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18th Century French Aesthetics

First published Sun Feb 29, 2004; substantive revision Wed Dec 14, 2011

The birth of aesthetics as a field lies at the junction between Enlightenment ideals and the teachings of taste: reason is no longer seen as a truth system but increasingly as a faculty of testing and evaluating, and accordingly it cannot put aside as irrelevant the lessons of sentiment and individuality. Art becomes a powerful stimulant of human social activities and an inexhaustible subject for philosophical inquiry. Because of the vitality of its philosophical background and the spreading of French as an international code of communication, France has been a privileged laboratory of this evolution, both a place suited for multiple attempts and critiques and a favorable one for synthesis.

1. An age of quarrels

No period in history is monolithic. Even if the very subordination of artistic management to the power of the Sun King fosters an impression of uniformity and self-assurance, a closer examination of it reveals evidence of tensions and even conflicts. And as usual, these are the seeds of major changes to come.

Some of these quarrels are only petty disputes begotten by events of limited scope. The most characteristic of them arose through controversial plays, when there are grounds for contention between two sides or two ways to pass judgment. It can be an occasion of trouble concerning matter and manner: if Corneille's first hit, The Cid (1636), sets up one of the strongest schemas of classical theater, i.e. the contest of love and duty, it does it in a form reminiscent of baroque poetry that admits of verse and genre discrepancies. Later on, he will justify in his Discourses (1660) such standing back from Aristotle's principles, though of course he does not ask for them to be abandoned. Another kind of situation deals with censorship and sensitive subjects in an absolutist society. A significant case is Molière's Tartuffe (1664 and 1669) because, being an attack against some false devout attitudes, it was at risk of being received as a satire of religion itself. It is worth noticing that, though the Company of the Blessed Sacrament succeeded in imposing a ban on public performances, the personal support of the King allowed Molière to prevail in the end.

Others may seem outwardly to be mere skirmishes among rivals, but as a rule they conceal more substantial stakes. For example, on January 1674, Alceste by Lully and Quinault was derided by musicians kept out of things and by Boileau who despised the libretto's author. However, the situation got more complicated when in August Racine gave his Iphigénie. The two plays have in appearance nothing in common, except that Euripides inspired both. Hence the polemical episode is not so much about the two works as about the true sense of imitating the Ancients. One then becomes convinced that all these more or less professional rivalries come within a single large controversy that structures an important part of the intellectual life of the period, known as the Querelle of Ancients and Moderns, and that is a reliable indicator of attitudes toward art and society whose effects last until late in the century.

The Querelle is usually divided into three distinct phases. The first had its roots in Italy when writers like Boccalini, Tassoni, and Lancelotti were motivated to upgrade the present's achievements in comparison with Antiquity's heritage. But the Querelle reached its climax in France, for political as well as cultural reasons. The first thing to take into account — an essential point often underestimated in this context — is the impulse of the scientific revolution: Galileo's physics superseding Aristotle's. Descartes plays an important part in shaking scholastic thought and this fact, more than the actual content of his doctrine, has repercussions far beyond the field of science. As Pascal puts it, his contemporaries deserve to be called truly Ancients, because knowledge is a cumulative process making it easier to move forward when time goes on and foundations are made secure. Another important cause of tension was the persistent use of mythological themes in art and literature, in a society still devoted to Christianity. Desmarets de St-Sorlin did his best to prove the “Christian marvelous” was of equal worth; but his subjects, taken from history (like Clovis) or from the Bible (like Mary-Magdalene) were at the same time an act of allegiance to an absolutist concept of political power.

It is precisely that aspect which becomes prominent in the second phase, when Perrault reads his poem The Century of Louis the Great at the Academy, on January 27th, 1687. The poem combines an eloquent plea in favor of Moderns (later developed in the four volumes of the Parallel of the Ancients and Moderns, from 1688 to 1697) and a labored praise to the King. At this point, aesthetics and politics become entangled because disagreement concerns not mainly the value of works but the choice of an effective policy in the arts. Boileau, champion of the Ancient party, is unexpectedly also the most lucid on the disadvantages of the courtier attitude, and therefore he defends the “great style” as a simple style. Fontenelle, the new spokesman for the Moderns, is not far from his rival's view, but he sets this requirement differently: the need for freeing poetics from arbitrariness and conformism's shackles prevails over the obviousness of masterpieces. What is at stake is improvement in intellect and morality, which implies not considering works in isolation or sticking to a priori principles.

The last act, simultaneously in France and England, is known as the “Homer quarrel”, for it originates in several translations of Homer's Iliad, especially those by Anne Dacier (1699 and 1711) and Alexander Pope (1715–1724). The peak of the dispute is reached in France when Houdar de la Motte publishes a short version of Homer's poem, cleared of supposedly dated digressions (1714); Dacier counter-attacks straight off with her Of Causes of Corruption of Taste. Combativeness is fueled between defendants and opponents by replies and the quick transfer of libels across the Channel. On the English side, Wotton, Dryden, and Swift (in The Battle of the Books, 1704) are the most committed; in France, Saint-Hyacinthe, Boivin, Fathers Buffier and Terrasson are no less convinced — if indeed convincing — until Fénelon makes use of his diplomatic resources to get a reconciliation.

It might seem, at least when seen from the present day, that these are the last echoes of a rear-guard combat, then opposed to what was going on in pictorial arts at the same time. Here too, there is a conflicting situation, namely between the so-called Poussinists and Rubenists, but the repercussions were to be quite different. The historical background of this “Coloring quarrel” lies in the growing glory of Titian and Rubens, at first darkened by Raphael's and Michelangelo's fortune. The debate hinges of course on the status of color. For a long time, color had been disregarded, for at least three reasons: it is, in Le Brun's words, “but an accident produced by the reflection of light and that varies according to circumstances”; it appeals to sensuality whereas “we must not judge by our senses alone but by reason” as Poussin puts it; and it proves unable to serve as a foundation for painting, unlike drawing, which is related to the mind as recalled in the original sense of disegno and as required by the analogy between painting and rhetoric. It is Leonardo's reversal from the old dictum that painting is “dumb poesy” to the new one that “poetry is blind painting” which opens the way to a better consideration.

The painter Blanchard cautiously starts hostilities in the Academy in 1671. He does not want “to diminish the importance of design” but “to establish three things in defense of color: first, that color is just as necessary to the art of painting as design; secondly, that if we diminish the worth of color, we thereby also diminish the worth of painters; and thirdly, that color merited the praise of the ancients, and that it merits it again in our own age.” Design is a necessary foundation, certainly, but if the aim of the painter is “both to deceive the eyes and to imitate nature”, it is reasonable to conclude that color serves that goal best, because “herein lies the difference that distinguishes painting from all the other arts and which gives painting its own specific end”. It was an attempt to turn to his advantage Poussin's phrase that the aim of painting is delectation — but insufficient indeed to convince Le Brun and Champaigne, to say nothing of Testelin, the tyrannical and finicky Secretary and author of the rigid Tables of Precepts.

Two men were going to play a special role in the progress of the color crusade. To mention Félibien as the first one may appear to be a paradox, because he is generally and rightly considered as a representative of the orthodox view. But he was also liberally minded and concerned about the respect of differing opinions (it was to cost him his position!) and a fair balance between the gifts of the mind and the talents of the hand. For him, “beauty is a result of the proportion and symmetry between corporeal and material parts”, so that color cannot be discarded since “everything should appear so artfully connected that the whole painting seems to have been painted at one and the same time, and, as it were, from the same palette”. When he translates Du Fresnoy's De Arte Graphica (1668) and publishes his Dialogue upon Coloring (1673), Roger de Piles may appear to hold stronger views; however, by transferring emphasis from color to coloring, he too stresses the importance of harmony and the way it presupposes mastery of local color and chiaroscuro. When, a long time after, de Piles entered the Academy, he would give a large synthesis under the title Principles of Painting (1708), in which he insists that “true painting is such as not only surprises, but, as it were, calls to us; and has so powerful an effect, that we cannot help coming near it, as if it had something to tell us”, so that “the spectator is not obliged to seek for truth in a painting; but truth, by its effect, must call to the spectator, and force his attention”. That points to what he called “the whole together”, that is “a general subordination of objects one to another, as makes them all concur to constitute but one”, for the utmost satisfaction of the eye. The same lesson can be drawn from Antoine Coypel's writings, where “the excellence of painting” is no longer separate from “the aesthetic of the painter”. His nomination as Academy's Director in 1714 is the symptom that one page has been turned forever.

2. Sentiment and Taste

Although it is not wrong to say as a convenient summary that the 17th century is the culmination of classical culture, in that it promotes universal reason and artistic rules, by contrast with the next, which favors the powers of imagination and criticism, it would be difficult to find anywhere an abrupt line of demarcation. There are instead many limited developments, shifts of meaning rather than brand-new institutions, and lots of signs of which none is determinant by itself but whose addition adds up to a deeply revised overview.

Dominique Bouhours is a major reference point of this period of transition. Professor of humanities and very famous in the Paris salons, he published The Conversations of Aristo and Eugene in 1671, with a sequel in 1687. The two books were widely read, often reissued and the second translated into English as The Art of Criticism (1705). One significant feature (though not exceptional outside philosophy, as proven by Félibien and de Piles) is the adoption of the form of the dialogue, which affords two main benefits. First, it gives the opportunity to put in a face-to-face debate a representative of classicism, who is therefore very fond of Antiquity, and a lover of delicacy and charm. These characters personify respectively Boileau and what we could call an 18th century aesthete before the coining of the word. Secondly, it encourages the working out of thought in the guise of inquiry. Indeed, the dialogical presentation proves the best way to address objections, variations, or digressions that make up the real substance of investigation, prior to the intellectual content of the theses. So philosophical profit goes hand in hand with the pleasure of conversing. Bouhours himself leaves a total freedom of judgment to his reader; he wants his book to be only “a concise and easy rhetoric that is instructing more by means of instances than precepts and does not require any other rules than a lively and witty common sense” but, by claiming this, he anticipates the victory of the new spirit over orthodoxy.

Among the most typical notions stressed by Bouhours is the famous “je ne sais quoi”, “that indefinable something whose effects you feel”. The expression itself seems to foil any analysis; all you can say, as Gracián puts it, is to admit that “this certain something, without wanting any thing itself, enters into every thing to give it worth and value”. Bouhours writes that “the je ne sais quoi is like those beauties covered with a veil, which are the more highly prized for being less exposed to view, and to which the imagination always adds something”. Half a century later, Marivaux concludes that it is the attribute par excellence of Grace: “in these paintings that you like so, in these objects of every kind which so delight you, in the entire expanse of the grounds, in all that you perceive, here simple, here untended, irregular even, sometimes ornate, sometimes not, I am there and I show myself. I bestow my charm on everything, I surround you”. The important fact about all these wordings is not so much that they elude any attempt to grasp the sense of the phrase, at least in a single shape, it lies in the recognition that equivocity is no more to be discarded altogether. Behind the seemingly ineffable, what is to be found is the remainder of an emotional component that belongs to human nature as truly as does reason, and accordingly it justifies an original approach. The one who was to carry it out in France is du Bos, in his Critical Reflections on Poetry and Painting (1719).

At first sight, du Bos did not seem to be destined to play this part but he skillfully took advantage of favorable conditions. He had studied theology, was a diplomat and an historian, a theater and opera enthusiast, and above all, he had a thorough knowledge of erudition, particularly in classical archeology and numismatics. He was rather a rationalist, though hostile to Descartes, but he had traveled in the Netherlands and England, where he met Locke, and could read English (which was not so common in France at that time) as well as other languages. It is certain that he read Addison, maybe Shaftesbury, which fostered a sensualist trend of his own, without any trace of sentimentalism (contrary to Fénelon). His interests were quite eclectic since he was acquainted with Bayle and Leibniz, and also open to experimental philosophy. In 1719, he became a member of the Académie Royale des Inscriptions et Belles-Lettres and, as early as 1722, was elevated to the capacity of Perpetual Secretary. But his main claim to fame for posterity remains by far his Critical Reflections, of which Voltaire wrote in 1738 that it was “the most useful book ever written on these topics in every country of Europe”, published by a happy coincidence the same year as J. Richardson's The Science of a Connoisseur, which deals with connected matters.

The novelty assumed by du Bos shows itself immediately in the choice to begin with the subjective impression caused on contact with works of art. Anticipating Burke, he argues that aesthetic pleasure is an emotion, the physical result of the stirring of our organs, but indeed of a paradoxical nature since its effects “are never more applauded, than when they are most successful in moving us to pity”. While Nicole and Bossuet were scorning art, as guilty of diverting people from the real duties of life and salvation, du Bos insists that there is a necessity to fight against worries and tedium. However, such struggle makes passions attractive in spite of their menaces. Art is a method of rescue for it makes use of the pathetic while neutralizing its unpleasant effects: “Since the most pleasing sensations that our real passions can afford us, are balanced by so many unhappy hours that succeed our enjoyments, would it not be a noble attempt of art to endeavor to separate the dismal consequences of our passions from the bewitching pleasure we receive in indulging them? Is it not in the power of art to create, as it were, beings of a new nature? Might not art contrive to produce objects that would excite artificial passions, sufficient to occupy us while we are actually affected by them, and incapable of giving us afterwards any real pain or affliction?” For instance, the massacre of the innocents would be an unbearable spectacle to see but nevertheless Le Brun's painting excites both our compassion and admiration.

Another feature that announces Diderot and Lessing is his awareness of the distinction between arts. Though open-minded and sensualist, du Bos does not call the framework of imitation into question, and he feels attached to the traditional hierarchy of subjects. In the sixth chapter, he agrees with Quintilian's precept that “the imitation operates always with less force than the object imitated”, which implies that genre paintings and satire poetry for instance cannot engage our attention for a long time. Even the most magnificent landscapes are powerless without figures, not forgetting Poussin's Arcadia, were it devoid of the shepherds and the sepulchral inscription. But what du Bos sees clearly is the failure of the famous “ut pictura poesis”. Although he is himself a man of letters, he understands that sensuousness decides in favor of painting, because of its sensible medium. As a matter of fact, “the art of painting is so extremely delicate and attacks us by means of a sense, which has so great an empire over our soul, that a picture may be rendered agreeable by the very charms of the execution, independent of the object which it represents: but I have already observed, that our attention and esteem are fixt then upon the art of the imitator, who knows how to please, even without moving us. We admire the pencil that has been so capable of counterfeiting nature.” Similar arguments have constantly been taken up again, e.g. by Diderot, Adam Smith and Goncourt. As for du Bos, it follows that poets and painters have to select subjects appropriate to the means of their arts; a sublime rejoinder in a tragedy would allow a trite rendering on a canvas, and conversely a vast scene full of animation that proves the mastery of the painter would only engender an annoying poem.

There is a second stage of analysis, that is the account of conditions that sustain the existence and value of art as a human phenomenon. This second part is a bit dated because it rests on the venerable theory of climates. He compares genius, “that ability received from nature to do well and easily certain things that the others could only achieve badly, even when they get a lot of trouble to do so”, with a plant which “so to speak, is growing by itself”. The emanations from the earth and the variations in quality of the air are for du Bos truly responsible for the productivity of countries and centuries. He does not subscribe however to a strong determinism; it would be more accurate to see him as a forerunner of historical consciousness of art, moderated by a touch of skepticism since he admits of a cyclical progress. The methodological lesson implied is that criticism is above all a research of causes, not a practice of judging. For all that, a cosmopolitan criticism is not bound to sacrifice any personal conviction, as du Bos exemplifies in his defense of Ancients fulfillment.

The Critical Reflections have been read and quoted extensively and still more often used without mention. An extreme case is the entry ‘Painting’ (by Jaucourt) in the Encyclopédie that amounts to a collage of almost thirty fragments taken from du Bos! Likewise Montesquieu in his Essay on Taste owes him more than is avowed. It is probably in Switzerland that his influence was the most fertile: Bodmer borrows from him to fight against Gottsched's academism, and Sulzer takes him as a basis for his theory of sensibility. Beyond that, his legitimate heirs are undoubtedly Lessing and Mendelssohn, the last freelance thinkers before the systematic program implemented by Baumgarten and Kant.

3. Rationalist Resistances

It may seem there is nothing more to be said on that matter, since the general trend of aesthetics was then settled. The breakthrough toward subjectivism is indeed compelling but rationalism was not finished yet for all that. The main reason is the strong import of Cartesian thought in the French-speaking world. Descartes himself has scarcely written on artistic topics and he was even doubtful about the possibility of a true analysis of aesthetic responses. But the systematic leanings of his thinking involve implications in this field also. It is clearly noticeable through the impact of the mechanics of passions in faces' physiognomy (witness Le Brun) or moods' expressions (Rameau). Art should have been an ideal place for studying the “union of soul and body”; however it was not this feature that came first in a rationally rooted theory of art.

Another consideration is the relevance of classification over estimation. As any other domain, art is thought to be structured by stable categories that prevail over the diversity of works and the variability of human attitudes. These categories have in fact a normative rather than a descriptive scope. An immediate outcome is the return of the objective question of the beautiful, apart from the subjective function of taste. But it does not come to put aside any stress on pleasure, because a successful illusion is not necessarily at odds with truthfulness. As a matter of fact, abstraction is not a bad start to get a hold on invention's and fiction's detours.

A significant landmark on this road is Crousaz's Treatise on Beauty (1714) whose title is indicative, as well as the choice to include a translation of Plato's Hippias major as an appendix. At first sight, it seems paradoxical that the first book worthy to qualify as philosophical aesthetics was written by a stern logician not concerned by works of art, but he was on the other hand very critical of scholastic logic and keen on pedagogy. Crousaz is convinced that men are happy in so far as they are reasonable; accordingly, his favorite subjects are the sciences, eloquence, virtue, and when Bernouilli attacked his single artistic chapter devoted to music, he preferred to replace it in 1724 by a long development upon religion. For him, there is a natural continuity from mathematics to the whole conduct of human life.

Crousaz does not provide original ideas as to the nature of the beautiful; he takes up the old dictum coined by Leibniz, that it is a mix of unity and diversity, so as to preserve order and proportion from both caprice and monotony. But he approaches it with a new awareness of the constraints and prejudices that obstruct the way: “Everyone possesses [an idea of the beautiful], but since it hardly ever appears alone we do not reflect upon it and fail to distinguish it from the tangle of other ideas which appear alongside it.” The root of this difficulty lies in the duality of human faculties: “Sometimes ideas and feelings are in agreement with each other and an object merits the qualification ‘beautiful’ on both counts. Sometimes, however, ideas and feelings are at war with each other and then an object pleases and at the same time does not: from one perspective it is beautiful, while from another it lacks beauty.” Crousaz does not put up with this divorce; on the contrary, we have a responsibility to discover “which principles regulate our approbation when we judge something from ideas only [or, as he likes to say, ”coolly“] and find it beautiful independently of feeling”. Taste is not discarded but rather viewed as a forerunner of what reason would have approved, had it time enough to weigh the ins and outs. So it is an essential shortcut of understanding that reconciles sensations with knowledge and gives evidence of the utmost wisdom of God. Similar ideas are also to be found in Frain du Tremblay, Brumoy or Trublet.

Father André's Essay on Beauty (1741) comes within the same territory, but with a strong influence from Malebranche, hence an upgrading of imagination and heart. According to the Cartesian distinction between ideas (innate, adventitious, and factitious), he suggests a classification of several degrees within the notion of the beautiful: the essential beautiful is “independent of any institution, even divine” and so is identified with the universal and immutable Order or divine Reason. The natural beautiful concerns the whole range of created things; it is “independent of any human opinion” but follows from God's will; it is present in the harmony and finality of nature. The lowest degree of beauty is a product of human activity and is partly arbitrary, because it combines intellectual as well as sensual ingredients. This sensible beautiful that speaks to the eye and ear is itself organized in three levels, in accordance with the respective importance of genius, taste, and caprice, of course in a downward order. Only genius is able to rise to the rational framework of things, when adequately supported by our faculties. André summarizes: “I call beautiful not what pleases to imagination's first sight É but what has a right to please reason and reflection by its own excellence.” For him (or his disciple, Séran de la Tour) there is no basic distinction between the beautiful and the true; that is the very definition of an aesthetics of perfection. Here too feeling is no residue resistant to any process of elimination; it is the normal affective accompaniment of any act of creation or reception, and a conclusive mark of humankind's originality as a species.

The case of Batteux is somewhat different; when he published The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle in 1746, he took up a challenge: to establish the Aristotelian orthodoxy firmly as the general basis for a unified system of the arts. The principle in question is of course the old notion of mimesis but generalized to any kind of art, which Aristotle or Horace did not worry about. To achieve it, he distinguishes the liberal arts whose object is pleasure (that is: music, poetry, painting, sculpture, and dance) from the mechanical ones, and he proposes an interpretation of what amounts to the “imitation of the beautiful nature”. He insists that imitation is not a matter of slavishly copying the given, but a sensible and enlightened process that gropes its way forward to the best result. Recalling the famous anecdote of Zeuxis composing his Helen out of parts taken from Crotone's most perfect women, he concludes that the artist has to imitate what reason decides to be nature's essence. That is why Batteux praises artifice so much: “art is made for fooling”, not because it is in duplicity's service but because truth is a complex construction that hides its fabric and development. Diderot takes up again the same point when he considers the peculiar “hieroglyphics” of all modes of expression.

In the end, there are two opposite heritages from Batteux. Sometimes he is criticized for his stubborn defense of systematic standards (as in his Principles of Literature, 1753), the uncompromising advocate of ut pictura poesis; sometimes he is recognized for his sense of enthusiasm, which makes him guess that the ideal is not to be found anywhere outside fiction and that the reality of pleasure parallels artistic skill. The same perspective holds also for Rameau. He sticks to Cartesianism with a passion and derides any attempt to derive music from experience. In his Demonstration of the Principle of Harmony (1750), he is anxious to make music and science but one thing instead of two. Accordingly, harmony becomes the fundamental texture of music, and melody a more superficial constituent. But after the so-called “Quarrel of Buffoons” where Rousseau took him to task (in his Letter about French Music of 1753, in favor of Italian opera), Rameau shut himself up in the certainty that music is the universal key for every subject, including even geometry. At this point, the dogmatic theorist has killed the musician of enchantment; reason has turned its own power against itself.

4. From connoisseurs to art critics

At the exact opposite is the figure of the connoisseur. If he is not a totally new personage on the scene of art history, his role is going to become more and more prominent for art's valuation. The great paintings and frescoes were ordered by patrons who had in mind the concern of their rank or that of the state. This does not mean that any consideration of intrinsic value was irrelevant, for instance in religious or decorative respects, but as a rule such considerations did not reflect personal leaning. The importance of the connoisseur presupposes a personal relation to the subject or technique and therefore a democratized access to the works. So after the great royal and nobiliary collections that gave rise to the first museums, there appeared less ambitious collections gathered by wealthy enthusiasts who shared a mutual taste for quality, and not only a lure toward curiosity as was common in Renaissance cabinets. Most often, these collections were composed of drawings, prints, coins, antiques, plaster or terracotta casts, less expensive and handier than paintings and sculptures.

Among the most famous of these connoisseurs are the financier Crozat and the Comte de Caylus. They did not content themselves with collecting thousands of works, they had a concern for reproducing them through printmaking and for indexing the whole; Julienne and Mariette were to be the inventors of the genre of the catalogue, imitated all through the century. Caylus or Dezallier d'Argenville also wrote on artists, sketching biographies and establishing rules of discernment for delicacy of style or lightness of execution. All this took place in the larger frame of cosmopolitan relations between amateurs of different countries and progress in traveling, with the nascent ritual of the Grand Tour.

Another fundamental factor that fostered the progressive transformation of a person fond of art into an authentic connoisseur able to state correct judgments or attributions was the institution of the Salon. The Royal Academy of Painting and Sculpture had been founded in 1648 but few exhibitions had been organized inside of it; on the other hand, series of lectures — first public, then private — were proposed, from 1667 onwards. But it is only from 1737 that regular shows of new works took place every two years, covering the various fields of visual arts. The existence of the Salon was a powerful stimulant for artistic activities, even if the limits of creation were narrowly controlled.

The Salon is of course a society event — which opens in the Louvre's Salon Carré on August 25th, that is St. Louis' day, to pay homage to the king — and as a convenient study guide of about two hundred supposedly representative works. But its most significant upshot is the birth of a new literary genre, which flourished until the 20th century, which has been an incomparable laboratory of aesthetic thought. At the beginning, such reviews were a blend of descriptive reports and theoretical asides, frequently not devoid of controversy. The point is nevertheless for the benefit of a larger public not involved in the institution; as La Font de Saint-Yenne put it in 1747: “an exhibited picture is the same as a book on the day of publication, and as a play performed in the theater: everyone has the right to make his own judgment. We have gathered together the judgments of the public which showed the greatest amount of agreement and fairness, and we now present them, and not at all our own judgment, to the artists, in the belief that this same public which judgments are so often bizarre and unjustly damning or hasty rarely errs when all its voices unite on the merit or weakness of any particular work.” With Caylus, Baillet de Saint-Julien, and then above all Diderot, aesthetic import is increasingly emphasized, opening the way to a long tradition of writers keen on painting.

The growth of Salon reviews has both a bearing on the new demands of journalism and the rise of a public opinion on artistic matters. As for Diderot, it was his German friend Grimm who invited him to contribute to the Correspondance littéraire, a very unusual newspaper that was not printed but hand-written and distributed in a handful of copies for liberal crown-headed readers. Diderot's first attempt in 1759 is a rather disappointing paper of less than twelve pages composed of the notes taken during his visit. It is all the more remarkable that he succeeded to raise this exercise to perfection in his reviews of 1763 and 1767. Since Diderot is a decisive landmark in the emergence of criticism, it is worth paying some attention to his practice. His attraction for art was indeed not recent but his first encounters were at an intellectual level, through the survey of Crousaz, Shaftesbury, and Hutcheson. He attached the utmost importance to the theme of blindness as a conceptual paradigm and also as a weapon against idealism. But Diderot is not only a passionate philosopher who thinks about the relations between knowledge and vision, he is more and more an enlightened amateur who enjoys painting, shows strong cravings and dislikes, and wishes to understand why.

Diderot's experience as a critic lies in the distance between two complementary attitudes: the evidence that art's trade secrets are unattainable and the challenge to recreate the result in literary material. That the painter's alchemy eludes the viewer's stance is something often repeated by Diderot, notably with respect to Chardin: “It's magic, one can't understand how it's done: thick layers of colour, applied one on top of the other, each one filtering through from underneath to create the effect. At times, it looks as though the canvas has misted over from someone breathing on it; at others, as though a thin film of water has landed on it … Close up, everything blurs, goes flat and disappears. From a distance, everything comes back to life and reappears.” (1763) Diderot belongs to the colorist party but his questioning is no less acute toward what makes the strength of drawing and what separates manner from mannerism. Though he confesses that “I praise, I blame after my personal feeling that does not amount to law” (1767), as early as 1765 he considers that his acquaintance with paintings gives him a right to write “a little Treatise on Painting” to expose his reasons for confidence in his judgments.

At the same time, Diderot is aware that the painter's power defies the writer to give the reader a substitute for the missing work. In front of a masterpiece, the first move might probably be to steal it; since it is repressed, it belongs to writing to appropriate its substance and recreate the old genre of ekphrasis. In an age ignorant of photography, it is necessary to provide the reader with a short description of the work in question, but in fact Diderot realizes far more than this: he is coining new methods to make his words equivalent to the sentiment delivered by the work. Amongst the most significant is the use of dialogue, sometimes real, sometimes with a virtual speaker who is usually Grimm himself. The whole of the brief Salon of 1775 is nothing but a conversation between the author and someone called Saint-Quentin. Another favorite device is the making of narratives that unfold the spatial organization of pictures. At the junction of the two lies an extraordinary purple passage devoted to Vernet (1767) in which Diderot imagines that each landscape painting is a real site discovered through walking and conversing; so to speak, the partners have entered the work. It is only in the seventh and last site that the deceit is revealed, in fact not as a mere attempt to fool but as a constructive roundabout means that pays homage to the painter's virtuosity.

5. Art as Philosophy

A long-range lesson in the rise of criticism and aesthetics is therefore that art is no longer merely a field among others open to philosophical questioning; instead it becomes a model of development for philosophy. During Antiquity and the classical age, mathematics played that part, as a paradigm of intellectual certainty and immovable foundation. But the reverse side was a narrowness of scope and limitation to definite types of objects and investigations. The 18th century initiates a strong displacement that does not put scientific thought aside but on the contrary gives it its full cultural import. In this respect only science and art can become associates for society's benefit.

This tendency is increased by changes in the philosophical background, through the impact of British empiricism and the growth of materialism. If, contrary to Cartesian principles, every idea comes from the senses — as Condillac and d'Alembert repeat after Locke — sentiment is the overall result of corporal movements. Therefore there is no other way to establish the standard of taste than by deriving it from our structure as living creatures. In this way rationality is able to escape dogmatism without falling into the trap of skepticism. But a consistent materialist view of humankind demands also a thorough investigation of society's bases and of life's ultimate ends. On this level, the frequent analogy between the work of art and an organism proves to be efficient.

All these alterations would nonetheless remain a dead letter if there were no rise in the standard of living. Voltaire, among others, celebrates wealth, luxury and the softness of life it permits; “What a good time that this iron century!”, even if one cannot be satisfied with the fact of inequality. Between the Encyclopedists and Rousseau, art's meaning is a constant subject of dispute: when Voltaire pleads that “where several of the finer arts are wanting, the rest must necessarily languish and decay, since they are inseparably connected together, and mutually support each other”, Rousseau objects that it is only the triumph of artificial man over the natural one, so that the ease of the individual is a cause of perdition for humankind. These two interpretations of art have of course corresponding features in aesthetics, which sometimes appears as the expression of man's utmost capacities and sometimes as a sum of trifles for persons of leisure.

Be that as it may, Voltaire's and Rousseau's supporters could nevertheless agree on the kinds of advantages art provides for human talents and that it is a task for aesthetics to make them explicit. Three points at least deserve to be mentioned: sensitivity, sociability and inventing.

In so far as the arts mobilize the whole range of our faculties, they improve our ability to discern minute distinctions that otherwise would go unnoticed. Delicacy of taste may be cultivated for itself and also indeed for the consequences it can afford. In the first case, pleasure is evidently the true measure of success but it does not mean there is nothing beyond since pleasure is a progressive process, an activity that modifies the qualitative content of experience. So a culture of refinement matters in fact for the whole of life because what has been gained across the artistic field amounts to a sort of training available in any other context. An instrumental conception of taste proves to be best suited for revealing hidden similarities and contrasts, not only between different arts or senses but also between art and the stuff of reality.

At that time, art was still primarily a dialogue with nature but mimesis must not be confined to resemblance. It takes into account the various dimensions of creation and the correspondences it activates for different publics. A work of art is both a reflection of society's ideals and prejudices and an effective means that fosters the dynamics of socialization. Diderot makes the point by reference to theater, which is less a place for amusement than a microcosm of society and therefore a laboratory for civil passions. So it is no surprise if Voltaire can write in return that “nothing renders the mind so narrow, and so little, if I may use that expression, as the want of social intercourse; this confines its faculties, blunts the edge of genius, damps every noble passion, and leaves in a state of languor and inactivity every principle, that could contribute to the formation of true taste.” In brief, art is the communicational binder par excellence and the best symptom of a social state of affairs in full blossom, even if the limits of its so-called universality lie in a Eurocentric point of view.

Another decisive feature of art is its ability in inventing. There is indeed a rather depreciating interpretation of this as the unending quest for novelty that is part of social existence and human nature. Art's real purpose is to provide a model of invention that fulfills the highest resources of mankind or rather that traces a route stemming from the most primitive drives to sophisticated accomplishments. That is the task of productive imagination and genius — so to speak to elaborate the process of inventing anew. To say that the fine arts are the arts of genius is not to say only that there is a sparkling touch in great works, it means that the Beautiful is irreducible to a pretty sight; therefore the increasing weight of the Sublime fosters the evidence that every instance of genial creativity is going first to make up the conditions of its own reception.

What follows from all these remarks is the simple idea that aesthetic education is the basis most suited for mankind's development. This idea, sometimes concealed, sometimes claimed, is one of the most stable traits all through the century; it runs from Shaftesbury to Montesquieu, then to Kant and above all Schiller. One reason for it is certainly an unexpected combination between attraction for analysis and mistrust for speculation. Depending on authors, it symbolizes confidence in natural signs, released from the limitations of languages, customs or systems, or a faith in the power of metamorphosis that lies at the heart of culture. Undoubtedly it prefigured revolution, but the French Revolution as an historic event had on it a lesser and more dubious effect than its first defenders hoped for.

6. Neo-Classicism and Pre-Romanticism

The last third of the 18th century was torn between two divergent orientations, both being attempts to escape dissatisfaction with the present. The first is a return to the teachings of Antiquity and the “Grand manner” after the excesses of rococo; the other is an aspiration toward a widened and supposedly more sincere sensibility.

The initial impulse is probably to be found in the excavations of Herculanum and Pompeii, reported by Cochin (1753), Winckelmann, or Caylus, and at about the same time the rediscovery of the ruins of Athens, and then Egypt. The spectacle of towns unearthed from cinders or magnificent monuments thrown on the ground has a great deal to do with the new awareness towards Antiquity. Lots of books, often enriched with engravings, combine a sentimental look on the archeological remains with a process of revision that assessed Greece as the true origin of ancient artistic output. Theoretical repercussions were immense, since they include nothing less than the modern notion of art history, interpreted by Winckelmann in his History of Ancient Art (1764), as an epic of plastic form related to civilization and not only a collection of anecdotal sketches in Vasari's fashion.

Of course, for artists close to antiquarians (such as Mengs or David), to acknowledge Greek statuary as the canon of all visible expression was an incentive to shun the gallant mood in favor of simple grandeur and the cult of the severe in subjects and attitudes, at least until the grandiloquent Empire style sounded the death knell for the hopes of the absolute beautiful. But from an aesthetic point of view, the most significant side effect is to be seen in the growing debates around museology. The Louvre was opened to the public in 1793 as the Central Museum of the Arts — a suggestion that went back to 1765 — but it was still uncertain if it should be an academy of masterpieces or a vast overview of art's historical development. Due to the Revolutionary and Napoleonic campaigns, famous statues were transferred from Italy to Paris (the Belvedere Apollo, the Medicis Venus, the Laocoon, to mention only the best known), a policy criticized as early as 1796 by Quatremère de Quincy in his Letters to Miranda. It is nevertheless the nationalist trend that prevailed with Vivant Denon, at least from 1803 to Waterloo.

This tendency was happily counter-balanced by a strong concern for nature in its multiple meanings, a concern that owes much to Rousseau. Universality was now sought in emotion along with conformity to the voice of the spontaneous impulsions of beings. In his fiction as well as in his philosophical writings, Rousseau spoke for transparency of heart and clearness of communication. Hence, music was seen by him as an ideal medium, at least when stripped of artificial harmony and brought back to the singing melody. So music must not be thought of through a sophisticated orchestra concert or an operatic performance. For Rousseau, its true model lies in popular festivals, for instance at harvest time, when the participants of an unformed event merge into a single community. The musical form best suited for such a result is the melodrama where the voice recitative is combined with instrumental accompaniment (cf. the awkward try of Pygmalion, ca 1764). In fact, this intense though ephemeral situation is the best approximate counterpart of the universal will that is at the basis of his theory of the social contract. Anyway, artistic concerns cannot be severed from political and moral commitments, either from a constructive or from a critical point of view. To enjoy the quality of life became more essential than creating works of art; as a corollary, the most convincing work would be the right adjustment of life to our natural environment. This explains the relevance of Nature's observation for educational purposes (Emile, 1762) and a real fondness for botany that leads to a new way to look at gardens. British writers (since Addison and Pope) had paved the way, inventing landscape gardening as a materialization of painting inside nature. The Marquis de Girardin, the Baron de Monville, the Prince de Ligne, among others, competed with their renowned models across the Channel and trimmed their properties with all the symbols of the picturesque, from the feeling for primitivism to the building of false ruins.

This reaction may seem nonetheless somewhat superficial. The German Sturm und Drang and the English Romantic Movement were about to sweep away the fragile lessons of the Enlightenment and reveal the dark recesses of the human soul. This was a period of decline for France's art and aesthetics, made even worse by its isolation resulting from contemporary upheavals. One had to wait until late in the 19th century to see a true renewal, when Baudelaire established the stature of Delacroix and laid the foundations of a theory of modernity.


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aesthetics: British, in the 18th century | aesthetics: German, in the 18th century | Diderot, Denis | Enlightenment | Hume, David: aesthetics | Voltaire