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Pierre Bayle

First published Fri Feb 7, 2003; substantive revision Thu Aug 30, 2012

Pierre Bayle (1647–1706) was a Huguenot, i.e., a French Protestant, who spent almost the whole of his productive life as a refugee in Holland. His life was devoted entirely to scholarship, and his erudition was second to none in his, or perhaps any, period. Although much of what he wrote was embedded in technical religious issues, for a century he was one the most widely read philosophers. In particular, his Dictionnaire historique et critique was the single most popular work of the eighteenth century. The content of this huge and strange, yet fascinating work is difficult to describe: history, literary criticism, theology, obscenity, in addition to philosophical treatments of toleration, the problem of evil, epistemological questions, and much more. His influence on the Enlightenment was, whether intended or not, largely subversive. Said Voltaire: “the greatest master of the art of reasoning that ever wrote, Bayle, great and wise, all systems overthrows.”

1. Bayle's life, work and circumstances

More than for most philosophers, the circumstances of Bayle's life determined the shape, content and thrust of his work. Curiously, accounts nowadays of the lives of historical philosophers, usually written by philosophers for philosophers, often begin with this sort of statement, even though most philosophers otherwise write as if circumstances were irrelevant. In the case of Bayle, however, the importance of circumstances is undeniable, to the point that ignoring them inevitably leads to distortion and misinterpretation.

An emblematic event in the life of Bayle was the Revocation of the Edict of Nantes in 1685, which from his point of view was an instance of grotesque intolerance based on moral and logical absurdity. The greater part of his life's work can be understood as Bayle's attempt to lay bare the absurdity represented by this event. Nor was the significance of the event merely symbolic for Bayle, since he himself was a victim of the intolerance to an extreme degree.

The Revocation (as it came simply to be called, so momentous was it) must be understood in the context of the general reformation of Christianity in the sixteenth century. Perceived ecclesiastical abuses, both moral and doctrinal, had led many to believe that such radical overhaul of Roman Catholicism was required that, in the end, separation from Rome was often the result. The separation of the Protestants, as they were called, was generally based on political power, either of a majority or simply of those in a position to exercise it. In France, however, the situation was more complicated, because the Protestants, or Huguenots, were never more than about a twentieth of the population. Even so, they had influence beyond their numbers, and they took sides in a protracted political struggle that emerged as the civil Wars of Religion, one of the grisliest chapters in French history. After most of a century of death and upheaval, the French were ready for a settlement, which came about when the succession of the crown passed to the Protestant Henry of Navarre, but on condition of his abjuration of Protestantism, i.e., conversion to Catholicism. “Paris is worth a Mass,” quipped the new Henry IV, who was then uniquely in a position to terminate the Wars of Religion, which he did with the Edict of Nantes (1598). This royal decree recognized the rights of Protestants in at least certain domains, but in terms that were far from fully favorable to Protestant interests (for example, only Catholics were to be admitted to the universities). Moreover, Henry's successors gradually chipped away at Protestant guarantees in a policy of persecution aimed, as they saw it, at uniting the French state (un roi, une loi, une foi—one king, one law, one faith). Finally, Louis XIV, the “Sun King,” abolished the Edict altogether, even though it had been issued in perpetuity, on the ground that it was no longer needed since there were no longer any Protestants.

Amidst this mess, Pierre Bayle was born in 1647, the son of a Protestant minister in Le Carla (now Le Carla-Bayle), a small town in the foothills of the Pyrenees. Typically, the family was financially impoverished, and Pierre, after primary school, could be only home-schooled until he was 21. Then, when his older brother had at last graduated from the only place the family could afford at the Protestant school at Puylaurens, he left home for what soon became the crossroads of his life. For within three months he had moved on to the Jesuit school in Toulouse, where he abjured his Protestantism. His conversion was short-lived however, for he after graduating with a master's degree he returned to the Protestant fold. Commentators differ on the significance of this episode. The interpretation in terms of venal self-interest seems mistaken, however. While Bayle's abjuration made him eligible for a Jesuit scholarship, his re-conversion returned him to a state that was far worse, for in the eyes of the authorities he was now not just a heretic, but a relapsed heretic, liable to the severest of penalties. He therefore fled France for the Calvinist stronghold of Geneva. He went with the renewed blessing of his family and the knowledge, given that both his changes of religion were sincere, that errors of conscience could occur in good faith.

A menial job of tutoring kept body and soul together in Geneva, but also kept him from the scholarly life Bayle craved. He eventually slipped back into France for a position at the Protestant Academy at Sedan, where he remained until its suppression by the government in 1681. Eventually, he was given a position at the Ecole Illustre in Rotterdam, a school for the community of Huguenot refugees there, whose numbers increased dramatically after the Revocation. Despite still-onerous teaching commitments, Bayle began his serious publishing career with works defending the French Reform from Catholic persecution and criticisms on many topics, but particularly on the doctrine of the Real Presence of Christ in the sacrament of the Eucharist, which the Huguenots denied. Works from this period include: Pensées diverses (1682), the Critique générale (1682), Nouvelles lettres (1685) and La France toute catholique (1686). The philosophical basis for his argument against Catholic persecution appeared the following year in the Commentaire philosophique, a classic in the literature on toleration.

Bayle's position on toleration was found inimical to the Protestant cause by his erstwhile friend and colleague from Sedan, Pierre Jurieu, whom he had helped bring to the safety of Holland. Jurieu, “the Theologian of Rotterdam,” soon became the bitterest enemy of Bayle, “the Philosopher of Rotterdam,” and the two engaged in long and caustic polemic that was neither positive nor productive in any sense. These were difficult times for Bayle. His father and both brothers died within two years, one of the latter while languishing in a French jail because of Bayle's publications. He had also assumed editorship of one of the first of the learned journals, Nouvelles de la République des Lettres, the rigors of which contributed to his plight and the resulting breakdown he suffered in 1687.

Bayle's life, and the subsequent course of intellectual history, were dramatically altered by the publication of his Dictionnaire historique et critique, which began appearing in 1696. Certainly, Bayle's material situation was improved, not to mention that of his publisher, since the work was soon on its way to becoming the philosophical best-seller of the eighteenth century. Bayle was at last able to give up teaching. But what accounts for the success of this strange work? It is not a dictionary in the usual sense; rather it is a hodge-podge encyclopedia of intellectual curiosities, serious argument on a variety of topics, salacious stories, exacting textual scholarship, and much more that drew a readership hardly less diverse than its contents. To be sure, its entries are alphabetically arranged, but perhaps ninety-five percent of the work is to be found in the footnotes, called Ôremarks,’ that often bear little relation to the main text. Readers obviously dipped here and there into this massive work of nine million words, and had a wonderful time.

Not everyone was happy with the work, however. Unhappy were authorities in France, of course, where the proscribed work nonetheless showed up, and the reactionary Jurieu, who mobilized the Consistory of the Walloon Church in Rotterdam against Bayle, who was then constrained to publish Eclaircissements or “Clarifications” of his treatment of atheism, Manicheism, skepticism and obscenity. In addition to work for further editions of the Dictionnaire, Bayle's last years were spent in continued theological debate, now primarily with the Rationalist theologians Le Clerc, Jaquelot, and Bernard. Bayle, whose health had never been robust, died on 28 December 1706, probably of a heart attack precipitated by tuberculosis. He was putting the final touches to his Entretiens de Maxime et de Thémiste, the work which motivated Leibniz to write the only book he would ever publish, the Theodicy.

2. The Bayle enigma

There is a general problem in the interpretation of Bayle that has been acknowledged (and even insisted upon both by critics and admirers) in the literature from his own time to the present. It is a problem not just of deciding whether Bayle succeeded in what he was trying to do, which would be difficult enough given the charged topics that he often dealt with, but even and especially in deciding the nature of what he was trying to do. One might not go so far as to claim that meaning is author's intention (the so-called intentional fallacy), but it is hard to deny that author's intention is at least relevant to meaning. And what Bayle's intentions were has been a matter of debate from the beginning.

According to just the twentieth-century interpretations, Bayle might have been a positivist, an atheist, a deist, a skeptic, a fideist, a Socinian, a liberal Calvinist, a conservative Calvinist, a libertine, a Judaizing Christian, a Judeo-Christian, or even a secret Jew, a Manichean, an existentialist. To be sure, not all of these exclude the rest; for example, skepticism has often been associated with fideism. But atheism, for example, is certainly incompatible with deism and the other forms of theism. Moreover, there is at least some plausibility to all of these interpretations.

Perhaps one way of sorting out his cacophony is in terms of the distinction that Bayle himself drew between two kinds of philosophers: the lawyers, who represent their case in the best light possible and their opponents' in the worst, and the reporters, who tell it as it is, with respect to all views. Bayle might be a reporter, equitably relating all views, even those that are mutually inconsistent, especially in the Dictionnaire, which is the work on which the panoply of interpretations is largely based. When justifying himself to the Walloon Church over the obscenities alleged to be found there, he claimed not to be producing obscenities but only to be relating, as a good historian must, what others had produced. Even so, some of the views that he clearly purports to relate as a reporter are his own, both in the Dictionnaire and especially in the whole rest of his work, which deals almost exclusively with religious topics. And here there is a special problem of interpretation.

A case can be made that the logic of Bayle's various positions on toleration, evil, truth, substance and accident, lead ineluctably to atheism; yet Bayle constantly asserts his belief in the tenets of the Calvinist faith in which he was raised, and for which, not incidentally, he made such sacrifice. We are thus faced with an inconsistent triad: Bayle's clearly articulated and acknowledged principles entail atheism; Bayle does not accept atheism; Bayle is neither stupid nor dishonest. He sees the incompatibility of the first two claims, but nonetheless makes them (that is, Bayle neither nods nor winks).

From his own time to the present, it has been the third claim that has drawn closest scrutiny. Given the stressful period of the Revocation and its aftermath, the possibility of a nodding (or even crazed) Bayle has some plausibility. But it is a winking Bayle who came to be the “Arsenal of the Enlightenment.” Those looking to discredit religion and theism generally had only to focus on what is most obvious, consistent and rationally cogent in his work. If there are also claims there of Christian orthodoxy, they were taken as so much hand-waving dissimulation in an effort to slip the real message past censorious authorities. Whatever his intentions, this impulse toward modern atheism was Bayle's greatest single influence.

This interpretation was another of the topics on which Bayle had to defend himself before the Walloon Consistory. His defense in the Eclaircissement, and in fact throughout his work, was an appeal to a fideism that seems to have made incompatibility with reason a condition for an article of faith. Certainly, Bayle asserts that the value of faith is directly proportional with its repugnancy to reason. In this, Bayle was only pursuing a line to be found in Scripture, especially St. Paul, whom Bayle cites repeatedly and at length on the rational foolishness of faith in still another Eclaircissement, on Manicheanism and the problem of evil. Arguably, his is the only conception of faith that avoids the heresy of Pelagianism, according to which people are able to save themselves, independently of divine grace. For if we can reason ourselves to the truth (or even the probability, or plausibility) of what is believed on faith, and such belief is a sufficient condition for salvation, then, contrary to Calvinist doctrine, faith is not necessary. Of course, even this defense is open to the winking Bayle interpretation.

One way to express the issue, at least, is with respect to Bayle's reaction to the horrors of the Revocation. The fact is that after the death of his imprisoned brother, Bayle hardly ever again referred to divine providence. This silence is remarkable for one whose Calvinism dictated belief in strict predestination based on the sufficiency and necessity of grace. What ought to have been a consolation was ignored. Why? It might be that for him the Revocation came to represent the hypocrisy, not just of Roman Catholicism, but of Christianity and all religion—hypocrisy being the very failing condemned by the Gospel more than sins of the flesh or any other sin. The issue is epistemologically underdetermined by its very nature, for Bayle's behavior was compatible with both atheistic dissimulation and sincere fideism. This issue is also morally idle given Bayle's own view on toleration of dissenting belief, expressed by the scriptural injunction, judge not. Only God has the privileged access necessary to judge conscience.

3. Bayle's skepticism

Bayle has generally been regarded as a skeptic of some sort, but the sort has seldom been specified with any precision. Three kinds seem relevant. The most influential kind has already been alluded to, namely religious skepticism, which may be taken to mean that Bayle did not in fact believe all, or perhaps any, of the religious views that he asserted. The evidence for attributing such skepticism to Bayle could hardly be stronger. Such beliefs are, according to Bayle, contrary to reason. But the evidence against doing so is at least equipollent: Bayle claims, repeatedly and unequivocally, to be a believer. Those who take Bayle to be a religious skeptic discount this testimony as dissimulation. What the motive for it would be is unclear. Fear of censorship is implausible; Bayle hardly lacked for courage, and in any case did not have a great deal to fear in relatively liberal Holland. Moreover, that Bayle should have foreseen the skeptical influence he was to have on the Enlightenment credits him with an unlikely prescience and deviousness, making him, to use one of his own favorite expressions, a snake in the breast—indeed, the wiliest of them.

A more tractable and philosophically more interesting form of skepticism attributed to Bayle is Pyrrhonism. This interpretation has the advantage of reconciling his denigration of reason and profession of faith: the one is a preparation for the other. The principal text for Bayle's Pyrrhonism is the Dictionnaire article on Pyrrho, especially remarks B and C. There he argues that the same reasons that led the Cartesians to assert that sensory qualities such as colors, heat, cold and smells are not in the objects of the senses, but instead are modifications of the mind, in fact show that all qualities have this status. In fact, says Bayle, even granting that God is veridical, Descartes's proof of the external world itself is flawed. For, as Malebranche argued, in no way can belief in that world be based on the veracity of God, who in any case allows us to be deceived about sensory qualities, and who might therefore allow us to be deceived about all else in the world.

In this text Bayle also gives arguments that purport to show that reason itself is unreliable. Principles of reason that are as evident as could be are revealed as incompatible with what is known to be true. However, the examples that Bayle gives indicate the tenuousness of his Pyrrhonism. The principle that no human body can be in two places at once, or be interpenetrated by its own parts, is at odds with the doctrine of the real presence of Christ in the sacrament of the Eucharist. Now, this is the Catholic conception of the Eucharist, which Bayle himself rejects. In fact, all of the arguments emerge from a conversation that Bayle places between two Catholic priests, thus, for whatever reason, distancing himself from them. It has recently been argued in fact, that the reason Bayle distances himself in this way is that he is offering a reductio ad absurdum of Catholic fideism based on philosophical skepticism. That is, Bayle rejects even this ground-clearing role for skepticism as preparation for faith, since it would be an instance of Pelagianism.

Generally, Bayle's arguments concerning skepticism are highly contextualized. He offers no in vacuo critique of pure reason. The arguments usually occur in the Dictionnaire, whose entries offer some minimal constraint on what Bayle says, and they usually occur in religious debate of some sort, where the role of faith needs to be ascertained. Nor is there ever a wholesale rejection of reason, which would be paradoxical, given Bayle's use of argument. In the ancient world, Sextus Empiricus thought of argument as like a purgative that once having done its work is itself flushed away. Although he employs his own version of the medical model (reason is like a corrosive that first cleans a wound but then eats through flesh and bone to the very marrow), Bayle seems to have a very different view. Shifting analogies in response to the liberal Protestant Jacquelot, who had criticized his fideism as renouncing reason altogether, Bayle explained that individual defeats of reason entailed only a retreat to a more defensible position, something that happens all the time in philosophy. His assessment of reason, even in his most outré statements (reason is like a runner who does not know when the race is over, or like another Penelope undoing at night what was done during the day), is on a case-by-case basis, and whatever generalizations he offers are open to revision.

Bayle seems to espouse something of a holistic web of belief, of the Quine-Ullian sort, at least in the sense that cognitive antinomies are resolved by rejecting the principles causing them, beginning with those farthest from the center. Bayle, however, includes religious truths as at the very center, trumping all others. Another complication is that sometimes there seems no way to resolve the antinomies, as in the case of the divisibility of matter. The relevant maxims of reason seem equally central, yet yield an exhaustive and inconsistent triad of views, none of which is true. Unlike the Pyrrhonists, however, whose aim is to sustain antinomies, Bayle tries to resolve them. If there is the occasional standoff, Bayle's attitude is one of regret and patience, for he is interested in overcoming doubt, not generating it. The motivation he gave for the Dictionnaire, after all, was the correction of errors, confusion and doubt in previous such works.

The form of skepticism that seems best to capture this attitude is Academic skepticism, which is in fact the position he explicitly espouses when accused of Pyrrhonism by Jurieu. This skepticism is not the negative dogmatism, as defined by Sextus, that nothing can be known. Rather, it is the methodological position expressed by Cicero's injunction always to preserve the integrity of one's power of judgment; that is, not to dissipate it in accepting as true what one does not perceive to be true. In this sense, the first of Descartes's rules of method in the Discourse is an Academic principle, perhaps the only one: to avoid precipitateness and prejudice and to rely only on one's own ability to discern the truth. Integrity is a matter of honestly preserving the wholeness of one's own judgment.

Part of this outlook would be the reportorial role that Bayle assumes, of giving unimpeded voice to all views, even those that compete with his own. Only a lawyer would argue a single position to the exclusion of all others. Moreover, if this Academic skepticism were Bayle's outlook, he could not have espoused it as such, for to do so would be still another form of dogmatism. Thus, instead of defining, arguing and recommending Academic skepticism in any direct fashion, he would give instances if it, practice it himself and generally seek its promulgation through edification. This might be exactly what he does.

If Bayle doubts, he does so on a highly contingent and non-theoretical basis. He is prepared to accept what he finds to be evident, but the fact of the matter is that he does not find it very often, at least not in philosophy. In history, on the other hand, there is a kind of certainty appropriate to the domain that is often enough to be found. The Dictionnaire itself cannot be interpreted except as stupendous testimony to the ability of an individual to overcome passion and prejudice and arrive at historical truth—so much so that Bayle's historical method has been viewed by the literature as a form of Cartesianism, despite the Cartesians' own dismissal of history. Only in one domain, however, is anything like strictly Cartesian infallibility to be found, and that is morality. There, the individual conscience is inviolate. Even if it errs with respect to the objective moral character of an act, conscience, so long as it acts with integrity, cannot morally err and is to be respected. Such is the basis for Bayle's view on toleration.

4. Bayle on toleration

No philosophical topic occupied Bayle more than toleration. Many of the articles of his Dictionnaire deal with it, and most of the rest of his other works are directed either largely or entirely to the topic, most notably, his Commentaire philosophique. It is an area in which he clearly had a profound impact on the Enlightenment. Locke also might have found in Bayle, if not a source for his own views, then at least moral support for them, which he himself might have provided for Bayle. In any case, their views are very similar, even to the point of excluding Catholics from the provisions of toleration (although their theories provide little on behalf of this exclusion and much against it).

The toleration in question means religious toleration, although what is said about it can be extended to political and other forms of toleration. The question is whether someone whose sincere belief is perceived to be in error should be forced to change it. Bayle's view is that in this case of the erring conscience, as it was called, constraint, even in the perceived interest of the errant individual, is never justified. The relevance of this issue in the context of Huguenot persecution is obvious.

Bayle's direct arguments on behalf of toleration are not very convincing, however, at least not when taken in isolation. Consider, for example, his argument that if even the true church had the right to persecute the heretic, then every church would have that right, with the result that a heretical church would be in a position to persecute the true church. Quite apart from whether this conclusion is so obviously false as to serve as the reductio as absurdum that Bayle intends, his argument turns on an equivocation. A premise of the argument is that only if the true church believed that it was the true church would it be in a position to persecute, otherwise it would give up its position and join, or at least seek, what it would take to be the true church. But if this belief justified the true church, then it would justify every church that had it. The equivocation concerns the sense in which the true church might base its right to persecute. Certainly, only if a church believed itself to be the true church would it be in a position to exercise its putative right to persecute. But this is not to say that this belief by itself justifies the persecution. Such a view would beg the question against those who, like Jurieu, think that only the objective fact, in this case of actually being the true church, can ever justify.

Bayle is far more convincing when he generalizes from carefully articulated examples, the best of which is that of the wife of Martin Guerre. Bayle, whose native Le Carla was the next village over from the site of the actual events, would have known about the case from the local retelling of it, which has been continuous from the fifteenth century to the present. The short of the story is that Martin Guerre goes off to war, leaving behind his wife, child and problematic existence, and is replaced eight years later by an impostor who claims all his rights, including those of the marriage bed. According to Bayle, because she thinks the man is her husband, the wife, in ceding him those rights, not only is inculpable of an act that otherwise would be adulterous, but actually performs her duty. He concludes, more generally, “the erroneous conscience procures for error the same rights and privileges that the orthodox conscience procures for truth.”

An instructive curiosity is Bayle's handling of this case from the point of view of the impostor. Because the wife has an obligation to submit to him, the impostor has a right to treat her as his wife. But it does not follow, according to Bayle, that the impostor would be justified in exercising that right. The sort of case that he has in mind is the magistrate, and likely the church. With respect to their behavior there are two notions of right: immunity from punishment and justice. Whatever their pronouncements, they are to be obeyed; but they might yet be culpable before God. This distinction does not elucidate the case of Martin's Guerre's impostor, who is an authority of neither church nor state. But it does emphasize Bayle's contention that if the heretic has the duty to act according to conscience, then he has a right to do so; but if he has a right to do so, then everyone has a duty not to interfere. The individual conscience is autonomous and ought to be tolerated.

Even this position is less than straightforward, however, for it may happen that the individual conscience calls for persecution. Bayle seems not to have fully considered this case, but his best answer would seem to be that the conscientious persecutor should be restrained, but in a way that least poses a direct threat of temptation to conscience. That is, the conscience of even a persecutor must be respected, such that although it is regarded as mistaken, the individual should not be forced or even bribed to act against it. Rational persuasion to the contrary would seem to be the sole remedy recommendable by the alleged skeptic Bayle. What this case shows, in addition, is that while conscience is necessary for right action, it is not sufficient. It supplies a formal requirement, as it were, with the content of the act being determined on other grounds. To be told to act according to conscience is in effect to be told to do what one thinks is right. But arriving at what one thinks is right is another matter, involving reason, but also other factors such as grace or education, which for Bayle are not much different from a matter of luck.

5. The problem of evil

If a perfectly good and all-powerful God alone created everything in the universe, then why do pain, moral wickedness, and so many varieties of imperfection exist? Philosophers today refer to the family of issues raised by this question as “the problem of evil.” No other problem occupied Bayle more often than this one, and there is perhaps no thesis for which Bayle is more well-known than the skeptical claim that there is no rational resolution of this difficulty. Such skepticism can already be found in Bayle's earliest work, the 1675–77 Philosophy Course, in which Bayle argues that no available account of God's causal relation to sin and suffering answers the problem. Bayle again attacks theodicy (i.e. the attempt to answer the problem of evil), especially the Cartesian strand, in his 1679 Objectiones to Pierre Poiret's Cogitationes Rationales de Deo, Animo, et Malo. And both the 1682 Pensées diverses and 1686–88 Commentaire philosophique, though they primarily deal with superstition and toleration respectively, also positively engage God's causal role in evil and demonstrate the insoluble puzzles it raises.

But the centerpiece of any discussion of Bayle and the problem of evil must be the Dictionnaire, particularly the articles “Manichéens” and “Pauliciens” of the first edition, and the “Eclaircissement sur les Manichéens” of the second. It is in these texts that Bayle attempts to refute every theodicy he had yet encountered, thereby demonstrating the incapacity of reason, especially within the confines of Christian dogma, to explain the origin of evil in a way that does not make God its sole author. The suggestion that reason leads us ineluctably to the conclusion that God is morally responsible for all evil was found so scandalous that Bayle was forced to spend the last decade of his life defending himself against charges of atheism and even sedition on account of it. The Rationalist theologians Jean Le Clerc and Isaac Jaquelot were Bayle's principal adversaries, and their objections to Bayle, as well as their attempts at theodicy, prompted him to expand his skeptical reflections on evil in subsequent books, including the Réponses aux questions d'un provincial and the posthumous Entretiens de Maxime et de Thémiste. These final works were the occasional cause of Leibniz's Theodicy, as well as the inspiration for (and source for many of the arguments of) Voltaire's satirical novella, Candide, several chapters of Hume's Dialogues concerning Natural Religion, and possibly Kant's late essay, On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy.

Bayle's controversial “doctrine” on the problem of evil that caused so much commotion was carefully summarized by Bayle himself in three points:

1. The natural light and revelation teach us clearly that there is only one principle of all things, and that this principle is infinitely perfect; 2. The way of reconciling the moral and physical evil of humanity with all the attributes of this single, infinitely perfect principle of all things surpasses our philosophical lights, such that the Manichean objections leave us with difficulties that human reason cannot resolve; 3. Nevertheless, it is necessary to believe firmly that what the natural light and revelation teach us about the unity and infinite perfection of God, just as believe by faith and submission to divine authority the mysteries of the Trinity and the Incarnation. (OD III, 992b-993a)

The first principle was a common supposition in Bayle's day, and so obviously caused no controversy. Nevertheless, Bayle argued on behalf of the principle in “Manichéens,” remark D, in passages that render more precise the nature of Bayle's skepticism about theodicy. Bayle imagines a monotheist philosopher, Melissus, arguing with a dualist philosopher, Zoroaster, over the origin of evil. The dispute begins with a contest over a priori arguments. In other words, the first question raised is whether one principle of creation or two is most in accord with ideas of pure reason. Melissus wins this particular debate, in Bayle's view, because it is more agreeable to a priori reason to suppose that there is just one necessary and infinitely perfect being responsible for the creation of the universe than to suppose that there are two warring gods, one good and the other evil (which is the view of Bayle's fictionalized Zoroaster). Melissus' monotheism is, in short, simpler and more elegant than Zoroaster's dualism.

The contentious elements of Bayle's doctrine begin to surface when the debate then turns to a posteriori reasons; that is, once the question shifts away from the beauty of the theory to its ability to account for the observable phenomena. In this debate Melissus fares worse than his interlocutor, since human reason finds “the manner in which evil was introduced under the empire of a sovereign being, infinitely good, infinitely holy, and infinitely powerful … not only inexplicable, but even incomprehensible; and everything that is opposed to the reasons why this being permitted evil is more agreeable to the natural light and to the ideas of order than these reasons are” (Dictionnaire, “Pauliciens,” rem. E). Simplicity and elegance are now on the side of Zoroaster (and the Manichean tradition that followed him, if Bayle's history is correct), for whom all the good in the world is traceable to a perfectly benevolent deity, while all the evil is the effect of his malevolent enemy. Therefore, whereas a priori reason and Christian Scripture point toward monotheism (Bayle's first principle), a posteriori reason raises perpetual difficulties for this picture in light of the way the world actually is (Bayle's second principle).

Some of the most notorious remarks in the Dictionnaire are those in which Bayle details how a dualist could refute the traditional Christian accounts of the origin of evil, most of which begin from the story of the Fall of Adam and Eve in the Garden of Eden. Bayle begins his critique by asking how such a Fall was even metaphysically possible. If Adam and Eve were created wholly good, then they should not have had the capacity to sin, since such a capacity is hardly a good quality. But supposing an answer to this worry could be given, Bayle moves on to demand why God would permit the possibility of sin to reduce to an actual sin, considering the terrible consequences that befell humanity as a result of it. The most common response to this question was that God had given human beings free will, the most generous divine gift of all, and the autonomy of which God willed to respect in order to make true worship and love of him possible. Bayle's response again focuses on the metaphysical possibility of the explanation: can a creature that derives all its being from God ever act in a manner that is truly free? Even supposing an account of freedom could be offered to answer this question, Bayle still finds the free-will defence unsatisfying on account of God's alleged omniscience. Surely God foresaw the first sin of humankind from all eternity, yet he created humans with freedom anyway. Is this not comparable, Bayle asks, to supplying a criminal with a knife knowing full-well that he will commit murder with it? If so, the responsibility for the murder falls at least partially on the supplier of the weapon. But perhaps God allowed humans to fall so that he could send his Son to redeem them. To this last resort of the Christians-the felix culpa theodicy-Bayle observes that God in this case would resemble a father who allowed his son to break his arm (though he could have prevented it) just so that he could display his skill at cast-making to the neighbors. Or God would be like a king who permitted a deadly uprising just so he could demonstrate his ability to quell it. God would not appear infinitely perfect on any of these hypotheses.

Such reflections demonstrate the need for Bayle's third principle (assuming that one is interested in upholding Christian monotheism). The origin of evil, like the Trinity, is a mystery fraught with endless difficulties. On Bayle's view of religious mysteries, which he lays out at the beginning of his Eclaircissement sur les Manichéens, philosophical objections to mysteries are nothing troubling, but merely serve to confirm that God's mind infinitely surpasses human minds. If there were no insoluble philosophical objections to mysteries, then there would be nothing mysterious about the doctrines in question-reason could answer every difficulty, and could claim equality with God's own mind. For these reasons Bayle conflated the traditional categories of “above reason” and “against reason,” claiming that mysteries were necessarily both. Reason is consequently useless, even pernicious, as a basis for belief in the mysteries, and so must be replaced by simple faith (Bayle's third principle).

Bayle's most able philosophical critic on these issues during his lifetime was Jean Le Clerc, who argued that Bayle's doctrine on the problem of evil was intentionally subversive of religion. The basis of Le Clerc's accusation of atheism against Bayle was his claim that it is not pyschologically possible to continue to believe some doctrine after one has conceded that it is met with insoluble difficulties. If this psychology of belief were true, then the second principle of Bayle's doctrine would destroy belief in monotheism because, by supposition, it would be impossible to believe in the unity of God after acknowledging the irresistible force of the Manicheans' objections. In response to Le Clerc Bayle argued in his posthumous Entretiens de Maxime et de Thémiste that it is not only psychologically possible to believe in a proposition that has been defeated in argument, but also very common. Bayle points to the debate over the continuum to illustrate his thesis. Those engaged in the debate over whether lines are infinitely divisible or ultimately reducible to points of finite size recognize that there are insoluble paradoxes opposed to each point of view. Yet there are adherents of both views all the same, which demonstrates, by historical fact, that it is possible to believe in a proposition (e.g. “lines are infinitely divisible”) despite recognizing unanswerable difficulties (e.g. Zeno's paradoxes). Far from a recommendation of adopting irrational fideism in response to the problem of evil, Bayle therefore believed he was urging the same rational retreat from certain debates that philosophers are commonly forced into when they argue about labyrinthine philosophical topics like the continuum.

6. Bayle's influence

Bayle undeniably had an enormous influence given the wide readership of his work; but the precise nature of that influence, even in individual cases, remains a desideratum of research. Bayle's connections with Locke, Leibniz, Kant and the Enlightenment have already been at least suggested. Here the debt to him of Berkeley and Hume will be looked at.

The literature regards Bayle, not only as an original source for the Enlightenment, but as a conduit of the views and arguments of his immediate predecessors in the seventeenth century. A good example of where Bayle's role has not been made precise is his discussion of the primary-secondary quality distinction. Bayle is supposed to have conveyed Foucher's arguments against the distinction to Berkeley and Hume. The contention is that just as Malebranche produced arguments to show that secondary qualities exist only in the mind, so his critic Foucher extended those same arguments to show that primary qualities also exist only in the mind. In fact, however, the arguments that Foucher actually deployed were directed less against Malebranche, whom he took simply to assume the distinction, than against Descartes and especially Rohault. His point was not to undo the distinction, but to show that however it was understood, it was incompatible with Cartesian dualism.

It was Bayle himself in the famous note B of the Pyrrho article who took Foucher to be extending Malebranche's arguments: “if the objects of our senses appear to us coloured, hot, cold, smelling, tho' they are not so, why should they not appear extended and figured, at rest, and in motion, though they had no such thing.” Although a parallel is established, the argument is obviously not very strong. Now, the most notable mutatis mutandis argument employed by Berkeley against the distinction is based on the relativity of sense perception: the perception of both varies under varying conditions, so if the variation of secondary qualities is a reason to place them in the mind, it is also a reason to place the primary in the mind. This argument is not to be found in Foucher or in this article, but it does appear in note G of the Zeno article, unconnected with Foucher: “the modern Philosophers, though they are no Sceptics,” have made secondary qualities no more than perceptions in the mind; “why should we not say the same thing of extension?” Bayle again deploys the weak parallel argument above, and then continues: “Observe also, that the same body appears to us little or great, round or square, according to the place from whence we view it: and certainly, a body which seems to us very little, appears very great to fly.” A problem for this text as a source for Berkeley is that this very argument is to be found better presented in Malebranche, who is cited here along with other moderns such as Lamy and Nicole, who are supposed to be undone by it. Given that Malebranche is cited by Berkeley more often by Berkeley's notebooks than anyone but Locke, it would seem more likely that Berkeley went straight to Malebranche for his arguments on the primary-secondary distinction.

A stronger connection between Berkeley and Bayle would be the text itself, and especially note H, of the same Zeno article. By appeal to theoretical parsimony, according to Bayle, “the Cartesians may maintain that no such thing as matter exists; for whether it doth or doth not exist, God could equally communicate to us all the thought we have.” Such divine communication is, of course, precisely what Berkeley was to advocate. Moreover, Bayle in note G extends Zeno's argument against motion by denying that extension exists. His argument is that extension cannot be composed of mathematical points or of atoms, nor can it be infinitely divisible. It remains an open question how this squares with Berkeley's comment in his notebooks, which he repeats there, that “Malebranche's & Bayle's arguments do not seem to prove against Space, but onely Bodies.” The only other time Bayle is mentioned in Berkeley's entire work is in the Theory of Vision Vindicated, where he is mentioned, with Hobbes, Spinoza and Leibniz, as an author whose popularity shows how atheistic principles have taken root.

That Bayle exercised an enormous influence on Hume is beyond doubt. Not long before publishing his Treatise, Hume drew the attention of his friend Michael Ramsey to four texts that would facilitate his reading of it. One of them was “the more metaphysical Articles of Bailes [sic] Dictionary; such as those [on] Zeno, & Spinoza.” Now, it is conceivable that Hume encountered these texts, and recognized their propaedeutic value, only after completing his Treatise; but this bare possibility (the letter was written two years before its publication) is absolutely ruled out in the case of Bayle, if not of the other texts Hume names, by Hume's so-called early memoranda and especially by the use (unacknowledged, as was typical for the period) that he actually makes of Bayle's work in the text itself.

Of the philosophical entries in the early memoranda, about half deal with Bayle. Even more important are the textual uses of Bayle. Kemp Smith long ago drew attention to five issues on which, in his view, Bayle had an unquestionable influence on Hume. First, from the article “Zeno” Hume takes Bayle's tripartite division of the possible ways that space and time might be constituted: from mathematical points, or from physical points, or as infinitely divisible. But whereas Bayle argued in no uncertain terms that none of these possibilities was rationally defensible, Hume in effect opts for physical points with his conception of indivisible minima sensibilia (colored points, in the case of space). Although the result is a non-standard account of geometry as an inexact science, Hume thinks that he thereby preserves reason from otherwise irresolvable antinomies.

Second, Hume is supposed to have been influenced by Bayle's historical account of the types of skepticism and his own use of skeptical argument in attacking orthodox positions. Bayle's position on skepticism has been discussed above. It may not be too misleading to describe Hume's resolution of skeptical difficulties in terms of “taste and sentiment” as a naturalistic version of Bayle's supernaturalistic resolution in terms of grace that was described by the same phrase.

A third connection concerns the metaphysics of substance, mode and identity. Hume takes from the article “Spinoza” the objections Bayle lodged against Spinoza's “hideous hypothesis” that there is but a single substance which is God, and applies these objections to the view that humans possess a soul that is a simple, indivisible and immaterial substance. The whole of Hume's argument in three stages and two rebuttals of a reply is lifted from Bayle. Both the unique substance and the substantial soul are supposed to be indivisible, yet are really identical to the extension that is their mode, hence are divisible; both have contrary properties; etc. The upshot is that just as Spinoza's hypothesis is “unintelligible,” so is the theologians' supposition concerning the soul.

Fourth, Kemp Smith draws attention to the discussion of animal intelligence in the article “Rorarius.” In this instance, the influence of Bayle is less clear. Presumably, he had in mind chapter nine of the Enquiry; but here one finds as the main exercise an application of the argument by analogy with an emphasis on the importance of experience. There is, however, an ultimate appeal to instinct to explain the cognitive behavior of both men and animals. And here Bayle might have played a role, alluded to immediately above.

Finally, Hume might have been influenced by Bayle's treatment of religious questions, especially the argument from design. This is an exceedingly vexed area because of the questionable orthodoxy of Bayle's views and the expression of them. Many of the same ambiguities, of course, infect Hume's views on these questions, although his heterodoxy seems far less debatable.


[Note: a year-by-year list of everything published on Bayle during the twentieth century is to be found below in Mori, 1999.]

A. Primary literature

B. Primary literature in translation

C. Secondary literature

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Enlightenment | evil: problem of | skepticism | toleration