Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


First published Tue Jan 5, 1999; substantive revision Tue Oct 11, 2011

An artifact may be defined as an object that has been intentionally made or produced for a certain purpose.  Often the word ‘artifact’ is used in a more restricted sense to refer to simple, hand-made objects which represent a particular culture. According to Webster's Third New International Dictionary, an artifact is “a usually simple object (as a tool or an ornament) showing human workmanship and modification as distinguished from a natural object.” The Oxford English Dictionary defines an artifact (artefact) as “anything made by human art and workmanship; an artificial product.” This sense of the word can be seen from the word itself: it is derived from the Latin words arte, ablative of ars (art), and factum, the past participle of facere (to make). In experimental science, the expression ‘artifact’ is sometimes used to refer to experimental results which are not manifestations of the natural phenomena under investigation, but are due to the particular experimental arrangement, and hence indirectly to human agency.

1. On the Concept of Artifact

Aristotle divided existing things into those that “exist by nature” and those existing “from other causes.” The former include “animals and their parts, … and the plants and the simple bodies (earth, fire, air, water)”, the latter include “a bed and a coat and anything of that sort, qua receiving these designations, i.e., in so far as they are products of art.” (Physica, Book II, 192 b 9–18). Aristotle makes here a distinction between natural objects and artifacts (“artificial products”, ibid., 192 b 28), and describes the latter as products of the art of making things. The art of making something involves intentional agency; thus an artifact may be defined as an object that has been intentionally made for some purpose.

An artifact has necessarily a maker or an author; thus artifact and author can be regarded as correlative concepts (Hilpinen 1993, 156–157):

(A1) An object is an artifact if and only if it has an author.

The concept of authorship is here assumed to involve the same kind and degree of intentionality as the concept of an artifact. It should be noted that (A1) allows the possibility that an artifact has several authors who contribute to its production. Such objects may be termed “collectively produced artifacts”.

Intentional agency is not limited to human beings. For example, in a recent experiment a New Caledonian crow called Betty bent a piece of straight wire into a hook and used it to lift a bucket containing food from a vertical pipe (Weir at al., 2002). The action required for the solution of Betty's problem, bending a metal wire into the form of a hook, was quite “unnatural”, and apparently an instance of intelligent, goal-directed action. Betty's hook may be regarded as a simple artifact made for the purpose of gaining access to the food bucket. Tool manufacture has also been observed among animals in the wild, for example, chimpanzees strip leaves off twigs detached from branches of trees and use the twigs for reaching termites or ants. (Beck 1980, 117.)

The products of an artifact maker's actions can be divided into the objects intended by the author and unintended products. When a tailor makes a coat for his customer, his intention is to make a coat of a certain size and style, but he also produces scraps of cloth as by-products of his work. Such by-products are products of an artifact maker's intentional actions, but they are not intended products. Stereotypical examples of artifacts, e.g., tools, weapons, and ornaments, are usually intended products, and the definition of an artifact as an object intentionally made for a certain purpose applies to such objects. However, in the anthropological and archaeological literature the word is sometimes used in a wider sense for all objects produced by human activities. According to Kathy Schick and Nicholas Toth (1993, 49), (human) artifacts are “objects that have been modified by humans, either intentionally or unintentionally.” The word ‘artifact’ is used in this wide sense for all objects and phenomena that are of interest to archaeologists as sources of information about past cultures. On the other hand, the scientific use of the expression of ‘artifact’ is often restricted to “intentionally manufactured items”. (Dunnell 1977, 120–121; Oswalt 1976, 24.) There is a clear conceptual distinction between an object made and used for some purpose and the residue or “debitage” resulting from human (or animal) activities. (Cf. Andrefsky 2001, 2.) The former objects may be regarded as artifacts in the strict or proper sense.

Objects taken from their natural environment and used as tools or for some other purpose form a bridge between natural objects and artifacts. Such objects are called “naturefacts” (“made by nature”; Oswalt 1973, 14–17; 1976, 17–23; Schnurrenberger and Bryan 1985, 134; Schick and Toth 1993, 92–93; Dickson 1996, 74). When a naturefact is modified to improve its usability for some purpose, it becomes a genuine artifact.

Even animals to which we are not inclined to ascribe intentionality can be said to make objects, for example, some wasps use mud to construct spherical vessels and fill them with paralyzed insects or spiders which serve as nutrition for their offspring. It is natural to call such objects “animal artifacts” even when the animal's behavior is wholly innate and not an instance of intelligent, purposive action. James L. Gould (2007, 249) has defined an animal artifact as “any creation on the part of an animal, using and/or modifying available materials, which is useful to it or its offspring.” Here the requirement of intentionality is replaced by the condition that the product should be useful for the animal in an appropriate biological sense. The distinction between the artifact and the residue resulting from the productive activity can be made even for “animal artifacts” in Gould's sense: the residue consists of products which are not useful for the animal.

2. Artifact, Work, and the Ontology of Artifacts

(A1) makes the concept of artifact (in the proper sense) equivalent to that of work (as a product as opposed to activity); for example, according to (A1), all works of art, including musical and literary works, should be called “artifacts” insofar as they have authors. In aesthetics, the expression ‘artifact’ has been used in this wide sense when it has been argued, as some philosophers have done, that works of art are necessarily artifacts (Davies 1991, 120–141; Levinson 2007, 81–82). Ontologically, an artifact can be a singular, concrete object such as the Eiffel Tower, a type (a type object) which has or can have many instances (for example, a paper clip or Nikolai Gogol's Dead Souls), an instance of a type (a particular paper clip), or an abstract object, for example, an artificial language. A singular artifact can be a portable or (in principle) transportable object which can be separated from its immediate surroundings without destroying it, or a non-separable feature of an object which serves as its substrate or foundation. Objects of the former kind are called ontologically independent objects; artifacts of the latter kind are dependent objects in the sense that it is (ontologically) impossible for them to exist without their substrate. (See Simons 1987, 294–323; Husserl 1913/2001, Investigation III, sections 2, 5.) A coat and a chair are independent objects, but (for example) the Apennine Base rail tunnel constructed in the early 20th century is a dependent object whose foundation is the Tuscan-Emilian part of the Apennine mountain range. It is not possible to detach the tunnel from the mountain in the way a wheel of a bicycle can be detached from the bicycle. The tunnel is an artifact in the strict sense of being an object intentionally made for the purpose of facilitating railway traffic between Bologna and Florence.

An artifact kind identified by a common description or concept can include several subtypes or species; for example, there are different paper clip types for which their authors (that is, their inventors) obtained separate patents; these fall under the more general artifact kind ‘paper clip’. Commonly used artifact kinds (pens, paper clips, computers, etc.) evolve over time as different authors and designers try to improve earlier artifact types or adapt them to new conditions and purposes. (See Petroski 1992a, 1992b.)

Artifacts are classified in different ways: on the basis of their form, the method of manufacture, material properties, style, their intended use, or on other grounds. In philosophical discussions on the nature of artifacts they are often described as having “intended proper functions” (Rudder Baker 2008, 3; see also Simon 1996, 3), and identified by their use; thus Hilary Kornblith (1980, 112) observes: “At least for the most part, it seems that what makes two artifacts members of the same kind is that they perform the same function.” This is the way an artifact is presumably regarded by its user, but it is by no means the only basis of artifact classification. For example, the artifacts of visual arts are divided on the basis of their production method into drawings, paintings, prints, and photographs, and prints are divided into etchings, engravings, woodcuts, lithographs, and other kinds. A drawing or a photograph can serve many different purposes; it may be an object of aesthetic contemplation, or it may be used to help to identify some person or object. In archaeological research artifacts are usually classified on morphological or stylistic grounds or on the basis of other observable features which serve as evidence for hypotheses about their intended function. (Adams and Adams 1991, 217–225; Read 2007.)

If we distinguish the concept of work from that of an artifact and say, for example, that an author can create a work only by making some artifact (for example, to write a novel, an author has to produce a manuscript), the expression ‘artifact’ may be said to be used in a narrow (or primary) sense. The instances of a type artifact are artifacts in this narrow sense, that is, singular, particular objects.

3. Making Objects: Productive Action

A singular object which is an artifact in a narrow sense is usually made from some pre-existing object or objects by successive intentional modifications. The production of an artifact can take different forms, and artifacts can be characterized on the basis of the kinds of actions by which they are produced, that is, in terms of the general action types by which objects can be modified. (Cf. Oswalt 1973, 169–172, 1976, 203–205; Beck 1980, 105.) Perhaps the most elementary action type of this kind is separation, the separation of an object from another object so that one (or both) of the resulting objects can be used for some purpose. Making a walking-stick by breaking a limb from a tree and stripping it of leaves and bark consists of acts of separation. (Oswalt calls this action type “reduction”; see 1976, 203.) Reshaping is another way to produce a new (kind of) object; this consists in changing the shape or structure of an object (either a natural object or an artifact) without separating any part from it or adding anything to it. (Beck 1980, 105.) Betty's hook is an artifact made by reshaping a piece of metal wire, and a glass blower can make a hollow glass object by reshaping a gob of hot glass by means of a blowpipe. To make complex artifacts, it is necessary to join a number of objects together; Oswalt calls this action type or “production principle” conjunction (1976, 203–204). For example, a knife made by attaching a wooden handle to a metal blade is a conjunctive artifact. Simons and Dement (1996, 264) call these basic action types “removal”, “forming”, and “assembly”. Complex artifacts are usually made by sequences of these (and possibly other) basic action types. Given a number of productive action types A1, …, Ai, …, An, an artifact can be defined quasi-inductively as an object intentionally produced from some natural or artificial “parent” object or objects by means of the actions Ai (i = 1,…,n). In this case the intentionality of production can be taken to mean that the author performs the actions Ai intentionally; this need not require an intention to produce an object of any pre-determined type. An agent may simply be playing or experimenting with the materials available to him. The resulting object may show “human workmanship and modification”, even if it is not an instance of any previously known artifact type.

When an artifact is a dependent object made by separation or reshaping, e.g., a tunnel or a knot, productive actions modify its substrate, and a non-separable new feature of the substrate (the parent object) becomes the artifact. In the case of separation, the part separated from the parent object (for example, the rock and the earth removed from the mountain in the construction of a tunnel) is not the artifact, but the residue of the productive activity.

Many artifacts are linked together in the sense that they are either designed to be parts of a complex artifact, like the wheels and the frame of a bicycle, or are joined together when they are used in the intended way, for example, a violin bow and a violin, or a locomotive and railway carriages. Oswalt (1976, 204) describes the latter form of linkage as follows: “Linked forms always are joined together in a technical manner in their primary usage.” Linked artifacts can be said to be designed and made for each other, but they can often be used alone for “accidental” purposes not originally intended.

Separation, reshaping, and conjunction (assembly) are general action descriptions which are instantiated in different cases of artifact making by different techniques or (production) routines. (For the concept of action routine, see Segerberg 1985.) Such procedures often require the use of various artifacts as production tools.

4. Productive Intention

When a person intends to make an object of a certain kind, his productive intention has as its content some description of the intended object, and the author's intention “ties” to an artifact a number of predicates which determine the intended character of the object. The existence and some of the properties of the artifact are dependent on its intended character. This is expressed by the following Dependence Condition (Hilpinen 1992, 65):

(DEP) The existence and some of the properties of an artifact depend on an author's intention to make an object of certain kind.

Because of this dependence of an author's intentions, artifacts can be said to be “creations of the mind” (Thomasson 2007, 52). This condition holds both for artifacts in the proper sense and for the residue resulting from productive actions.

The causal tie between an artifact and its intended character — or, strictly speaking, between an artifact and its author's productive intention — is constituted by an author's actions, that is, by his work on the object. The actual properties of an artifact constitute its actual character. The success of an author's productive activity depends on the degree of fit or agreement between the intended and the actual character of the object. The actual character of an artifact is of course always much richer than the intended character: the artifact fits an author's intentions if and only if the former includes the latter. At least one of the descriptions included in the intended character should presumably be a sortal or “substantival” description which determines the identity of the object and the criteria by which it can be distinguished from other objects (cf. Hilpinen 1992, 61). For example, ‘painting’ and ‘chair’ are sortal descriptions, but ‘red’ (or ‘red thing’) is not. It is possible to give a definite answer to the question of how many chairs there are in a given room, but not to the question of how many red things there are in the room: as Gottlob Frege (1884/1953, 66) pointed out, the description ‘red thing’ does not identify objects in a determinate manner. Artifact kinds can be identified by count nouns (such as ‘chair’) or by mass terms (e.g., ‘plywood’ or ‘whisky’).

An author's productive intention is often expressed by cognitive artifacts which show the character of the intended artifact and the way it should be constructed, for example, a drawing, a diagram, or a model of the artifact, together with a list of parts and materials and a set of instructions (a precept) for the production process. Such representations are especially important in the case of collectively produced complex artifacts. They are necessary for successful communication among the authors of the artifact and for the coordination of their productive actions. (For different representations of complex artifacts, see Simons and Dement 1996, 266–75.)

Artifact sortals can be essentially or nonessentially (accidentally) artifactual. For example, ‘motor controller’ and ‘paper clip’ are essentially artifactual terms, but a path through a forest can be intentionally made (an artificial path) or it can be an unintended product of people's habit of following the same route when they walk through the forest. Languages and words can be natural entities (without identifiable creators) or artifacts which have been intentionally designed for a certain purpose. In fact, many “natural” languages, especially their written forms, can be regarded as artifacts. For example, the creation of New Norwegian (Landsmål or Nynorsk) in the mid-19th century was mainly due to the efforts of the Norwegian poet Ivar Aasen, who presented it as an alternative to the official Norwegian language of the time (Riksmål, Dano-Norwegian). Aasen's proposals were later modified and supplemented by many other authors who contributed to the development of New Norwegian. (See Haugen 1966, 33–45.)

According to condition (DEP), a person is an author of an artifact only if the existence and the character of the artifact depend on that person's productive intentions. Such dependence admits of degrees; thus it is possible to distinguish degrees of authorship. The 13th century philosopher St. Bonaventure distinguished four ways in which a person can make a book: A scribe (scriptor) simply copies the works of others, without making any changes or additions. A compiler (compilator) combines the texts of other authors without adding any new material to the text, whereas a commentator “writes both others' work and his own, but with others' work in the principal place, adding his own for purposes of explanation.” Finally, an author (auctor), in the strict sense, “writes both his own work and others' but his own work in a principal place adding others' for the purposes of confirmation.” (Eisenstein 1979, 121–22; Woodmansee 1992, 281.) A scribe who intentionally copies a text produces a new artifact, a new copy of the text, and is without doubt an author of that copy: the existence and the character of the copy depend on the scribe's intentions. The scribe intends the copy to have a certain textual character, but that intention is determined by and dependent on the productive intentions of the original author of the text. As regards the textual character of the copy, the scribe represents a minimal (or zero) degree of authorship. The textual intentions of a compiler are also dependent on the intentions of the authors whose texts the compiler is joining together, but the way in which the original works are combined is up to the compiler. A compiler and a commentator represent intermediate degrees of authorship between a scribe and an author in the proper or strict sense of the word.

5. On the Characterization and Evaluation of Artifacts

As was mentioned above, artificial things are often characterized in terms of functions and goals (cf. Simon 1996, 5), and artifact kinds can be identified by sortal descriptions which refer to their intended function (e.g., ‘hammer’). An object that has been made for a certain purpose F may be termed ‘an F-object’. The properties of an F-object can be divided into two classes: (i) those relevant to the functioning of the object as an F-object, and (ii) the properties irrelevant to the purpose F. The former properties may be termed the significant properties of the object (or its F-significant properties); they may also be called the “good-making properties” of the object. For example, the weight of a hammer is one of its significant features, but its color is usually not. In addition to an identifying (sortal) description F, the content of an author's productive intention includes the properties that he regards as significant for the purpose F. The latter properties depend on this purpose (or purposes); thus the intended character of an artifact is not simply a collection of predicates, but has a hierarchical structure. In many cases an object is expected to serve many different purposes; thus the description F may be quite complex. If an artifact is evaluated on the basis of its suitability for a certain purpose, its goodness is a form of what may be called instrumental goodness. (G. H. von Wright 1963, 19–22.)

An author's productive activity may be evaluated on the basis of the relationships among the intended character of an artifact, its actual character, and a purpose F (Hilpinen 1995, 140):

(E1) The degree of fit or agreement between the intended character and the actual character of an object,

(E2) The degree of fit between the intended character of an object and the purpose F, in other words, the suitability of an object of the intended kind for the purpose F,


(E3) The degree of fit between the actual character of an object and the purpose F, that is, the suitability of an artifact for F.

(E1) determines whether an artifact is a successful embodiment of the author's intentions, (E2) determines whether the character that the author intends to give to an artifact is suitable for the purpose F, and (E3) tells whether the author has succeeded in making an object that is in fact suitable for the purpose F. The study of artifacts (qua artifacts) is intrinsically evaluative, since viewing an object as an artifact means viewing it in the light of intentions and purposes.

The purpose F on which the evaluation of an artifact and its design are based need not be the purpose that the author had in mind; it can be any purpose for which the artifact might be used. The direction of evaluation may be reversed so that the maker or owner of an artifact tries to find new uses for it.

In addition, we should distinguish the actual character of an artifact from the author's conception of it. If the author's conception of an object agrees with its intended character, the artifact is subjectively satisfactory for the author, but it may fail to fit the author's productive intentions if he has a mistaken conception of it.

If the author's productive activity is successful, the character of a completed artifact both depends on and agrees with his productive intentions so that it can be regarded as an embodiment of these intentions. If the actual character of an object does not agree with its intended character, it is unsatisfactory from the author's point of view, and if the author's conception of an object does not agree with its intended character, the artifact is subjectively unsatisfactory from the author's point of view. In the latter case the author has a reason to try to improve the object until it satisfies his productive intentions. A change in an object which improves the fit between its actual and intended character is, from the standpoint of the author's intentions, a progressive change.

It seems plausible to regard an object as a proper artifact only if its maker's productive activity has some degree of success, for example, satisfies some sortal predicate included in his productive intention. This condition may be termed the Success Condition:

(SUC) An object is an artifact made by an author only if it satisfies some sortal description included in the author's productive intention.

If an agent's activity fails in every respect, the agent does not accomplish anything, but produces only “scrap”. (Cf. Hilpinen 1993, 160; Bloom 1996, 10; Thomasson 2003, 598–99.) Even if the object does not fit the author's productive intention, but he accepts it as a satisfactory realization of his intention, it may be regarded as a proper artifact. This is expressed by the following Acceptance Condition:

(ACC) An object is an artifact made by an author only if the author accepts it as satisfying some sortal description included in his productive intention.

The acceptance is based on the author's intentions and purposes, but as was pointed out above, the artifact may later be evaluated by other persons or by the author himself with respect to other possible uses and purposes. If an artifact has several authors, the Acceptance Condition should hold for at least one of them. According to the Acceptance Condition, an object is an artifact only if its maker regards it as such, that is, accepts it as a product of his intentional activity. The Success Condition concerns the fit between the actual and the intended character of an object; the Acceptance Condition the fit between the author's conception of an object and its intended character. In this context it should be observed that the author's intention may change during his productive activity. In the above conditions, ‘productive intention’ should be regarded as referring to the content of the author's final intentions concerning the artifact.

In some cases the satisfaction of the Acceptance Condition is sufficient for the satisfaction of the Success Condition in the sense that if an author has produced an object with an intention to make an object of kind K and has accepted it as a K-object, it cannot fail to be a K-object. When a person signs a document, his acceptance of an illegible scrawl as his signature is sufficient to make it his signature. (However, on a later occasion he can of course make a mistake and fail to recognize the signature as his own, or believe that a signature written earlier by a forger is genuine.)

If the concept of artifact is defined in terms of productive actions in the way suggested in Section 3, the Success Condition should be taken to mean that the author or authors actually succeed in performing the intended productive action, and the Acceptance Condition may be taken to mean that the author (or one of the authors) believes that the action has been completed.

Randall Dipert's theory of artifacts includes the condition that an artifact (in the strict sense) should be intended by its author to be recognized as having been intentionally modified for a certain purpose (Dipert 1993, 29–31). This is a plausible condition, since an F-object can presumably be a good F-object only if its potential users recognize it as such. However, this recognizability should not be taken to mean general recognizability: a mechanical shark used in making an adventure film is an artifact, but its authors do not wish the audience to recognize it as such, on the contrary; the condition of recognizability presumably applies only to the persons who are using it in the making of the film.

The conditions listed above provide a partial characterization of the concept of artifact. We might say that different intentionally modified or constructed objects exhibit different degrees of artifactuality, depending on how well they satisfy these conditions.

6. Artworks

As was mentioned above, artifactuality is often regarded as one of the defining characteristics of works of art; for example, this is an essential condition in George Dickie's (1984, 63) analysis, according to which a work of art is an “artifact of a kind created to be presented to an artworld public”. The condition of artifactuality is plausible only if the concept of artifact is understood in a wide sense in which intentionally created events and processes (e.g., performances) and works which have instances (for example, musical and literary works) are regarded as artifacts. According to condition (A1), the condition of artifactuality in this sense is equivalent to the requirement that a work of art should have an author. Some philosophers have objected to the condition of artifactuality, using instances of so-called “driftwood art” or “found objects” (found art) as counterexamples. (Cf. Weitz 1956, 34; Dickie and Stecker 2009, 152–153.) An object found in nature and presented in an art gallery without any physical modification is an artistic naturefact, analogous to a natural object adopted for some use. To avoid the paradoxical consequence that some artworks lack authors, the concepts of authorship and artifactuality must be interpreted in this context in such a way that the choice of an object for “presentation to the artworld public” is sufficient to make the presenter the author of the object qua work of art, that is, as an object of aesthetic appreciation. According to this view, the presentation of a natural object as an object of aesthetic appreciation counts as an “intentional modification” required for artifactuality (cf. Dickie 1984/1997, 45–46). However, usually the works of “found art” are assemblages of natural objects and artifacts collected together by an artist. Such works are genuine artifacts, artifacts in the strict sense; they are intentionally put together for aesthetic purposes by using natural objects and artifacts as materials.

Artifacts in the wide sense form an ontologically heterogeneous collection of entities which extends across the traditional philosophical boundaries between concreta and abstracta, and substantial objects, events, and processes. (Cf. Thomasson 1999, xii, 117–120.)


Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
inpho icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
phil papers icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with other suggestions.]

Related Entries

aesthetics: aesthetic judgment