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Arabic and Islamic Psychology and Philosophy of Mind

First published Fri Apr 18, 2008; substantive revision Tue May 29, 2012

Muslim philosophers considered the quest for knowledge as a divine command, and knowledge of the soul, and particularly of the intellect, as a critical component of this quest. Mastery of this subject provided a framework within which the mechanics and nature of our sensations and thoughts could be explained and integrated, and offered the epistemological foundation for every other field of inquiry. As opposed to the Occasionalist views of the Mutakallimûn, the Muslim theologians, philosophers wished to anchor their knowledge of the world in a stable and predictable physical reality. This entailed naturalizing the soul (nafs in Arabic) itself, charting the relation between its external and internal senses and between its imaginative and rational faculties. However, the ultimate goal of this subject, conjunction of the intellect with universal truth, had a decidedly metaphysical and spiritual aspect.

The psychological views delineated by Aristotle were the dominant paradigm for Muslim philosophers, as modified by Hellenistic variations expressing Platonic perspectives. The ninth to the twelfth centuries is the period of rigorous philosophizing that characterizes classical Islamic philosophy, and it is the period and subject with which this article is concerned. It is divided as follows:

1. Sources and First Expressions: Al-Kindî and Razi

Aristotle's philosophy of mind in Islamic philosophy is a combination of what we would today call psychology and physiology, and is not limited to investigations of our rational faculty. However important, the “mind” or intellect, with its practical and theoretical aspects, is only part of the falâsifa's “science of the soul.” Their main sources are found in three Aristotelian treatises: On the Soul (De anima), On Sense and Sensibilia (De Sensu et Sensibili), and On Memory and Recollection (De Memoria et Reminiscentia). The last two belong to a series of nine short physical treatises, called accordingly Parva Naturalia, and include two that deal with the related topic of dreams and prophesying by means of dreams.

The De anima was fully translated into Arabic in the ninth century C.E., the Parva Naturalia partially translated, including those treatises relevant to our topic. Muslim authors had access to Arabic translations of Hellenistic commentaries on these works, particularly those done by Alexander of Aphrodisias (third century c.e.) and Themistius (fourth century).[1] The views of the Muslim philosophers reflect these various sources, and are thus “Aristotelian” in an attenuated sense, particularly as concerns the role and entailments of the rational faculty.

The scientifically rich Hellenistic culture to which Islam was heir is evident in the work of Abû Yûsuf Ya‘qûb ibn Ishâq al-Kindî (d. c.870) and Abû Bakr Muhammad ibn Zakariyya ibn Yahya al-Râzî (865-925 or 932). Al-Kindî, known as “the philosopher of the Arabs” for his Arabian genealogy, was active, with others of his circle, in editing Arabic translations and paraphrases of both Aristotelian and Neoplatonic texts. He also was familiar with other branches of Greek science, and wrote treatises on many diverse topics. His views on psychology were formed mainly by acquaintance with paraphrases made of De anima, the Theology of Aristotle (An abridgement of Plotinus' Enneads) and the Book on the Pure Good (an abridgement of Proclus' Elements of Theology, known in Latin as Liber De Causis). An Arabic version of Euclid's Optics also helped al-Kindî develop his theory of vision, expressed in his De Aspectibus and two smaller treatises (extant in Arabic only). Unfortunately, al-Kindî does not integrate his understanding of vision with other aspects of his psychology, the parts never amounting to a whole, complete system. We have instead a fragmentary report indicating directions in which al-Kindî was headed, and probable sources with which he had some acquaintance.

Thus, the De Aspectibus shows that al-Kindî favored an extramission view of vision, in which rays extend from the eyes to make contact with an object, enabling a person to see it.[2] Following Euclid's Optics ultimately, al-Kindî offers geometrical demonstrations against both the alternative “intromission” view, and the view that fuses extramission with intromission; views identified mostly with Aristotle's De anima and Plato's Timaeus, respectively. In other treatises, however, al-Kindî may be more sympathetic to Aristotle's understanding of vision, mixed with possible familiarity with relevant treatises of Ptolemy and John Philoponus.

Al-Kindî's exposure to Plato and Aristotle was through doxographies and paraphrases that attempted to harmonize their views, and that often grafted Gnostic and hermetic themes onto a Platonic—more exactly Neoplatonic—trunk.[3] Thus, his Statement on the Soul,[4] which purports to give a summary of the views on the subject of “Aristotle, Plato, and other Philosophers,” emphasizes the immortal nature of the soul; its origins as a tripartite unified substance created by God, which returns through various heavenly stages to be in proximity to its Creator, upon having lived a life controlled by its rational faculty. Indeed, the superior person (fâdil) who abjures physical desires and pursues wisdom (hikmah), justice, goodness and truth (these following from knowledge) resembles the Creator.[5] This resemblance is elsewhere qualified to pertain to God's activities, not to His essence.[6] Aristotle is seen as in agreement with this essential separation of soul and body, and the ability of the soul to know things not given to empirical investigation.

Al-Kindî is more conventional philosophically in his magnum opus, On First Philosophy, when he highlights the mechanics of perception as proceeding from the sensible object (via the sense organs) to the common sense, imagination and memory.[7] Elsewhere, he mentions the role of the imagination in both abstracting and presenting images apart from their matter (Ivry, 135). The intellect deals with universals, as mentioned in On First Philosophy, whereas particular, material objects are treated by the senses (and, presumably, the imagination and memory).

The divergent sources present in Al-Kindî make their appearance again in his short treatise On Intellect.[8] Aristotle's Hellenistic commentators had long since elaborated on Book Three of his De anima, and discerned stages of cognition that the master had left too vague for their liking. In al-Kindî's case, John Philoponus appears to have provided a model for al-Kindî's scheme of four kinds of intellect (Jolivet, pp. 50–73; Endress, 197). The first intellect is that which is in act always, a separate principle of intelligibility that contains the species and genera, i.e., the universals, of our world. This first intellect, like that of Alexander of Aphrodisias,[9] endows our potential intellects (the second intellect) with the abstract ideas they are capable of receiving; which ideas become part of a (third) acquired but passive intellect. When active, however, the (fourth) intellect emerges as just that, an intellect in act, in which its subject is united with its object. As such, the first and fourth intellects are alike phenomenologically, though different quantitatively.

The first and fourth intellects do not conjoin, though al-Kindî would have the perfect soul ascend to its creator. Similarly, he is not explicit as to the relationship of the imagination and intellect; the imaginative forms, recognized as partially abstracted from matter, should provide the raw material for the intellect, but it is not at all clear they do. The Platonic disparagement of sensibilia may have affected al-Kindî here, leaving his psychology ultimately dualistic.

Al-Razî, known to the Latin West as Rhazes and hence referred to usually as Razi, was similarly drawn to a Platonically inspired view of the soul, colored by theosophic accounts of creation and salvation. While he agreed with Plato's notion of a tripartite soul, Razi often spoke of three souls, the rational or divine one enlisting the higher passions of the animal soul to control the base appetites of the vegetative soul.[10] Following Hellenistic tradition, he locates the vegetative soul in the liver, the animal soul in the heart and the rational soul in the brain. While the physical organs of the two subordinate souls are sufficient to account for their activities, the brain—seat of sensation, voluntary movement, imagination, thought and memory—is regarded merely as an instrument of the rational soul, which is non-physical and immortal.

In an introductory medical treatise, Razi goes into further physiological detail concerning the responsibilities of the various psychic organs. The special faculties required for the brain to exercise its soul's dominion are identified as the imagination (here called wahm, a term that Avicenna was to adopt and expand upon); a cogitative power (al-fikr); and memory (al-hifz).

While Razi constructed his psychology with eclectic borrowings from Plato, Galen and Aristotle, he is reported to have gone further afield in metaphysics. He believed there were five eternal cosmic principles, one of which was a world soul that needed divine intervention to liberate it from the seductive and defiling matter of the world.[11] This is similar to the message he presents in Al-Tibb al-Ruhânî, that the immortal rational soul of an individual must strive to free itself from corporeal entanglements, lest it be reincarnated in another, not necessarily human, body.

Razi's mythically based metaphysics, coupled with his belief in the transmigration of the soul and a bold indifference to identifiably Islamic tenets, led to his marginalization among the faithful and philosophers alike. Nevertheless, Razi as well as al-Kindî sketched the components of cognition that later philosophers were to develop.

2. Al-Fârâbî

This development owes a great deal to the work of Abu Nasr Muhammad ibn Muhammad ibn Tarkhan al-Fârâbî (c. 870-950). A prolific author, Farabi, as he is often referred to in English, adopted and commented upon much of Aristotle's logical corpus, while turning to Plato for his political philosophy. His metaphysics and psychology were a blend of both traditions, establishing a modified or Neoplatonised form of Aristotelianism which later generations adopted and adapted.

Farabi's familiarity with Aristotle is evident in the summary sketch of his writings that he presents in The Philosophy of Aristotle. The soul is defined as “that by which the animate substance—I mean that which admits of life—is realized as substance,”[12] serving the triple function of being a formal, efficient and final cause. For human beings, the intellect assumes the mantle of substance (Mahdi, 125), it being “a principle underlying the essence of man,” both an agent and final cause (Mahdi, 122). Specifically, it is the theoretical intellect that has this status, the practical intellect being subsidiary to it. The final perfection of a person is found in the actualization of this theoretical intellect, its substance being identical with its act.

Beyond the individual intellect there lies a universal (though Farabi does not call it such) Active (or Agent) Intellect (al-‘aql al-fa‘âl). This is conceived as the formal principle of the soul, engendering in the potential intellect both the basic axioms of thought and the ability to receive all other intelligible notions (Mahdi, 127). This external intellect is also the ultimate agent and final cause of the individual intellect. It both facilitates the individual intellect's operations and, serving as an example of perfect being, draws it back towards itself through acts of intellection. The more the individual intellect in act is absorbed in theoretical activity, the greater its accumulation of scientific knowledge; each step bringing it closer to that totality of knowledge and essential being encapsulated in the Agent Intellect.

For Farabi, the individual intellect, even when perfected, can only come close to joining with the substance of the Agent Intellect. This reprises a theme sounded in Aristotle's metaphysics, in which the intellects of the heavenly spheres, desiring to be like the Intellect that is the Prime Mover, imitate it as best they can. For Farabi, a person's ultimate happiness is found in this approximation to the ideal.

Farabi expounds upon this and other issues pertaining to the soul in his wide-ranging masterpiece, “Principles of the Views of the Citizens of the Perfect State.”[13] He recounts the various faculties of the soul, following the model of Aristotle's De anima, emphasizing the presence of an inclination or propensity (nizâ‘) concomitant with each one.[14] Thus, the senses immediately like or dislike what they perceive, depending on whether it is attractive or repulsive to them. This affective reaction accompanies the imaginative faculty as well as the practical intellect, which chooses its course of action accordingly.

For Farabi, it is the faculty of will that is responsible for these desires and dislikes that occur in sensation and imagination, ultimately motivating the social and political behavior of the individual (Walzer, 171–173). Farabi distinguishes between what must be the automatic response of animals to the affects created in their senses and imagination, and the conscious and considered response of human beings, assisted by their rational faculty. The former response is attributed to “will” in general (irâdah), the latter to “choice” (ikhtiyâr) (Walzer, 205).

The intellect, considered as purely immaterial, has no physical organ to sustain it, unlike the other faculties of the soul. As Alexander of Aphrodisias, Farabi identifies the heart as the “ruling organ” of the body.[15] Assisted by the brain, liver, spleen and other organs, the heart provides the innate heat that is required by the nutritive faculty, senses and imagination (Walzer, 175–187).

It is this innate heat that presumably is also responsible for the differences between the sexes, Farabi asserts. The greater warmth (as well as strength) in their organs and limbs make men generally more irascible and aggressively forceful than women, who in turn generally excel in the “weaker” qualities of mercy and compassion.[16] The sexes are equal, however, as regards sensation, imagination and intellection.

It would appear from this that Farabi has no problem in seeing both sexes as equal in terms of their cognitive faculties and capabilities. This would seem to be part of his Platonic legacy, a view shared by Averroes in his paraphrase of the Republic (Walzer, 401, note 421). In theory, therefore, Farabi would consider women capable of being philosophers (as well as prophets), able to attain the happiness and perfection this brings.

Possible as this is, and necessary even in theory, Farabi does not elaborate on this view, in deference undoubtedly to Islamic conventions. He is more explicit as regards the process of intellection, a topic that he covers here and in greater detail in a separate treatise, On the Intellect.

In the Perfect State, Farabi already characterizes the potential or “material” intellect, as Alexander called it, as a disposition in matter to receive intelligible “imprints” (rusûm al-ma‘qûlât) (Walzer, 199). These imprints originate as sensible forms that are conveyed to the imagination and modified by it before being presented to the intellect. The potential intellect is considered unable to respond to these imaginative constructs on its own, it needs an agent to activate it, to move it from potentiality to actuality. This is Aristotle's active intellect, as removed by Alexander of Aphrodisias from the individual soul to a universal separate sphere of being. It is now associated with the tenth heavenly sphere (Walzer, 203), being a separate substance that serves both as an emanating source of forms in prophecy (Walzer, 221), and as a force in all people that actualizes both potential intellects and potential intelligibles. Farabi compares its force to the light of the sun that facilitates vision by illuminating both the subject and object of sight (Walzer, 201).

With the assistance of this Agent Intellect, the potential intellect is able to receive all intelligible forms, beginning with “the first intelligibles which are common to all men,” in the areas of logic, ethics and science (Walzer, 205). These first intelligibles represent the first perfection in a person, the final perfection being possession of as many intelligible notions as it is possible to acquire. This creates the felicity, al-sa‘âdah, human beings strive to attain, for it brings them close to the divine status of the Agent Intellect, having conjoined with it as much as is possible.

Farabi portrays the imaginative faculty[17] as having a mimetic capability, “imitating” the sensible forms previously received yet not present until recalled to mind. This imitative ability extends over all the other faculties of the soul, including the intelligible notions of the rational faculty. Farabi adapts this originally Aristotelian idea[18] to prophecy as well as to lesser forms of divination, asserting that an individual imagination can receive intelligible ideas directly from the Agent Intellect, converting them to imaginative representations. Farabi believes the Agent Intellect emanates particular as well as universal intelligibles upon a given individual, expressing present as well as future events, and, for the prophet, particularized knowledge of eternal truths, “things divine” (ashyâ’u ilâhîyah) (Walzer, 221–23).

Farabi naturalizes prophecy by having the emanated forms received by the imagination pass on to the senses and then out to the air. There they assume a sensible though immaterial form that then embarks on a conventional return trip to the internal senses (Walzer, 223).

Farabi's most detailed study of the intellect is to be found in the aptly titled “Epistle on the Intellect,” Risâla fi’l-‘Aql.[19] He begins by showing the diverse contexts in which nominal and verbal forms of “intellect” and “intelligence” are employed. Aristotle, he points out, uses the term in his logical, ethical, psychological and metaphysical treatises. In each area, it is the intellect that is responsible for comprehending the first principles or premises of the subject, and for enabling a person to perfect his (or her) knowledge of it. For Farabi, this apparently innocuous statement must serve to commend the epistemic methodologies of Aristotle over the denaturalized, logically confined analyses of the mutakallimûn, the Muslim theologians. Yet, as emerges later in the treatise, these first principles, seemingly innate to the intellect, are engendered there by the Agent Intellect (Bouyges, 29; Hyman, 219). That universal intellect, for all its ontic priority, is the last of the four intellects that Farabi formally discusses in the treatise. It is a separate intellect, totally immaterial and external to the human intellect. Revising al-Kindi's schematization, and showing the influence of Alexander of Aphrodisias' understanding of Aristotle, Farabi posits a cognitive process in which the human intellect moves from a state of potentiality to one of actuality, acquiring in the process a discrete sum of intelligibles that it can access when desired.

Ignoring here the role of sensation and imagination prior to the activity of the rational faculty, Farabi describes the potential intellect as prepared and disposed to abstract the intelligible “essences” and forms of things from their matters.[20] The dynamic readiness of the potential intellect to act is due, however, to the Agent Intellect. It invests the sub-lunar world with the forms that comprise all species, rendering them potentially intelligible; and energizes our potential intellect to receive them (Bouyges, 24, 29; Hyman, 218, 219).

This reception of the intelligible transforms the potential intellect from being a mere disposition to think to the active thinking of the intelligible; a process in which the “intellect in act” (al-‘aql bi’l-fi‘l) becomes its intelligible (Bouyges, 15; Hyman, 216). The potential intellect itself remains unaffected by this metamorphosis, however, and remains purely potential, able to receive additional intelligible ideas objectively. The greater the number of intelligibles deposited by the intellect in act in the “acquired intellect” (al-‘aql al-mustafâd), the more that intellect thinks itself in thinking them. In doing so, the acquired intellect imitates the Agent Intellect, which it increasingly resembles.

Echoing a Neoplatonic hierarchy of being, Farabi ranks the intelligible order of our sub-lunar world, the Agent Intellect being at the top and prime matter at the bottom. Intellection of the separate, immaterial substances of the heavens, particularly intellection of the Agent Intellect, is the highest cognition desirable, except that Farabi does not think it possible. Not even acquiring total or near-total knowledge of everything in our world will suffice for Farabi; the formation of our intelligibles differs from their order in the Agent Intellect, and there is a qualitative difference between their presence in it and as known to us; we must make do with imitations or likenesses (ashbâh) of the pure intelligibles (Bouyges, 29; Hyman, 219).

Nevertheless, the formation of a substantial amount of knowledge, or in Farabian terms, a strong acquired intellect, is that which forms and enriches us, creating a substance that in its immateriality resembles the Agent Intellect. This represents “ultimate happiness” (al-sa‘âdah al-quswâ), and even an afterlife (al-hayâh al-âkhîrah) of sorts (Bouyges, 31; Hyman, 220).

Farabi holds diverse views on immortality, now identifying it with a perfected intellect, now with the entire soul, though his justification for positing an eternal individual soul or intellect is weak (Davidson 1992, 56–57). As with his more detailed treatment of prophecy, Farabi may prudently be appropriating the religious belief in an afterlife, a tenet held fervently—and very differently—by his community.

3. Avicenna

Avicenna (Abû ‘Alî al-Husayn b.‘Abd Allah Ibn Sînâ, d. 1037), the multi-talented and prodigiously productive faylasûf whose work had the greatest impact among later Muslim thinkers, unequivocally posited an independent, self-conscious, substantial and immortal soul, and with it asserted its immortality. Avicenna could do this, following Plato rather than Aristotle in positing an essential separation of body and soul. Avicenna opens his chapter on the soul in the encyclopedic work Al-Shifâ’ (known in English both as “The Healing” and “The Cure”) asserting this separate existence.[21] Later, in both The Healing itself and in its abridged form of the Najât (called both “The Deliverance,” and “The Salvation”),[22] Avicenna presents arguments to support this claim.

He views the physical, corruptible body in all its parts, including the formal components, as irreconcilably other than the purely immaterial soul, such that the latter cannot be an essential form of the former. Rather, the soul is in an accidental relation to a particular body, occasioned by the generation of that body and its need for a central organizing and sustaining principle. The soul itself is generated by the separate intelligences of the heavens and emanated by them upon the body, having a natural inclination, or proclivity, nizâ‘, for the body that has come into being.[23]

The soul is individuated by the particular nature of its designated body, which it strives to bring to moral and intellectual perfection. Being essentially immaterial, the soul does not perish with the body, and even retains its individuality, i.e., the images and intelligible ideas it amassed during its sojourn on earth.[24] Avicenna attributes self-consciousness to the soul, an ego that has self-awareness and is not to be identified unilaterally with the rational faculty (Rahman 1952, 66). Depending primarily on the amount of knowledge it accumulated, but also on the life the person lived, with its virtues or vices, the immortal soul experiences continuous pleasure or pain.[25]

In this manner, both philosophically and theologically, Avicenna goes beyond his Aristotelian and Muslim predecessors. He does this by combining Aristotelian and Neoplatonic motifs in his epistemology.[26]

The deviation from the hylomorphic ontology of Aristotle is apparent in the famous thought experiment that Avicenna devises, conceiving of a person suspended in air in total isolation from any physical or sensory experience.[27] The purport of this experiment is to show the ability of a person to deduce the soul's existence intellectually, without assistance from the sensory or imaginative, material faculties of the soul. For Avicenna this proves that the soul is an independent intelligent substance, both prior to involvement with the world, and afterwards, when the corporeal organs that service the soul perish.

Avicenna's depiction of the five external faculties of the soul follows Aristotle's De anima, the senses receiving the impressions of their designated sensible objects by intromission. In his discussion of the internal senses, however, Avicenna significantly modifies the Aristotelian tradition that he received. The more he considered the matter, the more he deviated from Aristotle, in a Platonic direction.

Avicenna located the internal senses in three ventricles of the brain, placing two in each ventricle, with receptive and retentive capacities respectively.[28] The common sense and (one aspect of) the imaginative faculty comprise the first pair, located in the front ventricle of the brain. The common sense coordinates the impressions received by the individual senses, in order to produce a unified picture of a sensible object. This includes, as Aristotle said, impressions that are related incidentally (kata symbebekê) to the object,[29] a phenomenon that links memory of past sensible impressions to a current sensation. This indicates a certain capacity to make judgments present already in the common sense.

The sensible forms that the common sense receives and unifies are then transmitted to the imaginative faculty, as Aristotle had said; except that Avicenna divides this faculty, calling the first appearance a quwwah musawwirah, or khayâl. It retains these forms fully, and is thus called in English, after the Arabic, the “retentive” as well as “informing,” or “formative,” imagination.[30]

The middle ventricle is the location of the next pair of internal senses, as Avicenna first conceived them. They comprise a novel faculty of “estimation” (following the Latin aestimatio), wahm in Arabic; and a second, chameleon type faculty. It functions both imaginatively (in animals and humans), and rationally (in humans alone). As another aspect of the imaginative faculty, Avicenna calls it simply al-mutakhayyîlah, “the imagination,” but due to its function it is known as the “compositive imagination.” However, when this faculty deals with specific, materially based concepts, Avicenna calls it qûwah mufakkirah, a thinking or “cogitative” faculty.

Avicenna posits the existence of an estimative faculty in order to explain the innate ability in all animals (humans included) to sense a non-sensible intention (ma‘nan) that is intrinsic to the object as perceived by the subject. Intentions are thus the extra-sensible properties that an object presents to an animal or person at the moment of perception. These intentions affect the perceiver powerfully, such as the negative feelings a sheep senses in perceiving a wolf, or the positive feelings sensed in perceiving a friend or child.[31]

Avicenna does not limit wahm to animals, as Averroes later assumed,[32] but rather conceived it broadly, affecting logical as well as physical subjects. He believed estimation grasps the core characteristic of every discrete physical object, the intention that distinguishes it from every other object.

In addition to the faculty of estimation, and akin to it in being innate and spontaneous, Avicenna recognized, with Aristotle, a faculty of intuition (hads) that is the key step in obtaining certain knowledge. This is the ability a person has to discern suddenly the middle term of a putative syllogism, the proposition that anchors a particular argument.[33] Avicenna recognizes that occasionally brilliant individuals exist whose intuitive sense is so innately strong that they can do without much prior experience, empirically or rationally. In extreme and rare cases, there are individuals, like the prophets, with a developed intuitive acumen, dhakâ’ (Aristotle's anchinoia), that enables them to know instantly the entire subject matter of a given science. While not part of his normative epistemology, Avicenna attempts to accommodate this phenomenon scientifically, seeing it not as an innate power of an internal sense, but as an expression, however rare, of the emanative powers of the Agent Intellect.

Avicenna believes that the intentions that the estimative faculty obtains are received in the third and rear ventricle of the brain, in memory, hafizah . Memory shares the third ventricle with a faculty of recollection (dhikr), which retains the estimative intentions ready for recall.

Remembering for Avicenna thus consists in the collation by the imaginative/cogitative faculty of estimative intentions on the one hand, and the appropriate sensible forms retained by the formative imagination, on the other. For that reason, this “second” aspect of the imaginative faculty is referred to as the “compositive imagination;” both it and the cogitative faculty deal with specific sensible forms and concepts, respectively, presenting them exactly and completely. They do this by combining the impressions received by the common sense and estimation, and separating out what is not relevant to the object.

The cogitative faculty is primarily concerned with practical issues rooted in material being, forming judgments based on empirical data with the help of innate powers of abstraction and logical acumen. In what may well be a nod to tradition, Avicenna counts the “reports (al-akhbâr) to which the soul gives assent on account of unbroken and overwhelming tradition (shiddah al-tawâtur)” as a further credible source for forming practical judgments.[34]

For Avicenna, animals have this developed imaginative faculty only. It allows them to represent to themselves that which they remember, and also affords them the ability, like human beings, to dream. The cogitative faculty in human beings, on the other hand, allows them to go beyond instinctive remembering, and introduces an element of rational deliberation that is limited primarily to purely individual, discrete objects and actions.[35]

Avicenna considers estimation to be involved with the cogitative faculty in reconstructing a specific, physically based concept. As such, it can influence that faculty, and when excessive, be responsible for the fantasies and fictions in our dreams and thoughts (Black 2000, 227–28). Similarly, the estimative faculty can over-reach itself in logical matters by using the syllogisms that it helped create to pass judgments on immaterial beings, thus leading to false judgments in metaphysics.[36]

As described, many of the internal senses, particularly the extended activities of estimation and the cogitative faculty, perform in ways that encroach upon the preserve of the rational faculty and threaten to compromise its objectivity and separate, immaterial nature, damaging the soul in its quest for immortal bliss. Consequently, in his later writings Avicenna distanced intuition from any physical base within estimation and the brain, locating it amorphously in the soul as a divine emanation; and he limited the internal faculty of cogitation to thinking of particular conceptual concepts only.[37]

This attempt to separate the rational faculty from the internal senses is echoed in Avicenna's treatment of the stages in the development of the intellect. He views the entire cognitive process in which the internal senses were preoccupied as a necessary (for most people) but insufficient condition for possessing true knowledge. The efforts of the internal senses are seen in some of his major compositions as having but a propadeutic effect on the soul, preparing it to receive the universal intelligible notions that are its ultimate goal and, ultimately, its sole concern. These intelligible ideas are not abstracted from the imagination, as Aristotle would have it, but come from the universal Agent Intellect, transforming the purely potential and passive intellect into an acquired intellect (‘aql mustafâd).[38] This is an active state of cognition, when the intellect is actively conjoined to its intelligible object. Ultimately, this conjunction is with the Agent Intellect, the source of all forms on earth.

Avicenna also posits, as had Aristotle originally, the existence of an intermediate stage of potentiality, calling it an “intellect in habitu” (al-‘aql bi’l-malakah). At this stage, the intellect's acquired intelligibles are not being used, and are therefore potential.[39] However, treating the active acquired intellligibles as potential seemed contradictory to Avicenna, so he returns them to the Agent Intellect, where they are deposited and await recollection by the intellect in habitu. This intellect does not therefore store the acquired intelligibles, but merely serves to facilitate their reacquisition from the Agent Intellect.[40]

The Agent intellect is, then, the source of intelligible forms on earth, and the source of our being able to conceive of them. It functions much as does the sun, illuminating both subject and object of intellection, and is present at every stage of the individual person's intellectual development (Davidson 1992, 86, 87, 92).

While most people require preliminary training of the senses to prepare their souls for intellectual cognition, which the Agent Intellect automatically grants,[41] some few individuals with prodigious intuitions can, as we saw, grasp intelligible concepts and propositions immediately. Avicenna labels the intellects of such intuitively endowed persons “holy” (‘aql qudsî), and calls the Agent Intellect the “Holy Spirit” (al-rûh al-qudsî).[42] Prophets have this sense to an extreme degree, receiving emanations of all, or nearly all, of the intelligible forms in the Agent Intellect. It is “not far-fetched” (wa lâ yab‘ud), Avicenna says, that the imaginative faculties of such persons are able to depict the emanated universal intelligible forms in particular, sensory, terms.[43]

Prophecy is thus a natural, if exceptional, occurrence for Avicenna, who equivocates on the issue of personal providence. However much God is the final cause of intellection, He is not directly involved in the entire process, a sanctified Agent Intellect being His intermediary to man. Here as elsewhere, we see Avicenna attempt to accommodate his philosophy to traditional religious conceptions.

Avicenna has severed the natural link between imagination and intellection, in order to preserve the immaterial and immortal nature of the soul. It is dependent on the Agent Intellect entirely, with only the soul's independent substantiality separating it from being totally absorbed in it.

4. Averroes

Averroes (Abu’l-Walîd Muhammad b. Ahmad ben Rushd, 1126–98) hews closer to the Peripatetic tradition than his predecessors, and it is as The Commentator on Aristotle that he was known in Europe. He commented on De anima three times, and wrote an epitome of the Parva Naturalia. His Short Commentary on De anima is also, and more correctly, an epitome, being a summary of Aristotle's work rather than a precise and more literal commentary, as are his Middle and Long, or Grand, commentaries.[44] In the Short Commentary, Averroes sets the stage for Aristotle's description of the soul by offering a capsule summary of his main teachings in physics, meteorology, and physiology. These mainly concern the hylomorphic composition of all bodies; the nature of the four elements; and the generative role in an organism caused by the heavenly bodies and by the innate heat, or pneuma, of a body.[45] The soul, Averroes thus indicates, is the product of natural causes, both proximate and remote, terrestial and celestial. Among the latter is the Agent Intellect, whose relation to bodies, like that of the other heavenly intelligences, is “incidental” (or “accidental,” bi’l-‘araḍ), since it is essentially “separate” from them, being immaterial.

Averroes stresses the hierarchical structure of the soul, beginning with the nutritive faculty. It serves as a substrate for the sensory faculties, their matter “disposed” to receive sensory perceptions. This disposition is the first perfection or actuality of the sensory faculty, rendering that faculty's potentiality an actual, if still unrealized, state of being. The higher faculty is thus present, albeit potentially, in the lower.

Each faculty is similarly sustained by one more material, or less “spiritual,” than it: the senses serve as substrate for the common sense, it the substrate for the imagination, and that faculty the substrate for the rational faculty.[46] As such, the imagination follows the senses in providing the intellect with images that have intelligible dimensions, or “intentions” (ma‘ânî), which term Averroes uses more broadly than heretofore. These intentions are present in the form presented to the senses, but must wait upon an intellect to appreciate them, being represented first as sensible and then imaginative intentions to the senses and imagination, respectively. Averroes thus employs “intentions” to convey not the form of the perceptible object as it is, but as it is sensed, imagined, remembered or intellected by the respective faculties of the soul.

Averroes' contribution to the philosophy of mind lies primarily in his attempt to refine and redefine the activities of the internal senses, and to determine the nature of the hylic, or material, intellect. He discusses the role of the internal senses primarily in his De anima commentaries as well as in his epitomes on the senses and memory. His work builds on Aristotle and the psychological writings of his Andalusian predecessor Ibn Bâjjah (d. 1138), known to the West as Avempace.[47] Averroes' work also incorporates a response and rebuke to Avicenna, rejecting, among other things, his elevation of wahm, estimation, to the status of an additional internal sense. For Averroes, imagination and memory can do the work of Avicenna's estimative faculty.

Aristotle had begun his treatise On Memory by distinguishing between the acts of remembering and recollecting. He saw both as related to, though distinct from, the internal senses (common sense and imagination) and the rational faculty.[48]

In Aristotle's view, the imagination internalizes and copies an object originally presented to the senses and assembled into a single sensation by the common sense; and the memorative faculty receives “some such thing as a picture” (zôgraphêma ti), “a sort of impression” (tupon tina) of that percept (transmitted through the imagination).[49] Recollection is a deliberative act that joins the impression retained in memory with the percept as originally imagined.

Elaborating on Aristotle's text, Averroes regards memory as created by a process of continuous abstraction, or “spiritualization.” The form of an external object is sensed at first with its many “rinds” or husks of corporeality (qushûr), for which read particularity. The common sense and then the imaginative faculty[50] receive (intentional adaptations of) this form in an increasingly immaterial manner, followed by a “discriminating faculty,” i.e., the cogitative faculty, treated as another internal sense.[51] This faculty actually serves as a bridge between imagination and intellect, dealing with particular images as it does, but selecting out the most distinctive aspect of each percept. It brings the purification process to a close, memory (dhikr) receiving an essentialized notion or intention of a particular percept.[52]

Memory stores these dismembered essentialized images and is able to remember them at will, that is, with an act of will. Recollection (tadhakkur) rejoins them in the cogitative faculty with full images that flesh out the corporeal features of the sought object. As described, there is a parallel between the activity of memory and that of the intellect in habitu as developed by Alexander of Aphrodisias, for both retain the essential notions that form respectively the previously apprehended contents of a given particular percept (the role of memory) or of a universal concept (the intellect in habitu).

While generally restricting the memorative faculty to the intentions of a given imagined form, Averroes acknowledges that it also relates to universals. This is done through the cogitative faculty, associating the universal with some particular image, recollected with the assistance of the intention stored in the memorative faculty; an “intention” that is the distinctive character or nature of that image.[53] That is to say, one remembers a universal idea by remembering an image that connotes it. As Aristotle says, “without an image, thinking is impossible.”[54]

Averroes thus understands recollection as a three-fold operation: the cogitative faculty employs the intentions of an imagined form retained in memory, and combines them with the original sensory image to elicit a full recollection of the percept desired.[55] The similarity of this scheme to that developed by Avicenna is striking, though Averroes' scheme is more parsimonious.

Averroes recognizes with Avicenna that animals have an acute intentional sense, and are able to identify non-sensible qualities in the nature of others immediately, thereby enhancing their survival. Averroes considers this a function of the imagination, abetted by memory, and doesn’t grant it the status of an independent “estimative” faculty (wahm), not wanting to multiply the soul's faculties more than Aristotle had done.[56]

Averroes follows Galen and “the consensus of opinion” rather than Aristotle in locating the internal senses and memory in various parts of the brain: the common sense and imaginative faculty in the forward lobe, the cogitative faculty in the middle, and memory in the rear.[57] Good memory is said to depend on dryness in the front and back of the brain, poor memory due to moisture that prevents images and ideas from retaining their hold. The best disposition, manifest mostly in youth, is of a middle kind, enabling both quickness of understanding (the positive benefit of moisture) and a long memory.[58]

While the internal senses, as of course the external senses, have physical locations in the organs of the body, the rational faculty has not. That does not prevent Averroes from conceiving it as being structured in the hylomorphic pattern that is characteristic of Aristotle's physics. As expressed in the Epitome to De anima, it is the cogitative faculty, there called simply the practical intellect, which first processes sensory and imaginative intentions, exercising choice and deliberation along rational lines both inductive and deductive. This practical intellect then serves as matter or substrate for its theoretical counterpart, which abstracts the universal idea or proposition from the particular subject formerly addressed.[59]

The theoretical intellect's striving for universal truth is the acme of the soul's perfection, which Averroes calls a “very divine” pursuit,[60] though he believes relatively few individuals succeed at it. The ultimate knowledge sought is of the Agent Intellect itself. Mankind as a whole has not reached this level, but it will one day, since “nature refuses” to allow all true (and finite) possibilities not to be eventually realized (given an eternal universe).[61]

While this statement is not repeated in his other two commentaries on De anima, Averroes' belief in the attainment of personal perfection through knowledge of the Agent Intellect remained constant. Every cognition of an intelligible is an act of identification of subject and object, no material barrier existing between them.[62] Knowledge of the Agent Intellect, however, is thought to surpass everything else, its content uniquely and totally comprehensive. The species of all forms on earth are found unified in it in a way that renders it a single intelligible being.

Averroes held to the view of the Agent Intellect as a form of (earthly) forms throughout his life, though his understanding of the relationship between it and the forms on earth underwent change. While first thinking the Agent Intellect an emanative substance that bestowed forms on all sub-lunar substances, he later regarded it in Aristotelian terms simply as an efficient cause of intellection, “illuminating” or actualizing both the potentially intelligent subject and intelligible object.[63] However, as the ultimate object of humanity's quest for knowledge, the Agent Intellect served as a final cause of intellection, conjunction with it offering a person the greatest felicity (sa‘âdah) one's soul could have.

For Averroes, as for his predecessors, the intellectual potentiality of a person, represented by the hylic or material intellect, is brought into actuality by the Agent Intellect. This creates a latent store of ideas, the intellect in habitu (al-‘aql bi’l malakah), which become operationally the acquired intellect (al-‘aql al-mustafâd). It is in this last stage of the intellect's development that conjunction, ittisâl, with the Agent Intellect, is experienced, it being a unification (ittihâd) of subject and object.[64]

Averroes struggled more than his predecessors with the notion of the potential or “material” intellect. In the Epitome of De anima, he presents two positions, at first following an Alexandrian-Ibn Bâjjahian view that saw the material intellect as a disposition in the body or imaginative faculty; and then, to guarantee its immaterial objectivity, as a substance essentially outside the soul.[65] This latter view, reflecting that held by Themistius, is the one offered in the Long Commentary, to which he refers the reader in what is an obvious recommendation of the position he there holds.[66]

Averroes, however, has a third position on the nature of the material intellect. That is the view presented in his Middle Commentary, which he may well have written after the Long Commentary, or, as more likely, after a first draft of it.[67] The Latin West had only the Long Commentary in translation, and was ignorant of the philosophical alternative view of the material intellect presented in the Middle commentary. Though of importance only to Averroistically inclined Jewish philosophers, who read it in Hebrew translation and lacked a Hebrew translation of the Long Commentary, the Middle Commentary's position has a certain coherence worth noting.

As in his initial presentation in the Short Commentary, Averroes considers the material intellect, in the Middle Commentary, as relating directly to the imaginative faculty, or rather to the intelligible intentions to which that corporeal faculty is disposed. Now, however, Averroes emphasizes that this relation to the imaginative faculty is “incidental” to the nature of the material intellect, its essential relation being with the Agent Intellect. The material intellect is a temporary, discrete appearance in human beings of the eternal and always actual Agent intellect. It is our “first perfection,” while the Agent Intellect represents an ultimate perfection, or “final form” for us.[68]

The Middle Commentary fashions the material intellect from a fusion of the views of Alexander of Aphrodisias and Themistius. With Alexander, Averroes believes the material or potential intellect is a disposition or ability that the soul possesses to represent imaginative forms as abstract intelligibles;[69] while with Themistius, Averroes views the material intellect as a separate immaterial substance. It is, however, for Averroes in the Middle Commentary, but the substrate of this separate substance, the Agent Intellect being its full and eternally actual expression.

In the Long Commentary, Averroes retains the separate, i.e., immaterial yet substantial nature of the material and Agent intellects, and their relation of potential to actual intelligibility. However, he treats them as two separate substances, not two aspects of the same intelligence. The material intellect is thus hypostatized, treated as a “fourth kind of being,” the celestial principle of matter qua potentiality that, together with the formal principle represented by the Agent Intellect, explains the nature and activity of intelligible forms; even as sensible objects are constituted by similar hylomorphic principles.[70]

The Long Commentary thus sees the material intellect as “the last of the separate intellects in the (celestial) hierarchy,” following the Agent Intellect.[71] This physical relocation of the material intellect may guarantee its incorruptibility and objectivity, for Averroes, but it does not explain the presence in human beings of a rational faculty, a presence that Averroes recognizes. To that purpose, he enlarges the role of cogitation (fikr) in the cognitive process. As mentioned above, he sees it as a corporeal faculty located in the brain that is able to receive and process both the imaginative intentions found in sensation, and the intelligible intentions of the imagination, thereby initiating the process of abstraction and universalization that the material and Agent intellects complete.[72] Averroes also introduces in the Long Commentary a “passible intellect” that has a similar corporeal nature and function, that of bridging the particular and universal domains of images and intelligibles.[73]

Yet, for all his attempts in the Long Commentary to distance the material intellect from an individual corruptible body through what may be seen as surrogate intellectual powers, Averroes involves the material intellect, and even the Agent Intellect, with a person's intellectual development. Their presence is essential to the individual striving for rational perfection, however non-essential from the standpoint of the universal substances themselves. The location of these immaterial faculties in the soul is nowhere explicit, neither in the Middle or Long commentaries, but their function and internal dynamic is similarly presented. The individual perfects his/her intellect, and the more it is perfected, i.e., the more abstract truths accumulate, the less particular and individual it is, the less it “belongs” to that person. Ultimately, a person's fully realized intellect is able theoretically to conjoin with the Agent Intellect, all traces of individuality excised.

Averroes was aware that very few if any individuals reach intellectual perfection, i.e., mastery of all there is to know, and even that person cannot maintain the state of conjunction indefinitely, being human and requiring food, drink, and non-intellectual pursuits. So it is that Averroes, in all his commentaries and other writings on the subject, does not deprecate the existence in living beings of intellectual individuation. This was thought by many to be denied by Averroes' theory of monopsychism, in which there is but one material as well as agent intellect.

In one of his minor essays on the topic, Averroes portrays the fully realized acquired intellect of a person as losing its identity upon attaining conjunction with the Agent Intellect,[74] being totally absorbed in it. This can happen to the rare individual while alive, though it is a temporary state of being then. Upon the demise of a body, however, the immaterial intellect of every one, however much or little developed, is enveloped within the one Agent Intellect. The contingent and material circumstances that brought the individual to recognize universal truths and which affected the particular composition of that person's soul do not endure, and the universal intelligibles acquired have no substance with which to remain other than the Agent Intellect, where they are always represented.

In conclusion, one may say that the psychology of the classical Muslim philosophers was torn between Aristotelian and Neoplatonic perspectives, with attempted syntheses that favored one perspective or another. The naturalism of Aristotle was frequently subverted in the quest for a knowledge of universal truths that promised eternal bliss, however philosophically difficult that concept proved to be.


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Al-Farabi | Al-Kindi | Al-Razi [Fakhr al-Din] | Alexander of Aphrodisias | Arabic and Islamic Philosophy, disciplines in: natural philosophy and natural science | Aristotle | Aristotle, General Topics: psychology | Avicenna [Ibn Sina] | Galen | Ibn Bâjja | Ibn Rushd | imagination | intentionality: in ancient philosophy | intentionality: medieval theories of | memory | mental representation: in medieval philosophy | Plato | Plotinus | soul, ancient theories of