative forms.

Another distinguishing mark of quantity is its characteristic (proprium). In the Categories (6, 6a26–35), Aristotle identified it through the fact that only quantities are said to be equal or unequal. Burley does not wholly agrees with him, because quanta per accidens also are said to be equal or unequal, though in a derivative way (EP, ch. de quantitate, fol. 32rb). Thus, Burley turns to two texts from Aristotle's Metaphysics (books V, ch. 13 and X, ch. 1) for an alternative account of the proprium of quantity as the measure of what is quantified (EP, ch. de quantitate, fol. 28rb). Moreover he employs this property as the common principle from which the seven species of quantity can be derived (EP, ch. de quantitate, fol. 30ra). In this way, he tries to show that the category of quantity, like that of substance, has an ordered internal structure, and he reasserts the reality and real distinction of quantity against authors such as Peter Olivi and Ockham, who had attempted to reduce quantity to an aspect of material substance. Burley quotes at length from Ockham's commentary on the Categories (ch. 10, § 4), where the Franciscan master tries to demonstrate that quantity is really nothing distinct from substance and quality. He then proceeds to reject Ockham's arguments (EP, ch. de quantitate, fol. 30rb-vb).

Ockham had claimed that it was superfluous to posit quantitative forms really distinct from substance and quality, since quantity presupposes what it is intended to explain, i.e., the extension of material substances and their having parts outside parts. As an accident, quantity presupposes substance as its substrate of inherence. Burley denies that material substances can be extended without the presence of quantitative forms, thereby affirming their necessity. He admits that the existence of any quantity always implies the existence of a substance, but he also believes that the actual existence of parts of a substance necessarily implies the presence of a quantitative form in it. He does not provide any sound metaphysical reason for this preference. But it makes sense when one considers his semantic theory, according to which reality is the interpretative pattern of (philosophical) language, so that the structure of language is a mirroring of reality. In Burley's opinion, therefore, abstract terms in the category of quantity (such as ‘extension’, ‘duration’, ‘magnitude’, and so on) must correspond to realities in the world that are distinct from those signified by the abstract substantial terms.

As we have seen, Burley thinks that what falls under any categorial field are simple accidental forms; therefore, the things of the ad aliquid category are relations (relationes) and not relatives (relativa or ad aliquid), which are merely aggregates formed by a substance and a relation. Accordingly, the relationship between relation and relatives is like that between quantity and what is quantified, or quality and what is qualified. The relation is the cause of the nature of the aggregate (that is, the relatives), of which it is a constituent. Unlike modern logicians, Burley denies that a relation is a two-place predicate, and views it instead as a monadic function, arguing that like the other accidental forms, relation inheres in a single substrate and makes reference to another thing without inhering in it. This thesis is based on the following principle, which Burley states in his commentary on the Book of Six Principles (LsP, ch. de habitu, fol. 63ra): there must always be equivalence and correspondence between the accidental form and its substrate of inherence, so that no accidental form can completely inhere at the same time in two or more different substrates — not even numbers, the different parts of which inhere in their own distinct substrates. Unlike other accidental forms, however, relations do not directly inhere in their substrates, but are present in them only by means of another accidental form that Burley calls the foundation of the relation (fundamentum relationisEP, ch. de relatione, fol. 34va). Among the nine categories of accidents, only quantity, quality, action, and affection can be the foundations of relations.

Consequently, Burley claims that in the act of referring one substance to another we can distinguish five constitutive elements: (1) the relation itself (e.g., the form of paternity); (2) the substrate of the relation, i.e., the substance that denominatively receives the name of the relation (the animal which begets another similar to itself); (3) the foundation (fundamentum) of the relation, i.e., the absolute entity in virtue of which the relation inheres in the substrate and makes reference to another substance (in this case, the generative power); (4) the antecedent term (terminus a quo) of the relation, i.e., the substrate of inherence of the relation considered as the subject of that relation (the father); and (5) the consequent term (terminus ad quem) of the relation, i.e., the substance with which the substrate of the relation is connected, considered as the object with which the antecedent term is correlated (in our example, the son). The foundation is the main component, since it joins the relation to the underlying substances, permits the relation to link the antecedent to the consequent term, and transmits some of its properties to the relation (EP, ch. de relatione, fol. 35rb-vb). Even though the relation depends for its existence on the foundation, its being is completely distinct from it, so that when the foundation fails the relation also fails, but not vice versa (EP, ch. de relatione, fol. 35ra).

From this analysis Burley draws some rather important consequences about the nature and ontological status of relations and relatives: (1) the existence relations have is feebler than that of any other accident, as it depends upon the simultaneous existence of three different things: the substrate, the consequent term, and the foundation; (2) relations do not add any absolute perfection to the substances in which they occur; (3) relations can inhere in substances without any change in the latter, through a change in the consequent term of the relation (e.g., given two things, one white and the other black, if the black thing becomes white then because of the change, a new accident, a relation of similarity, will inhere in the other without any other change in it; (4) there are two main kinds of relatives: real (secundum esse) and linguistic (secundum dici). Linguistic relatives (such as ‘knowledge’ and ‘knowable’) are connected only by the mutual reference of the nouns signifying them. Real relatives are linked as well by a relation which inheres in one of them and entails a real reference to the other. Linguistic relatives in reality belong to the category of quality. Real relatives are aggregates compounded by a substance and a relation, so that they fall under the category of relation only indirectly (per reductionem) because of their accidental form. Finally (5), all true relatives are simultaneous by nature (simul natura), so Aristotle was wrong in denying that some pairs of relatives are mutually simultaneous, but one prior and the other posterior. In fact, the real cause of being a relative is the relation, which at the same time inheres in one thing and entails a reference to the other, thereby making both things relatives (EP, ch. de relatione, fols. 32va-b, 34ra, 37ra).

Among the ‘regional’ ontologies Burley developed in his final commentary on the Ars Vetus, the one which deals with the categorial field of quality is, in many ways, the least complex and problematic. Here Burley follows the Aristotelian doctrine very closely, does not argue against Ockham, and sometimes offers rather superficial analyses.

The main topics he deals with are: (1) the internal structure of the category; (2) the relationship between quality and what is qualified (quale); (3) the nature of the four species of quality Aristotle lists in the Categories (states and dispositions, natural capacities or incapacities to do or suffer something, affective qualities and affections, shapes and external forms); and (4) the distinctive characteristic (proprium) of the category of quality, i.e., the fact that two or more things can be described as similar only because of quality and in respect of it. We will focus on the first two only, since the questions they raise are more general.

Following the opinion of Duns Scotus (q. 36 of his Quaestiones in librum PraedicamentorumQuestions on the Book of the Categories), Burley maintains that the four ‘species’ of quality mentioned by Aristotle are not properly species but modes (modi) of quality. That is because unlike real species, they are not completely separate classifications, since many things belonging to the first species also belong to the second and/or the third (EP, ch. de qualitate, fol. 38vb).

As far as the nature of qualia and their relation to quality are concerned, Burley thinks that qualia are aggregates composed of a substance and a quality inhering in it. They do not belong to any categorial field because they lack in real unity. Nevertheless, since they are qualia in virtue of a qualitative form, they can be included in the category of quality indirectly (per reductionemEP, ch. de qualitate, fol. 41rb). Qualia share qualities in to different degrees. While no qualitative form admits of more or less, their substrates of inherence do (EP, ch. de qualitate, fol. 41vb). In this way, Burley advances two important theses of his metaphysics as logical corollaries of his theories of universals and substances: (1) no universal form can be shared in different degrees by the individual instantiating it; (2) no individual form can be subject to change, except, of course, through generation and corruption.

7. The Theory of Knowledge

During his long career, Walter Burley worked out two different accounts of the standard realist theory of knowledge, both of which are critical of the most common theories of his time. Burley himself places much more stress on the question of the proper object of human knowledge and the intellective cognition of individuals. The first account is developed in his commentary on Aristotle's De anima (before 1316), and the second in the prologue of his last commentary on the Physics (around 1324).

In the commentary on De anima, Burley deals with the problems of the object of knowledge and the possibility of direct intellective cognition of singulars, especially in questions 5 and 6 of Book III: “utrum intellectus intelligat singulare [Does the intellect understand what is singular]?” and “utrum universale sit obiectum intellectus [Is what is universal an object of the intellect]?” (fols. 69rb-70va). In order to answer these two questions, Burley, like Averroes, begins by distinguishing three different aspects and one state of the soul which can be designated by the term ‘intellect’: the elementary thought (virtus cogitativa — which, for Burley, as for Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome, is a purely sensory faculty); the active intellect; the possible intellect (which, following Averroes's terminology, Burley calls “materialis”); and the intellect in habitu, i.e., that state of the intellect in which, thanks to the union of the active intellect with the material intellect, an intelligible species comes into being in the material intellect, generating an effective act of cognition. Since, in Burley's view, both the active intellect and the intellect in habitu are not strictly speaking faculties of the soul, but the primary cause of understanding and a state of the soul, respectively, it is necessary for him to offer two distinct accounts depending on whether it is the elementary thought or the material intellect which is in question. In the first case, the material singular is the direct and sufficient object of the intellect, insofar as elementary thought, like common sense and imagination, is directed exclusively towards individuals, both substantial and accidental. But in the second case, it is the universal that is the direct and appropriate object of the intellect, because the intentional representation (species or intentio) produced by the singular in the soul is not formed or ‘taken in’ by the material intellect, as the only species present in the material intellect is the universal. Nevertheless, Burley acknowledges that the material intellect also has knowledge of the singular in an indirect and derivative way (indirecte et ex consequenti). Accordingly, he disagrees with those authors who, on the basis of the Aristotelian assertion that “sensation is of singulars; but understanding is of universals”, affirm that the singular cannot in any way be the object of intellective knowledge. According to Burley, what the Aristotle means is that the senses can grasp directly and appropriately only the singular, whereas the universal can be known in a direct and proper manner only by the material intellect (cf. also In De an., I, q.5: “utrum intelligere sit propria operatio animae vel totius coniuncti [Is understanding the proper activity of the soul or of the entire conjunct <of body and soul>?”, fol. 13va; and De potentiis animae, p. 111). What is more, were the material intellect unable to know the singular, it would be impossible for us to distinguish what is individual from what is universal. As a matter of fact, even though the species present in the material intellect is universal, and cannot by itself point to any particular individual, the material intellect can know the singular by means of intentional representations (phantasma) present in the elementary thought, since the phantasm is nothing but the intentional representation of a single individual substance obtained through the accidental properties it exhibits. Thanks to such a representation the (material) intellect can assimilate itself in the act of knowing to singular things attested to by the senses .

But Burley's explanation, however interesting, has a weak point, since it does not clarify how it is possible for the material intellect to know an individual existing outside our mind by means of a singular intentional representation that is not present in it, but in elementary thought. The solution to this problem lies in what he says in the aformentioned q.5 of Book I, as well as in q.10 of Book III (“utrum intellectus materialis copuletur nobis solum per phantasma [Is the material intellect joined to us only through an image]?”, fol. 76va-b), concerning the problem of the union (copulatio) of singular human beings with the material intellect, which is assumed to be separate and unique for the whole human species. In his view, the material intellect is by nature united with human individuals from birth, as the perfection of their being. But a further kind of union takes place when the material intellect performs an act of understanding (in operando), i.e., when the active intellect illumines both the phantasm and the material intellect, thereby impressing on the latter the species intelligibilis abstracted from the former — intelligible species by means of which the material intellect can grasp the common nature of the singular substance which began the process of knowing. This close connection between the phantasm and the intelligible species (which originates from it) is why (1) the material intellect can know singulars through a representation that is not properly present in it; and conversely, (2) the elementary thought can know, indirectly and derivatively, common natures (or universals) (“homo per virtutem cogitativam potest cognoscere universalia et quidditates rerum”, fol. 13va), even though its proper and adequate object is the singular.

This account of the knowing process provides a twofold origin of human knowledge: the first empirical, from the senses; the other transcendental, from the active intellect. On the one hand, the external and internal senses collect, decode, and elaborate information that comes from a singular material thing present to the senses. The result is the formation of a phantasm of a thing. On the other hand, the active intellect impresses on the material intellect the intelligible species, when the phantasm inhering in the elementary thought is presented to the material intellect itself. Intellection seems thus to consist in the matching, so to speak, of a phantasm with an intelligible species, a sort of classification of world items, in virtue of which any given singular item is referred back to its type. This entails that for Burley, the cognitive process is aimed at the second operation of the intellect, namely judgment (e.g., “Sortes est homo”), and not simply to abstraction, since it is by means of judgment that the intellect subsumes a given token (the material thing) under its type (the natural species). This fact also explains why the answer to the question concerning the proper object of the intellect is complicated.

As far as the problem of the primary object of knowledge is concerned, in the commentary on the De anima, Burley distinguishes (1) a triple mode in which something can be the primary object of the intellect: by origin (via generationis), by intrinsic perfection (via perfectionis), and by proportion (via adaequationis); and (2) two different kinds of knowledge: analytic (distincta) and vague (confusa). From the point of view of analytic knowledge, i.e., adequately articulated and developed knowledge, being is the first object of the intellect by origin. But from the point of view of vague knowledge, i.e., knowledge which is not yet articulated and developed, the first objects of the intellect by origin are the universals corresponding to those individuals perceived by our senses. The first object of the intellect by intrinsic perfection is the first cause from the perspective of absolute perfection; but in terms of relative perfection, it is the universal which corresponds to the individual present to our senses. Finally, the object by proportion of a given faculty is that item under which all things known by that faculty fall. In the case of the intellect, being in its widest generality is such, as only that which is can be known.

Moreover, Burley also distinguishes between the object which gives rise to the process of knowledge (obiectum motivum) and the object that contains within itself all known things (obiectum contentivum). The first is always singular, whereas the second is always universal. In other words, what we come to know is a common nature, but this is possible just because there are particular things that strike our senses (fol. 70ra-b).

Although Burley seems to accept the existence of a separate material intellect, unique to the whole human species, he emphasizes the fact that without the contribution of elementary thought, which provides us with the phantasm, the material intellect cannot be united to the active intellect in knowing. It is true that individual men could not reach an intellective knowledge of anything without the material intellect; but it is also true that the material intellect on its own, or with the mere contribution of the active intellect, would not be capable of elaborating any form of knowledge.

This particular reconstruction of the process of knowledge is justified at the ontological level too. Burley's earlier view about the metaphysical composition of corporeal beings accounts for the way he approaches questions concerning knowledge. He claims that corporeal beings are constituted by an individual substance and a host of accidental forms inhering in it. Individual substance is then the result of the union of particular matter and form (cf. Quaestiones in librum Perihermeneias, q.4, p. 272). Particular form is itself constituted by a specific form (that is, the essence of the singular thing at issue) and by all of its metaphysical constituents. As we have already seen, it is precisely in the commentary on the De anima (Book I, q.3) that Burley affirms that universals in the category of substance are constitutive parts in the essence of their individuals, and have being in their individuals. All of this enables us to understand better why in his De anima commentary, Burley grants some level of intelligibility to singulars as such, though indirectly and derivatively, and also why he describes elementary knowledge in terms of a classification of things according to which a given singular object is referred back to its ideal type.

Nonetheless, about ten years later, in the prologue to his last commentary on Aristotle's Physics, Burley completely reversed his position on knowledge. In partial agreement with Thomas Wilton, who had been his socius in Paris, he maintained that our intellect is capable of knowing singulars qua singulars (sub propria ratione singularis) primarily and directly (primo et directe), and not simply as items belonging to a certain species or type. Indeed, he now argued that the universal can be grasped by the intellect indirectly and by refection (In Phys. I, fol. 10va), an openly anti-Avverroistic statement which would steer him closer to Ockhamist nominalism, were it not for his denial of any form of intuitionism.

In his discussion of the question, “utrum magis universalia sint nobis prius nota quam minus universalia vel quam singularia [Is what is more universal more known to us than what is less universal, or than singulars]?” (fol. 9va-b), Burley deals once again with the problems of the intelligibility of singulars and the object of our knowledge. The question arises from the passage in the Physics (I.1, 184a23–24), where Aristotle affirms that our knowledge must proceed from what is universal to what is particular (or singular). According to Burley, it is false that what is more universal is known by us before (prius nota) what is less universal, as Thomas Aquinas had taught. Anyone who holds this, he argues, implicitly assumes that the passage from ignorance to perfect cognition (notitia perfecta) is mediated by the knowledge of all the substantial forms of the object in question, from the more general to the more particular. But this assumes that in order to know something, it is necessary to know everything that can be predicated of it. This seems false to Burley, since it is openly contradicted by experience: e.g., a person can know that the animal standing in front of him is a horse, and what a horse is, without knowing all the other universal forms that are predicated of it (fol. 9vb). A cognition of the latter kind is almost impossible, for it would be necessary to acquire systematic knowledge of all animal species and of any possible grouping they could form — something that no human being can achieve (fols. 9vb-10ra). Nor is Burley convinced by Ockham's interpretation of this passage in the latter's commentary on the Physics (cf. Expositio in libros Physicorum Aristotelis I, c.1, §2, O.Ph. IV, 24–25), according to which the Aristotelian principle applies only to complex knowledge and referring to humanity as a whole, although for each of us taken singularly the contrary is true, because the object of our simple and exhaustive knowledge (notita incomplexa perfecta) is the singular. Burley contends that what is true for individual human beings must also be true for humanity as a whole, and therefore that at the level of human species as well, the knowledge of what is less universal comes before the knowledge of what is more universal (cf. fol. 10rb).

Burley concludes this first part of his discussion, devoted to the analysis and refutation of the opinions of Aquinas and Ockham, with a remark concerning the way in which general concepts are structured and related one to another. He presents a categorization of the different types of knowledge and reappraises to some extent the role of definition in knowledge. Burley affirms that the more universal concepts are not closely connected with less universal concepts; they do not form a logically or essentially ordered (essentialiter ordinata) series. Definition provides us with better knowledge of a thing than the knowledge we acquire from the mere apprehension of its name; nevertheless, the simple cognition which derives from the confused and indistinct knowledge of the nominal notion of a given thing is sufficient for all practical purposes, and prior by origin to the knowledge which results from its definition, as what is more simple is prior to what is less simple. Thus, for Burley, we first grasp the meaning of simple terms and then that of composite expressions such as definitions. However, from the point of view of quantity of information or exhaustiveness, the most perfect definition (perfectissima definitio), i.e., the definition enumerating all four causes of the definiendum and not just its proximate genus (material cause) and specific difference (formal cause), is superior to any other form of knowledge (fol. 6rb).

In this (new) discussion of the nature of human knowledge, Burley distinguishes between complex cognition (notitia complexa) and simple cognition (notitia incomplexa) (cf. fols. 5va-b), as well as between two different types of exhaustive complex cognition (notitia perfecta complexa): (i) absolute (simpliciter) and (ii) relative to the general kind of thing in question (in genere) (see fols. 5vb-6ra). He also distinguishes between appropriate (distincta) (or perfectly appropriate — distinctissima) cognition and discrete or discriminative cognition (distinctive seu discretiva) (cf. fols. 10vb-11ra). A complex cognition of a thing is contained in and manifested by one or more statements about it, both affirmative and negative (fol. 5va). A simple cognition, on the other hand, is contained in and manifested by simple concepts and expressions, namely terms (fol. 5vb). Complex exhaustive cognition simpliciter is what enables us to know all the intrinsic constitutive principles of a thing along with all the essential predicates and characteristic features (propria) associated with these principles themselves. Relative exhaustive complex cognition is what makes possible for us to know all the essential predicates and all the characteristic features associated with them in relation only to the natural species (or type) of a thing (fol. 6ra). We have an appropriate cognition of a thing when we are able to list most of its constitutive elements, and a perfectly appropriate knowledge when we can specify all of its constituent elements (fol. 10vb). Finally, we have discriminative knowledge of a thing when we are able to distinguish the thing at issue from other similar things by virtue of one or more peculiar aspects which make it different from all others of the same kind (fol. 11ra).

Keeping these distinctions in mind, we can now move on to examine how Burley articulates his solution to the problem of the object of human knowledge. According to him, determining whether what is more universal is known by us before what is less universal is equivalent to establishing what is the primary and direct object by origin of confused and appropriate cognitions. He thinks that from the point of view of the origin of our confused knowledge, the intellect grasps first what is singular. The argumentation he develops to support this claim is articulated in two stages: (1) he demonstrates that the intellect is able to know what is singular, since it can easily distinguish universals from singulars. If the intellect were unable to know singulars, it would be impossible for it to distinguish what is universal from what is singular. This was the most important proof that he had utilized in his De anima commentary to demonstrate that the material intellect has some kind of singular knowledge, however indirect and derivative. Next, (2) he proves that the primary object by way of generation (via generationis) of confused knowledge is the singular, as it would be otherwise impossible to explain how the intellect can obtain some kind of singular knowledge on the basis of previous universal knowledge. If we knew what is universal before what is singular, we could never acquire knowledge of any singular, given that the universal species cannot direct our intellect toward any particular individual, since it is tied to each individual by the same relation of similarity (fol. 11rb).

In the De anima commentary, this remark did not prevent Burley from stating the exact opposite of what he intends to prove here. He had held that the (material) intellect does not know singulars through universal species, but thanks to the intentional representation of a given singular present in the elementary thought and accessible to the intellect only at the moment of the active union of a single individual man with the material and active intellects in the soul. This means that the complex explanation of the process and nature of human knowledge developed in the De anima commentary is completely rejected here, and replaced by a new theory modelled not on Averroes's commentary but on Burley's own semantic and ontological program. What is more, in Burley's new way of thinking, the intellect does know the universal only by abstraction from singulars; but abstraction always proceeds from what is already known to what is not yet known; therefore, singulars are known by us before universals (cf. fol. 11va). It is thus not surprising that Burley concludes this first part of his answer, devoted to confused knowledge, by supporting a thesis diametrically opposed to what was proposed in his De anima commentary, namely that universals are known by the intellect indirectly and derivatively, through reflection. According to Burley, our intellect grasps what is universal only after having known at least one of the corresponding singulars, even though it knows the lowest species of each singular almost immediately, from the singular itself, whereas all the other universals contained in the lowest species (from the proximate genus up to the highest genus in the category to which the singular thing belongs) are known only through reflection on the lowest species itself. The most immediate consequences of the adoption of this view are (1) a new theory concerning the object of intellective knowledge, different from that presented in Book III of his De anima commentary; and (2) a new definition of the function of the active intellect in the process of knowledge.

Burley now distinguishes a four-fold way in which something can be considered the first object of the intellect: by origin, by proportion, by intrinsic perfection, and by exclusion (primitate exclusionis) — the latter being the way a determinate object can be known by a certain faculty and by that faculty alone, excluding all others. The singular, and not the universal, is now considered the first object of the intellect by origin — which was obvious from what had been stated in the previous passages. Being, taken in its broadest generality, is the first object of the intellect by proportion, but now Burley explains that Being, understood in this way, is equivalent to intelligible being. The first object of the intellect by intrinsic perfection is God. In this case as well, there is a rather marked difference from the De anima commentary in that Burley abandons the distinction between absolute and relative perfection (which had enabled him, once more, to introduce the universal as primary object of the intellect), and replaces the more impersonal and abstract Aristotelian first cause with God (presumably the Christian God). Finally, the universal is the object of the intellect by exclusion insofar as the intellect is the only faculty capable of knowing it.

Furthermore, as far as the role of the active intellect is concerned, the claim that the singular is now intelligible in principle requires that the job of the active intellect should no longer be the one traditionally attributed to it of removing the individuating conditions from the phantasm; rather, it must now act on the possible intellect (intellectus possibilis). The active intellect makes the possible intellect move from a state of purely potential intellection to a state of actual intellection (given by the presence in it of the intelligible species) — a state which the phantasm would not, on its own, be able to bring about in the possible intellect (cf. fol. 11vb). It is worth noting Burley's change in terminology, from the orthodox Averroistic expression “intellectus materialis”, as it appears in the De anima commentary, to the expression more commonly used by the opponents of the Averroists: “intellectus possibilis”.

The analysis of the question of the primary and direct object by origin of appropriate cognition is far shorter and less problematic. Appropriate cognition is the knowledge we obtain once we are capable of enumerating in an orderly way all the elementary metaphysical components of a thing. Consequently, the starting points of this kind of knowledge cannot but be the most general universals, as their notions constitute the basis from which the notions of less general universals and of singulars themselves will have to be “built” and understood. The reason is that what is subordinated to something else cannot be known in an appropriate manner if those things which are above it in the categorial hierarchy and which constitute its essence are not known (fols. 10vb-11ra).

In this way, Burley points towards a double movement in the process of knowing: a first movement, connected with the activity of abstraction or generalization of the intellect (namely, the kind of knowledge he calls ‘confused’), which goes from the bottom to the top of the categorial hierarchy, i.e., from what is singular to the highest genus. Then there is a second movement, tied to the definitional activity of the intellect (namely the knowledge that he calls appropriate'), which goes from top to bottom of the categorial hierarchy, proceeding from what is more universal and therefore intensionally more simple and primitive to that which is less so, finally reaching singulars, which are intentionally richer and ontologically more complex than any universal.

As we have seen, within Burley's new theory of understanding the singular can be placed either at the beginning of the chain of knowledge, as its origin, or at its end, as its result. In both cases, what remains unchanged is that intellective knowledge is at stake and not simply sense knowledge. This means that for Burley, the singular is one of the primary objects of the cognitive activity of the human intellect. This result is historically significant because it brings Burley's later theory of knowledge into line with the other great epistemological doctrines of the fourteenth century, almost all of which were aimed at re-evaluating the singular as a possible object of knowledge. The way for this was prepared by the ontological turn in Burley's last commentary on the Physics: the move from an ontology developed according to the canons of moderate realism to the radically realist ontology of macro-objects, based on a real distinction between universals and singulars and among the ten Aristotelian categories. Such a conception derives from the assumption of a hermeneutical principle which is clearly formulated by Burley for the first time in the latter work, where he observes that the causes of a particular effect must be particular as well, and those of a universal effect must be universal. Accordingly, he denies that a universal cause can have a particular effect and vice-versa, and therefore that what is singular can be directly constituted by those universal forms placed above it in the hierarchy of categorial predication (cf. fol. 9rb-va).

At the cognitive level, negating any real identity between universals and singulars (which, on the contrary, had been assumed to hold in the De anima commentary) brought with it a unification of the levels of knowledge (sense cognition and abstractive cognition) through the intellectualization of the knowledge of singulars and a doubling of the object of knowledge (the singular and the universal). This was necessary so that the real distinction between universal and individual at the ontological level did not make it impossible to explain how sense knowledge (fully centered on singulars) and intellective knowledge (centred on universals) could “meet” in judgements concerning individuals, as in “Socrates is a man”. This was possible in the De anima commentary precisely because of their real identity in the extra-mental world of universals and individuals; once this identity failed, however, there was the risk of making the passage from the intentional representation of singulars to the intelligible species of the common nature (or universal) into a sort of arbitrary distortion of the data coming from reality. The relation, now more slippery and fragile, between the (substantial) universal and the singular required that singulars be moved from the sphere of imperfect and piecemeal sense knowledge and made available to the cognitive faculty that is concerned with universals. Indeed, in the ontology of the later Burley, universal substantial forms are distinguished from accidental forms not because their being is somehow identified with that of those singular substances which are their substrates, but because they alone are capable of manifesting the deep metaphysical structure of the singular substances themselves. The type, which in Burley's earlier writings was only something exhibited by singular substances, is now a reality distinct from them, though not totally separated nor existentially independent from them. Consequently, Burley's theory ends up putting substantial and accidental forms on the same level, and cancelling every qualitative difference in predication. This makes his logical system considerably different from the Aristotelian/Neo-Platonic systems of the Middle Ages, since for the latter the predicative relation of any sentence of the subject/copula/predicate form had to be understood as modally determined by the particular nature of the predicable corresponding to the predicate (i.e., its species, genus, difference, proprium, accident). On the other hand, this makes Burley's logical system the medieval system that is the most similar to the modern ones.


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