Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Assertion

Speech Acts

Bach and Harnich's scheme is similar to Searle's. In general, Bach and Harnich distinguish between illocutionary types according to the type of expressed attitude (cf. section 6.1). There are four top categories: constatives, directives (including questions and prohibitives), commissives (promises, offers) and acknowledgments (apologize, condole, congratulate) (1979, 41). Constatives ‘express the speaker's belief and his intention that the hearer have or form a like belief’ (1979, 41). The category of constatives includes the subtypes, in Bach and Harnich's terms, of assertives, predictives, retrodictives, descriptives, ascriptives, informatives, confirmatives, concessives, retractives, assentives, dissentives, disputatives, responsives, suggestives and suppositives (1979, 41).

In this list predictives are distinguished by concerning the future and retrodictives by concerning the past, dissentives by the fact that the speaker is disagreeing with what was earlier said by the hearer, and so on. Assertives, according to this taxonomy, is not distinguished from other constatives by any such feature. As Bach and Harnich point out (1979, 44) most of the specialized types of constatives satisfy their definition of assertives (see section 7). This type then stands out as a higher category, including most but not all of the constatives; not for instance suggestives (suggesting, conjecturing) and suppositives (assuming, stipulating).

One major question that has come up in connection with semantic theories concerns the status of assertion among the speech act categories. Truth theoretic or other systematic semantic theories most often specify the meaning of declarative sentences, as opposed to imperative and interrogative. There is a corresponding focus on assertion as more central to linguistic meaning than any other illocutionary type.

This has led to a discussion about whether there could have been a linguistic practice with only assertions, or a linguistic practice without assertions (cf. Dummett 1981, 601). A positive answer to the first question and negative to the second was thought to justify the central meaning theoretical importance of assertion. Such a discussion is, however, of questionable value. It is part of normal human social existence to need and want to share information as well as to seek information (by questions) and to give directions of various kinds. Only in quite degenerate forms of existence could the need of either kind be absent, and there is no saying what sort of language, if any, humans would have or retain under such conditions.

The focus on declaratives in semantics may be a matter of convenience, due to the fact they will have to be taken account of anyway. For instance, a conditional question, of the shorthand form ‘[if p, then q]?’, would take the natural English form either of a conditional with interrogative antecedent and declarative consequent, as in

Can ships fall over the edge, if the Earth is flat?

or with a propositional interrogative prefix, followed by a declarative conditional, as in

Is it the case that, if the Earth is flat, then ships can fall over the edge?

Similarly with imperatives. By constrast, the declarative fragment of natural English is self-contained, and not limited in propositional expressive power. Hence it is convenient to focus on declaratives.

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