Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Assertion

Logic and Assertion

Below we shall look a little closer at these aspects of logic and assertion.

1. Assumptions

In his work on deduction (1934–35), Gentzen also introduced the Sequent Calculus, with so-called sequents,

(1) A1, …, AnB1, …, Bm

as the asserted sentences of the calculus. Gentzen originally explained the meaning of the arrow as

(2) A1 & … & AnB1 ∨ … ∨ Bm

By this explanation a sequent is an ordinary construction of propositional logic. However, later on (1934–35, §4), Gentzen introduced another use of the arrow for a Natural Deduction notation:

(3) A1, …, AnA

Here there is only a single formula in the succedent. This is a sentence form apt for making claims, and it is correct just if there is exists a Natural Deduction derivation from the assumptions A1, …, An to the conclusion A. So the arrow is no longer to be interpreted as an ordinary implication construction, but indicates that the succedent is derivable from the antecedent, or that the succedent can be asserted on the basis of the antecedent as a sequence of assumptions. On this interpretation, it is like moving Frege's assertion sign from a sentence initial position, making an assertion depend on assumptions. The question is how to understand this.

In Natural Deduction, as well as in informal reasoning, we make assumptions and infer new propositions on the basis of those assumptions, as in

(4)   Suppose there is life on Mars.
In that case, there must also be water on Mars.

This natural language rendering of the inference step would in a Natural Deduction setting (with the same informal language) look like this:

(5)   There is life on Mars

There is water on Mars

It is clear that assuming that p is something different from asserting that p. But it is less clear how to regard the concluding. We cannot simply say that it is of a separate kind, namely inferring or concluding that p. For the difference at issue is precisely between inferring something from premises that are already established, or that one at least asserts or believes, in which case one does assert the conclusion, and inferring something from premises that are only assumed. In the latter case one does not simply assert the conclusion.

One suggestion is that the conclusion is conditionally asserted, i.e. conditionally on the truth of the premise. More fully, the idea is that if the premise is true, the conclusion is asserted, and if the premise is false, the conclusion is not asserted, nor advanced in any other way. This is completely implausible, however. The conclusion may serve as an essential middle step of a longer argument, such as

(6)   There is life on Mars

There is water on Mars

If there is life on Mars,  then there is water on Mars

The conclusion, on the third line, is formed by the rule of implication introduction from the preceding derivation. The conclusion is (unconditionally) asserted, on the basis of the preceding step from the first to the second line, i.e. from the initial assumption to the intermediate conclusion. The intermediate conclusion depends on the assumption, but the final conclusion does not. But suppose that there is no life on Mars. Then, on the conditional assertion understanding, nothing at all is achieved in the second line: no assertion is made, nor any advancing of the proposition in any other way whatsoever. That is, it is as if no inferential step is taken. But that the proposition (that there is water on Mars) is advanced in some way or other is essential for reaching the final conclusion in the second inference step. The first step cannot simply be void.

We shall return below to the idea of conditional assertion in connection with conditionals (also, however, in Barker 1995, there is a non-standard use of ‘conditional assertion’ which largely agrees with what is called ‘hypothetical assertion’ below).

Maybe one could see the advancing of the proposition that there is water on Mars, in (5), as an assertion of the proposition as depending on the truth of the premise that there is life on Mars. That is, the act taken would be an assertion proper, but the object would not be simply a proposition, but a qua object, the proposition qua depending on the truth of the premise. But this is not a viable option either, even apart from general doubts about qua objects, since inferring that there is water on Mars from the premise that there is life on Mars in no way implies that the truth of the conclusion depends on the truth of the premise. There might well be water on Mars without any life on Mars, and the speaker who makes the inference is not required to think otherwise.

So neither the truth of the conclusion, nor the assertoric force itself, seems to depend or be conditional on the truth of the premise. It remains, I think, two main alternatives. The first I shall call the Prawitz-Stalnaker alternative, which consists in viewing the conclusion as asserted under an assumption. This amounts to a generalization of the concept of assertion. Stalnaker 1975, 65) makes an explicit distinction between the concepts of assertion and hypothetical assertion, and the latter is a conclusion drawn from an assumption (supposition).

The other I shall call the Martin-Löf-Sundholm alternative. It consists in viewing inferring from assumptions as advancing a sequent-like content of the form (3), i.e. A1, …, AnA. This is what Martin-Löf (e.g. 1998, 108) has called a hypothetical judgment. It is supposed to be distinct from the assertion of a corresponding propositional implication

(7) A1 & … & AnA

Viewed this way, the argument (6) is recast as

(8)   Life on Mars   → Life on Mars

Life on Mars   → Water on Mars

→ Life on Mars ⊃  Water on Mars

(with ‘there is’ left implicit) where we have hypothetical judgments on the first and second line, and a categorical judgment of an implication on the third line.

These two approaches have complementary virtues and vices as regards conservatism. The Prawitz-Stalnaker view is conservative about contents, but generalizes the concept of an assertion, while the Martin-Löf view is conservative about assertion but generalizes the notion of assertoric content (this is done anyway in Martin-Löf's type theory). The Prawitz-Stalnaker view is closer to the surface form of natural language reasoning.

A possible way to flesh out the Prawitz-Stalnaker view is to add the idea that if a speaker S hypothetically asserts that q on the assumption that p and then adds the assertion that p, then S has also, indirectly, asserted categorically that q. The net result is the same as on the Martin-Löf-Sundholm alternative, except that in this case an inference is required to reach categorical judgment/assertion.

Then, if we look at the little argument (5), we can see the advancing of the conclusion as an assertion, of the proposition that there is water on Mars, hypothetical in case the premise is only assumed, and categorical in case the premise is itself asserted. In this way we could see hypothetical force as in a sense functional: hypothetical assertoric force is a function that takes a categorical assertion of the premise as argument and yields a categorical assertion of the conclusion as value. This would be an analogy to functional analyses in other areas, in e.g. categorial grammar and proof theory, since hypothetical force must be seen as a structured entity. It fits well with regarding force as an abstract category, related to but not identical with elements of speaker psychology.

2 Conditionals

The so-called paradoxes of the material conditional have shown that there are discrepancies between the use of ordinary indicative conditionals, such as

(9) If Reagan lost the 1980 election, he lost because people who didn't like him voted for him

and the meaning of a material conditional such as

(10) Reagan lost the 1980 election ⊃ he lost because people who didn't like him voted for him

Since the antecedent is false, the material conditional (10) is true, but the conditional (9) does not appear highly assertible. Not even the fact that we have excellent evidence that the antecedent is false makes us inclined to accept an assertoric use of it.

The discrepancies also show up in reasoning, especially in combination with the use of negation. The following is an example from Dorothy Edgington (1995, 281):

(11) If God does not exist, then it's not the case that if I pray my prayers will be answered. I do not pray. Therefore God exists.

If the conditional is material, then the negated conditional is equivalent with a conjunction of the antecedent and the negation of the consequent. So understood, the argument is valid.

If good evidence for the truth of the material conditional does not make a natural language conditional correctly assertible, what does? Good evidence by subjective standards for the truth of proposition can be equated with high subjective probability for that proposition. Ernest Adams (1965, 176–77) proposed that a conditional if A, then B is assertible just if the corresponding conditional subjective probability of B given A, p(B|A), is high. This has come to be known as Adams' Thesis, and it is widely accepted (as usual, p(B|A) is equal to p(A&B)/p(A), in case p(A) is positive, and undefined otherwise). Many examples in the literature illustrate that p(B|A) may be low even though p(AB) is high. Frank Jackson has the following (1979, 568):

(12) If the sun goes out of existence in ten minutes time, the earth will not be plunged into darkness in eighteen minutes time.

The conditional probability of the consequent given the antecedent is low, but the probability of the corresponding material conditional is high, simply because the probability of the falsity of the antecedent and of the truth of the consequent are both high.

As noted above, the standard idea of of correct assertibility is that an assertion is correct provided there is good evidence for the truth of the proposition asserted. In terms of subjective probability, it is correct iff the subjective probability is high. This equivalence is violated, given Adams' Thesis, if natural language conditionals are material conditionals. Two strategies that have been employed in response are directly relevant for the theory of assertion. The first is to modify the correctness conditions for assertions of conditionals, or even assertions in general. The second is to claim that what looks like an assertion of a proposition expressed by declarative sentence really is a speech act of another type: a conditional assertion. We shall briefly look at these below.

Modify correctness conditions

Grice suggested (1975) that there is a conversational explanation of why a conditional, when interpreted materially, can fail to be assertible even though something from which it follows, like the negation of its antecedent, is assertible. Asserting Jackson's (12) on the basis of the high subjective probability of the falsity of the antecedent would be misleading, since what one asserts is logically weaker than the proposition on which the assertion is based: AB follows from ¬A, but not conversely. Therefore, the hearer is lead to believe that the grounds for the assertion are other than they in fact are.

This line won sympathy. David Lewis (1976) followed and elaborated Grice's idea. According to Lewis (1976, 142–43), two factors detract from assertibility of a conditional if A, then B: first, that the probability of vacuity pA) is high, and second that the probability of falsity pB&A) is a large fraction of the probability of non-vacuity (p(A). The product

(13) pA) · pB & A) / p(A)

of these factors gives a measure of the reduction of assertibility, and the resulting degree of assertibility is

(14) p(AB) − (pA) · pB & A) / p(A))

This in turn is equal to p(B|A), in accordance with Adams' Thesis.

Lewis's application of Grice gave a kind of explanation of Adams' Thesis. In Lewis (1986b), however, Lewis retracts his account in favor a related one offered by Jackson (1979). Jackson criticizes the principle that one assert the stronger instead of the weaker, and provides counterexamples such as

(15) If the sun goes out of existence in ten minutes, the earth will be plunged into darkness in about eighteen minutes.

(1979, 567). Here both the negation of the antecedent and the conditional have probabilities close to 1, with the latter only marginally greater. So this would be a case where the maxim of asserting the logically stronger should apply. But (15) is highly assertible (as it also is on Lewis's account, but not by the simple maxim). Jackson instead advocates the idea that we as speakers aspire to two things: a high probability of the proposition asserted and robustness. Robustness of a proposition A with respect to another B amounts to preservation of high probability of A given the truth of B. The official definition is then that A is robust with respect to B iff p(A) and p(A|B) are close and high (Jackson 1979, 569).

This is applied to the case of conditionals with the further idea that assertions of natural language conditionals are made both with claiming the truth of the corresponding material conditional and to signal that this conditional is robust with respect to its own antecedent (1979, 576). Given this combination, and the definition of robustness, the resulting assertibility of AB is high provided the robustness condition is met, i.e. provided p(AB | A) is high, and since (A & (AB)) ≡ (A & B), we also have

(16) p(AB | A) = p(B|A)

and the requirement of Adams' Thesis is met.

Both Lewis's and Jackson's accounts are successful in combining a material interpretation of indicative conditionals with adherence to Adams' Thesis. Still, from an assertion theoretic point of view, both appear somewhat ad hoc. They propose special rules for the assertibility of conditionals, and ultimately one would want such rules motivated from general consideration about assertion, but it is not clear how that should be done.

We find a more general pragmatic motivation in Stalnaker's account (Stalnaker 1975). Stalnaker provides truth conditions for conditionals ‘if A, then B’ in his possible worlds framework, including his notion of a conversational context set (cf. section 2.1 of the main text). Stalnaker then provides the following rule for asserting indicative conditionals (1975, 71):

(RSI)   It is appropriate to make an indicative conditional statement or supposition only in a context which is compatible with the antecedent.

Stalnaker immediately comments: ‘In effect, this says that counterfactual conditionals must be expressed in the subjunctive’ (italics in the original).

Together with properties of Stalnaker's possible worlds semantics in terms of a selection function, and the pragmatic requirement on the selection function, the result is, as Stalnaker says:

… the indicative and the material conditional are equivalent in the following sense: in any context where either might be appropriately asserted, the one is accepted, or entailed by the context, if and only if the other is accepted, or entailed by the context.… [T]hey coincide only in their assertion and acceptance condition, and not in their truth conditions. (Stalnaker 1975, 72–73)

The assertibility restriction (RSI) saves the account from the ordinary problems with the assertibility conditions of material conditionals. However, if Jackson is right that (15), which is indicative, is highly assertible, then the (RSI) restriction is too strong.

Conditional assertion

An alternative strategy is to simply give up the idea that utterances of conditionals are properly assertoric at all. Minimally, this amounts to the view that advancing a conditional is not putting forth a proposition as true, i.e. it is not an assertion in the usual sense. So views by which conditionals are not propositional, or don't have truth conditions, are views of this kind. Defenders include Adams (1965) Edgington (1995), Appiah (1985), Bennett (2003).

You take a further step by providing an alternative speech act account. One proposal of this kind has been prominent: that such utterances are conditional assertions, not assertions proper. The standard idea of a conditional assertion is that an assertion of B conditional on A is an assertion of B if A is true, and no assertion at all if A is false. Early suggestions that an utterance of a conditional is to be understood as a conditional assertion were made by Quine (1952, 19, crediting Philip Rhinelander), and by G. H. von Wright (1957, 130). A fuller and more systematic treatment was given by Nuel Belnap (1973). It is defended by Edgington (1995, 288–91). The idea is applied in an account of so-called biscuit conditionals by DeRose and Grandy (1999). For a more comprehensive history, see Milne 1997.

The description that a conditional assertion is an assertion of the consequent provided the antecedent is true is highly misleading. On this description, if speaker X utters if A, then C and speaker Y utters if B, then C, then if both A and B are true X and Y have done the very same thing, namely asserted C. Similarly, if both A and B are false, then again on this description they have done the same thing, namely made no assertion. But clearly they have made utterances of different kinds, with different significance, in either case. So what we should say is that if the antecedent is true, the conditional assertion generates an assertion of the consequent, and does not generate anything if the antecedent is false. This takes care of the immediate difficulty.

One question is how a conditional assertion is to be evaluated. Stalnaker (2006) provides a brief survey over possible answers. Four different answers come from four different answers to how categorical assertions are evaluated. Stalnaker considers the norm of truth (rule (T) of section 5.4), the norm of knowledge (rule (K) of section 6.2), the norms of justification and commitment (cf. Brandom's proposal in section 7), and the norm of subjective probability (the higher the subjective probability, the better). Then, for instance, if there is basic norm governing assertion and it is that what is asserted be true, then in case the antecedent of the conditional is true, the act is evaluated according to whether the consequence is true, given the context. Analogously for the other three alternatives. But what if the antecedent is false? Stalnaker speaks of temporarily adding the antecedent proposition to the context, and then evaluating the consequent assertion. Then it might happen that no evaluation is forthcoming. But it is not clear whether Stalnaker thinks that there is no evaluation in case the antecedent is in fact false, or whether it fails just in case the addition of the antecedent to the context set does not yield a verdict (in the latter case, I guess, background theory must be taken into account).

In case it depends on the truth of the antecedent whether a categorical assertion has been made at all, there is a corresponding difficulty about the truth of the antecedent: a speaker may fail to know what assertions she has made, because of not knowing the truth of the antecedents of her conditional assertions. This is counterintuitive. Similarly, concerning linguistic interaction, Dummett objected (1981, 341; 1991, 115) that the idea of a conditional assertion is like the idea of handing someone an envelope saying ‘open in case of A’, and when opened proves to contain a letter saying ‘⊢ B’. He first comments that there is no such linguistic device, but retracts after considering conditional bets and conditional commands. Clearly, if the condition of a conditional bet is unfulfilled, then the bet is simply off. It doesn't have to be concealed what bet it would have been, had the condition been met. Dummett therefore does not find any knock-down argument against the very idea of a conditional assertion.

There are, however, specific problems concerning the application of the idea of conditional assertion for the account of ‘if, then’ constructions. These chiefly concern the embedding of such constructions in more complex sentences. As Dummett, Edgington and others have pointed out, it is difficult to make intuitive sense of conditionals that themselves have conditionals as antecedents, such as

(17) If, if Barcelona beats Real, then Barcelona will beat Dynamo, then Lazio will beat Dynamo

This might indicate that conditionals are made for assertoric contexts alone. However, in some other non-assertoric cases it is a lot easier, such as

(18) It holds either that if Barcelona beats Real, then Barcelona will beat Dynamo too, or that if Lazio beats Dynamo, then Lazio will beat Borussia as well

The speaker of (18) does not advance either of the conditionals. Since (18) is fairly easy to understand, one may wonder whether the problem with (17) is not merely a processing problem due to the complexity of the sentence, rather than qualitative difference (for the intuition, assume that there is a successful coach who will soon sign up either for Barcelona or for Lazio; if he signs up for Barcelona, the first disjunct will be believed, and if he signs up for Lazio, the second).

There are further problems for the conditional assertion account of indicative conditionals with embedding the ‘if, (then)’ particle in quantified contexts, as in

(19) If any player shows up late, he will be kicked out of the team

(19) is not a conditional, but a quantified conditional. An utterance of it cannot be regarded as a conditional assertion, since the consequent does not express a self-contained proposition. Nonetheless, it does not seem hard to understand.

These difficulties are handled in Belnap (1973). Belnap develops the semantics for conditional assertion pretty much as a three-valued possible worlds semantics. A sentence s at a world w is either non-assertoric or expresses a proposition. The semantics is given recursively over sentence complexity. For instance, a negative sentence ¬A is assertoric just if the negated sentence A is assertoric, and what is asserted is the negation of what is asserted by A. This accords with Adams' Thesis for simple conditionals, on the assumptions that (i) Adams' Thesis concerns conditional assertibility rather than assertibility proper, and that (ii) negation inverts conditional assertibility.

In the case of the universal quantifier, the clause is

(20) 1. ∀xAx is assertivew just in case for some tC, At is assertivew
2. (∀xAs)w = & {(At)w: At is assertivew}tC

Applied to (19), this means that an assertion is generated, in a world w, only if there are terms t1, …, tn, 1 ≤ n, such that titie‘shows up late’ is true at w, for 1 ≤ in. It further means that what is asserted in w is the conjunction of what is asserted in w by titie‘will be kicked out of the team’, for 1 ≤ in. Hence if Bill and George show up late, what is asserted is that

(21) Bill will be kicked out of the team and George will be kicked out of the team

and if nobody shows up late, nothing is asserted.

This is counterintuitive, since a speaker S might agree with (21) but may want to express denial of (19) by means of stating its negation

(22) It is not the case that, if any player shows up late, he will be kicked out of the team.

The reason might be the speaker thinks it holds for every team member except for Harry:

(23) Harry is on the team, and Harry will show up late, but he will not be kicked out of the team.

S might have excellent reasons for this belief, and from (23), S validly infers (22). However, by Belnap's clauses, if Bill and George show up late but Harry doesn't, what S has asserted by means of uttering (22) is that

(24) It is not the case that (Bill will be kicked out of the team and George will be kicked out of the team)

and this is even more counterintuitive: S is represented as inconsistent because of both asserting and denying that Bill and George will be kicked out of the team.

In a slightly different format, focusing on existential rather than universal quantification, this argument was advanced by Kölbel (2000) against Edgington and Belnap. Edgington (2000) responds that she has no general method for handling generality problems (but insists that if a truth conditional theory were right, there would be no problems with such sentences in the first place). All in all, it is difficult to make the conditional assertion theory of conditionals fit intuitions.

3 Assertion logic

If we set out principles specifically valid for reasoning with sentences of the form

(25) x asserts that p

we may be said to have set out an assertion logic or logic of assertion. Exactly what to count as a logic of assertion is not so clear, since it depends on whether the term ‘assertion’ in this context is taken in its default sense of an overtly performed speech act, or in some other sense, such as that of implicitly asserting something, or being rationally committed to asserting something. In these latter senses a logic of assertion tends to be a form of doxastic logic (logic of belief), or a related kind of modal logic. We shall here look at the assertion logics by Rescher and Gullvåg.

Nicholas Rescher's assertion logic (Rescher 1968) is concerned with what a speaker (individual or collective) implicitly is committed to in virtue of overtly made assertions (Rescher 1968, 250). Rescher sets out several systems of logic with principles governing sentences of the form (25), abbreviated into ‘Axp’. Most of his systems contain a rationality postulate, that no speaker commits herself to a contradiction:

(26) ∼(∃x)Ax(p & ∼p)

Rescher's first system A1 contains three axiom schemata and one rule of inference:

(A1) (∀x)(∃p)Axp (Nonvacuousness)
(A2) (Axp & Axq) ⊃ Ax(p & q) (Conjunction)
(A3) Ax(p & ∼p) (Consistency)
(R) If pq, then AxpAxq (Commitment)

By (A1) every speaker (assertor) asserts at least one proposition. By (R), a speaker asserts (is committed to) everything entailed by what she asserts. Specifically, it then follows that every speaker asserts every truth of logic:

(27) If ⊢ p, then ⊢ Axp

Rescher gets the stronger system A2 by adding

(A2) (∀x)Axpp (Lincoln)

an axiom to the effect that whatever is asserted by all speakers is true (you can't fool all the people all the time). An alternative strengthening A3 of A1 is generated by adding (A3):

(A3) p ⊃ (∃x)Axp (Collective Omniscience)

that is, whatever is true, is asserted by someone. Rescher notes that within A1, (A2) follows from (A3) (because of Consistency and Conjunction).

The system A4 is generated from A3 by the axiom

(A4) Ax(Axp) ≡ Axp

of which the if part is called ‘Metahonesty’ and the only-if part ‘Metacandor’. The system A5, finally, comes from A4 by the axiom

(A5) AxpAx(∼ p)

by which every speaker is complete in the sense of taking a stance towards every proposition.

Speakers according to these logics, and especially A5, can be modeled as sets of propositions, and thereby as possible worlds. One can therefore define a box operator □p as ∀xAxp, and investigate what is needed to get the usual modal systems (section 13). If axiom A5 doesn't hold, one can apply a three-valued logic, where the third value corresponds to indifference. Rescher also considers, among other things, adding deontic and alethic modal operators to the assertion operator language.

A related perspective on assertion is taken by Ingemund Gullvåg (1978). Gullvåg is more interested than Rescher in overt assertions, but still adopts a similar consistency requirement (1978, 79): you cannot, in one act, assert incompatible propositions. This serves to partly define what to count as one act of assertion. If an overtly inconsistent assertion seems to be taking place, the utterance cannot really count as an assertion (1978, 80). Gullvåg's format is ‘Sxstp’, meaning that speaker x at time t by uttering sentence s asserts that p. The consistency requirement is then set out as the axiom

(28) ∼ (Sxst p & Sxstp)

Gullvåg also has a conjunction axiom (or assumption) corresponding to Rescher's:

(29) Sxst(p&q) ≡ (Sxst p & Sxst q)

However, when it comes to setting out consequences of an assertion, Gullvåg turns to a notion of a speaker's pragmatically implying something by means of an assertion. What the speaker implies is what she is committed to (1978, 89). Among other things, Gullvåg adopts the axioms and rules of inference

(A11) Ixst pIxst (Ixst qq)
(A12) Ixst(p & q) ≡ (Ixst p & Ixst q)
(A13) Ixst Ixst pIxst p
(RI) pq → ⊢ Ixst pIxst q
(RTF) p → ⊢ ∼Ixstp

(I have changed the notation slightly). By A11 if a speaker implies anything, then she implies that whatever she implies is true. By A13, if a speaker implies that she implies that p, then she implies that p.

Later on (1978, 103) Gullvåg defines the S operator in terms of both expressing and implying a proposition p, by which it follows that

(30) Sxst pIxst p

To this Gullvåg adds axioms about belief and implied belief:

(A14) Ixst Bxst pIxst p
(A15) Ixst Bxst pIxst(∼Bxtp)
(A16) Ixst Bxt (pq) ⊃ Ixst(Bxt pBxt q)

Here, by (A14), speakers imply that what they believe is true. By (A15), if a speaker implies that she believes that p, then she implies that she does not believe the negation of p. Finally, if she implies that she believes a conditional, then she implies that she believes the consequent if she believes the antecedent.

With the help of these axioms and rules Gullvåg derives a number of theorems, including the theorem

(31) ∼Sxst (p & ∼Bxt p)

(1978, 108), saying that Moorean propositions are not assertible, thereby offering a treatment of Moore's paradox. Gullvåg has some related theorems on pragmatic inconsistency. He offers a Hintikka style possible worlds semantics validating the axioms.

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