Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Albert the Great

First published Mon Mar 20, 2006; substantive revision Fri Apr 20, 2012

Albertus Magnus, also known as Albert the Great, was one of the most universal thinkers to appear during the Middle Ages. Even more so than his most famous student, St. Thomas of Aquinas, Albert's interests ranged from natural science all the way to theology. He made contributions to logic, psychology, metaphysics, meteorology, mineralogy, and zoology. He was an avid commentator on nearly all the great authorities read during the 13th Century. He was deeply involved in an attempt to understand the import of the thought of Aristotle in some orderly fashion that was distinct from the Arab commentators who had incorporated their own ideas into the study of Aristotle. Yet he was not averse to using some of the outstanding Arab philosophers in developing his own ideas in philosophy. His superior understanding of a diversity of philosophical texts allowed him to construct one of the most remarkable syntheses in medieval culture.

1. Life of Albert the Great

The precise date of Albert's birth is not known. It is generally conceded that he was born into a knightly family sometime around the year 1200 in Lauingen an der Donau in Germany. He was apparently in Italy in the year 1222 where he was present when a rather terrible earthquake struck in Lombardy. A year later he was still in Italy and studying at the University of Padua. The same year Jordan of Saxony received him into the Dominican order. He was sent to Cologne in order to complete his training for the order. He finished this training as well as a course of studies in theology by 1228. He then began teaching as a lector at Cologne, Hildesheim, Freiburg im Breisgau, Regensburg, and Strassburg. During this period he published his first major work, De natura boni.

Ten years later he is recorded as having been present at the general chapter of the Dominican Order held in Bologna. Two years later he visited Saxony where is observed the appearance of a comet. Some time between 1241 and 1242 he was sent to the University of Paris to complete his theological education. He followed the usual prescription of lecturing on the Sentences of Peter Lombard. In addition he began writing his six part Summa parisiensis dealing with the sacraments of the Church, the incarnation and resurrection of Christ, the four coevals, human nature, and the nature of the good. He took his degree as master of theology in 1245 and began to teach theology at the university under Gueric de Saint-Quentin. St. Thomas Aquinas became his student at this time and remained under Albert's direction for the next three years. In 1248 Albert was appointed regent of studies at the studium generale that was newly created by the Dominican order in Cologne. So Albert, along with Thomas Aquinas, left Paris and went to Cologne. Thomas continued his studies under Albert in Cologne and served as magister studium in the school as well until 1252. Then Thomas returned to Paris to take up his teaching duties while Albert remained in Cologne, where he began to work on the vast project he set himself of preparing a paraphrase of each of the known works of Aristotle.

In 1254 the Dominican order again assigned Albert a difficult task. He was elected the prior provincial for the German-speaking province of the order. This position mandated that Albert spend a great deal of his time traveling throughout the province visiting Dominican convents, priories, and even a Dominican mission in Riga. This task occupied Albert until 1256. That year he returned to Cologne, but left the same year for Paris in order to attend a General Chapter of his order in which the allegations of William of St. Amour's De periculis novissimorum temporum against mendicant orders were considered. A little later Pope Alexander IV asked Albert to go to Anagni in order to speak to a commission of Cardinals who were looking into the claims of William. While engaged in this charge Albert completed his refutation of Averroistic psychology with his De unitate intellectus contra Averroistas. Afterwards Albert departed for another tour of the province of Germany. In 1257 he returned to the papal court, which was now located in Viterbo. He was relieved of his duties as prior provincial and returned again to Cologne as regent of studies. He continued to teach until 1259 when he traveled to Valenciennes in order to attend a General Chapter of his order. At that time, along with Thomas Aquinas, Peter of Tarentasia, Bonhomme Brito, and Florent de Hesdin, he undertook on behalf of his order an extensive discussion of the curriculum of the scholastic program used by the order.

The next year of his life found Albert once again appointed to an onerous duty. In obedience to the wishes of the pope Albert was consecrated a bishop of the Church and sent to Ratisbon (modern Regensburg) in order to undertake a reform of abuses in that diocese. Albert worked at this task until 1263 when Pope Urban IV relieved him of his duties and asked Albert to preach the Crusade in the German speaking countries. This duty occupied Albert until the year 1264. He then went to the city of Würzburg where he stayed until 1267.

Albert spent the next eight years traveling around Germany conducting various ecclesiastical tasks. Then in 1274 while he was traveling to the Council of Lyons Albert received the sad news of the untimely death of Thomas Aquinas, his friend and former student of many years. After the close of the Council Albert returned to Germany. There is evidence that he traveled to Paris in the year 1277 in order to defend Aquinas' teaching, which was under attack at the university. In 1279, anticipating his death he drew up his own last will and testament. On November 15, 1280 he died and was buried in Cologne. On December 15, 1931 Pope Pius XI declared Albert both a saint and a doctor of the Church. On the 16th of December 1941 Pope Pius XII declared Albert the patron saint of the natural sciences.

2. Philosophical Enterprise

An examination of Albert's published writings reveals something of his understanding of philosophy in human culture. In effect he prepared a kind of philosophical encyclopedia that occupied him up to the last ten years of his life. He produced paraphrases of most of the works of Aristotle available to him. In some cases where he felt that Aristotle should have produced a work, but it was missing, Albert produced the work himself. If he had produced nothing else it would be necessary to say that he adopts the Aristotelian philosophical-scientific program as his own. Albert's intellectual vision, however, was very great. Not only did he paraphrase “The Philosopher” (as the medievals called Aristotle) but Porphyry, Boethius, Peter Lombard, Gilbert de la Porrée, the Liber de causis, and Ps.-Dionysius. He also wrote a number of commentaries on the Bible. In addition to all of this work of paraphrasing and commenting, in which Albert labored to prepare a kind of unified field theory of medieval Christian intellectual culture, he also wrote a number of works in which he developed his own philosophical-scientific-theological vision. Here one finds titles such as De unitate intellectus, Problemata determinate, De fato, De XV problematibus, De natura boni, De sacramentis, De incarnatione, De bono, De quattuor coaequaevis, De homine, and his unfinished Summa theologiae de mirabilis scientia Dei.

Albert's labors resulted in the formation of what might be called a Christian reception of Aristotle in the Western Europe. Although Albert himself had a strong bias in favor of Neo-Platonism, his work on Aristotle shows him to have a deep understanding of the Aristotelian program. Along with his student Thomas Aquinas he was of the opinion that Aristotle and the kind of natural philosophy that he represented was no obstacle to the development of a Christian philosophical vision of the natural order. In order to establish this point Albert carefully dissected the method that Aristotle employed in undertaking the task of expounding natural philosophy. This method, Albert decided, is experientially based and proceeds to draw conclusions by the use of both inductive and deductive logic. Christian theology, as Albert found it taught in Europe rested firmly upon the revelation of Sacred Scripture and the Church Fathers. Therefore, he reasoned, the two domains of human culture are distinct in their methodology and pose no threat to each other. Both can be pursued for their own sake. Philosophy was not to be valued only in terms of its ancillary relation to theology.

3. Logic

Albert carefully prepared a paraphrase of Aristotle's Organon (the logical treatises in the Aristotelian corpus). He then used the results of this paraphrase to address the problem of universals as he found it discussed in the philosophical literature and debates of the medieval philosophical culture. He defined the term universal as referring to “ … that which, although it exists in one, is apt by nature to exist in many.”[1] Because it is apt to be in many, it is predicable of them. (De praed., tract II, c. 1) He then distinguished three kinds of universals, those that pre-exist the things that exemplify them (universale ante rem), those that exist in individual things (universale in re), and those that exist in the mind when abstracted from individual things (universale post rem).

Albert attempted to formulate an answer to Porphyry's famous problem of universals — namely, do the species according to which we classify beings exist in themselves or are they merely constructions of the mind? Albert appealed to his three-fold distinction, noting that a universal's mode of being is differentiated according to which function is being considered. It may be considered in itself, or in respect to understanding, or as existing in one particular or another.[2] Both the nominalist and realist solutions to Porphyry's problem are thus too simplistic and lack proper distinction. Albert's distinction thus allowed him to harmonize Plato's realism in which universals existed as separate forms with Aristotle's more nominalistic theory of immanent forms. For universals when considered in themselves (secudum quod in seipso) truly exist and are free from generation, corruption, and change.[3] If, however, they are taken in reference to the mind (refertur ad intelligentiam) they exist in two modes, depending on whether they are considered with respect to the intellect that is their cause or the intellect that knows them by abstraction.[4] But when they are considered in particulars (secundum quod est in isto vel in illo) their existence is exterior to as well as beyond the mind, yet existing in things as individuated.[5]

4. Metaphysics

Albert's metaphysics is an adaptation of Aristotelian metaphysics as conditioned by a form of Neo-Platonism. His reading the Liber de causis as an authentic Aristotelian text influenced his understanding of Aristotle. It seems that Albert never realized the Neo-Platonic origin of the work. As with the other works of Aristotle he prepared a paraphrase of the work entitled De causis et processu universitatis, and used it as a guide to interpreting other works by Aristotle. However, he also used the writings of Pseudo-Dionysius to correct some of the doctrine found in the Liber de causis.

Albert blends these three main sources of his metaphysics into a hierarchical structure of reality in which there is an emanation of forms directed by what Albert calls “a summoning of the good” (advocatio boni). The good operates metaphysically as the final cause of the order of forms in the universe of beings. But it is also the First Cause. And its operation in the created order of being is discovered as an attraction of all being back to itself. “We exist because God is good,” Albert explains, “and we are good insofar as we exist.”[6] Thus the balanced relations of the exit and return of all things according to classical Neo-Platonism is skewed in favor of the relationship of return. This is because Albert, as a Christian philosopher, favors a creationist view of being over the doctrine of pure emanation. Rejecting also the doctrine of universal hylomorphism Albert argues that material beings are always composite in which the forms are inchoate until they are called forth by the ultimate good. Spiritual creatures (excluding man) have no material element. Their being summoned to the good is immediate and final. The summoning of the inchoate forms of material beings, however, is not direct. It depends upon the intervention of the celestial spheres.

The First Cause, which Albert understands as God, is an absolutely transcendent reality. His uncreated light calls forth a hierarchically ordered universe in which each order of being reflects this light. God's giving existence to creatures is understood by Albert as their procession from him as from a first cause.[7] At the top of this hierarchy of light are found the purely spiritual beings, the angelic orders and the intelligences. Albert carefully distinguishes these two kinds of beings. He basically accepts the analysis of the angelic orders as found in Pseudo-Dionysius' treatise of the celestial hierarchy. The intelligences move the cosmic spheres and illuminate the human soul. The intelligences, just as the order of angels, form a special hierarchy. The First Intelligence, as Albert calls it, contemplates the entire universe and uses the human soul, as illuminated by the lower intelligences, to draw all creatures into a unity.

Beneath the angels and intelligences are the souls that possess intellects. They are joined to bodies but do not depend on bodies for their existence. Although they are ordered to the First Intelligence so as to enjoin contemplative unity on the entire cosmos, Albert rejects the Averroistic theory of the unity of the intellect. Each human soul has its own intellect. But because the human soul uniquely stands on the horizon of both material and spiritual being it can operate as a microcosm and thus can serve the purpose of the First Intelligence, which is to bind all creatures into a universe.

Finally there are the immersed forms. Under this heading Albert establishes another hierarchy with the animal kingdom at the top, followed by the plant kingdom, then the world of minerals (in which Albert had a deep interest), and finally the elements of material creation.

5. Psychology and Anthropology

Albert's interest in the human condition is dominated by his concern with the relationship of the soul to the body on the one hand and the important role that the intellect plays in human psychology. According to Albert, the essence of man is not the intellect.[8] With regard to the relationship between the soul and the body Albert appears to be torn between the Platonic theory which sees the soul as a form capable of existing independently of the body and the Aristotelian hylomorphic theory which reduces the soul to a functional relationship of the body. With respect to human knowing, for example, he maintains the position that the human intellect is dependent upon the senses.[9] In order to resolve the conflict between the two views Albert availed himself of Avicenna's position that Aristotle's analysis was focused on the function and not the essence of the soul. Functionally, Albert argues, the soul is the agent cause of the body. “Just as we maintain that the soul is the cause of the animated body and of its motions and passions insofar as it is animated,” he reasons, “likewise we must maintain that the lowest intelligence is the cause of the cognitive soul insofar as it is cognitive because the cognition of the soul is a particular result of the light of the intelligence.”[10] Having been created in the image and likeness of God it not only governs the body, as God governs the universe, but it is responsible for the very existence of the body, as God is the creator of the world. And just as God transcends his creation, so does the human soul transcend the body in its interests. It is capable of operating in complete independence of corporeal functions. This transcendental function of the soul allows Albert to focus on what he believes is the essence of the soul — the human intellect.

Viewed as essentially an intellect, the human soul is an incorporeal substance. Albert divides this spiritual substance into two powers — the agent intellect and the possible intellect.[11] Neither of these powers needs the body in order to function. Under certain conditions concerning its powers the human intellect is capable of transformation. While it is true that under the stimulus or illumination of the agent intellect the possible intellect can consider the intelligible form of the phantasms of the mind which are derived from the senses, it can also operate under the sole influence of the agent intellect. Here, Albert argues, the possible intellect undergoes a complete transformation and becomes totally actualized, as the agent intellect becomes its form. It emerges as what he calls the “adept intellect” (intellectus adeptus).[12] At this stage the human intellect is susceptible to illumination by higher cosmic intellects called the “intelligences”. Such illumination brings the soul of man into complete harmony with the entire order of creation and constitutes man's natural happiness. Since the intellect is now totally assimilated to the order of things Albert calls the intellect in its final stage of development the “assimilated intellect” (intellectus assimilativus). The condition of having attained an assimilated intellect constitutes natural human happiness, realizing all the aspirations of the human condition and human culture. But Albert makes it clear that the human mind cannot attain this state of assimilation on its own. Following the Augustinian tradition as set forth in the De magistro Albert states that “because the divine truth lies beyond our reason we are not able by ourselves to discover it, unless it condescends to infuse itself; for as Augustine says, it is an inner teacher, without whom an external teacher labors aimlessly.”[13] There is thus an infusion involved with divine illumination, but it is not a pouring forth of forms. Rather, it is an infusion of an inner teacher, who is identified with divine truth itself. In his commentary on the Sentences Albert augments this doctrine when he argues that this inner teacher strengthens the weakness of the human intellect, which by itself could not profit by external stimulation. He distinguishes the illumination of this interior teacher from the true and final object of the intellect.[14] Divine light is only a means by which the intellect can attain its object.[15] This is consistent with his emphasis upon the analogy of divine light and physical light, which pervades so much of his thinking. It follows, then, that in the order of human knowing there are first of all the forms that are derived from external things. They cannot teach us anything in any useful way until the light of an inner teacher illuminates them. So light is the medium of this vision. But the inner teacher himself is identified with the divine truth, which is the final object and perfection of the human intellect. In his Summa, however, Albert makes further distinctions concerning the object of human knowing. Natural things, he tells us, are received in a natural light, while the things that the intellect contemplates in the order of belief (ad credenda vero) are received in a light that is gratuitous (gratuitum est), and the beatifying realities are received in the light of glory.[16] It seems that Albert has abandoned the position that even naturalia require divine illumination. Strictly speaking, he has not abnegated his earlier position. Naturalia may very well still require the work of a restorative inner teacher. In the Summa, however, Albert is anxious to stress the radical difference natural knowing has from supernatural knowing. He has already established this difference in his study of the human intellect (De intellectu) where he tells us, “Some [intelligibles] with their light overpower our intellect which is temporal and has continuity. These are like the things that are most manifest in nature which are related to our intellect as the light of the sun or a strong scintillating color is to the eyes of the bat or the owl. Other [intelligibles] are manifest only through the light of another. These would be like the things which are received in faith from what is primary and true.”[17] But in both natural and supernatural knowing Albert is careful to stress the final object and perfection of the human intellect. This leads naturally to a consideration of Albert's understanding of ethics.

6. Ethics

Albert's ethics rests on his understanding of human freedom. This freedom is expressed through the human power to make unrestricted decisions about their own actions. This power, the liberum arbitrium, Albert believes is identified neither with the intellect nor the will. He holds this extraordinary position because of his analysis of the genesis of human action. In his treatise on man (Liber de homine) he accounts for human action as beginning with the intellect considering the various options for action open to a person at a given moment in time. This is coupled by the will desiring the beneficial outcome of the proposed event. Then the liberum arbitrium chooses one of the options proposed by the intellect or the object of the will's desire. The will then moves the person to act on the basis of the choice of the liberum arbitrium. Brutes do not have this ability, he argues, and must act solely on their initial desire. Hence they have no power of free choice. In his later writings, however, Albert eliminates the first act of the will. But even so he distinguishes the liberum arbitrium from both the will and the intellect, presumably so that it can respond to the influences of both these faculties equally. Thus the way to ethics is open.

Albert's concern with ethics as such is found in his two commentaries on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics. The prologues to both these works reveal Albert's original thoughts on some problems about the discipline of ethics. He wonders if ethics can be considered as a theoretical deductive science. He concludes that it can be so considered because the underlying causes of moral action (rationes morum) involve both necessary and universal principles, the conditions needed for a science according to the analysis of Aristotle that Albert accepted.[18] The rationes morum are contrasted by him to the mere appearance of moral behaviour.[19] Thus virtue can be discussed in abstraction from particular actions of individual human agents. The same is true of other ethical principles. However, Albert maintains that it is possible to refer to particular human acts as exemplifying relevant virtues and as such to include them in a scientific discussion of ethics.[20] Therefore, ethics is theoretical, even though the object of its theory is the practical.

Another concern that Albert expresses is how ethics as a theoretical deductive science can be relevant to the practice of the virtuous life. He addresses this problem by distinguishing ethics as a doctrine (ethica docens) from ethics as a practical activity of individual human beings (ethica utens).[21] The outcomes of these two aspects of ethics are different he argues. Ethics as a doctrine is concerned with teaching. It proceeds by logical analysis concentrating on the goals of human action in general. As such its proper end is knowledge. But as a practical and useful art ethics is concerned with action as a means to a desired end.[22] Its mode of discourse is rhetorical — the persuasion of the human being to engage in the right actions that will lead to the desired end.[23] Albert sees these two aspects of ethics as linked together by the virtue of prudence. It is prudence that applies the results of the doctrine of ethics to its practice.[24] Ethics considered as a doctrine operates through prudence as a remote cause of ethical action. Thus the two functions of ethics are related and ethics is considered by Albert as both a theoretical deductive science and a practical applied science.

Albert goes beyond these methodological considerations. He addresses the end of ethics, as he understands it. And here his psychology bears fruit. For he embraces the idea that the highest form of human happiness is the contemplative life. This is the true and proper end of man, he claims. For the adept intellect, as noted above, is the highest achievement to which the human condition can aspire. It represents the conjunction of the apex of the human mind to the separated agent intellect. In this conjunction the separated agent intellect becomes the form of the soul. The soul experiences self-sufficiency and is capable of contemplative wisdom. This is as close to beatitude as man can get in this life. Man is now capable of contemplating separated beings as such and can live his life in almost stoical detachment from the concerns of sublunar existence.

7. The Influence of Albert the Great

Albert's influence on the development of scholastic philosophy in the thirteenth century was enormous. He, along with his most famous student Thomas of Aquinas, succeeded in incorporating the philosophy of Aristotle into the Christian West. Besides Thomas, Albert was also the teacher of Ulrich of Straßburg (1225 – 1277), who carried forward Albert's interest in natural science by writing a commentary on Aristotle's Meteors along with his metaphysical work, the De summo bono; Hugh Ripelin of Straßburg (c.1200 – 1268) who wrote the famous Compendium theologicae veritatis; John of Freiburg (c.1250 – 1314) who wrote the Libellus de quaestionibus casualibus; and Giles of Lessines (c. 1230 – c. 1304) who wrote a treatise on the unity of substantial form, the De unitate formae. The influence of Albert and his students was very pronounced in the generation of German scholars who came after these men. Dietrich of Freiberg, who may have actually met Albert, is probably the best example of the influence of the spirit of Albert the Great. Dietrich (c. 1250 – c. 1310) wrote treatises on natural science, which give evidence of his having carried out actual scientific investigation. His treatise on the rainbow would be a good example. But he also wrote treatises on metaphysical and theological topics in which the echoes of Albert can be distinctly heard. Unlike Albert he did not write commentaries on Aristotle, but preferred to apply Albertist principles to topics according to his own understanding. On the other hand Berthold of Moosburg (+ c. 1361) wrote a very important commentary on Proclus' Elements of Theology, introducing the major work of the great Neo-Platonist into German metaphysics. Berthold's debt to Albert is found throughout his commentary, especially with regard to metaphysical topics. Many of these Albertist ideas and principles passed down to thinkers such as Meister Eckhart, John Tauler, and Heinrich Suso where they took on a unique mystical flavor. The Albertist tradition continued down to Heymeric de Campo (1395 – 1460) who passed it on to Nicholas of Cusa. From Nicholas the ideas pass down to the Renaissance. The philosophers of the Renaissance seem to have been attracted to the Albert's understanding of Neo-Platonism and his interest in natural science.


Primary Literature

Secondary Literature

Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
inpho icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
phil papers icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Aristotle | Aristotle, General Topics: metaphysics | Augustine, Saint | Avicenna [Ibn Sina] | binarium famosissimum [= most famous pair] | Cusanus, Nicolaus [Nicolas of Cusa] | Dietrich of Freiberg | free will | Meister Eckhart | properties | Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite | soul, ancient theories of | substance