Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Actualism

New Actualism and Iterated Modalities

To see that iterated modalities pose no problem for new actualism, recall first that the sentence

(7) The pope (i.e., Joseph Ratzinger) could have had a son who could have become a priest.

can be represented as:

(8) ◊∃x(Sxp &◊Px)

But (8) has straightforward actualist truth conditions requiring no possibilia: The thing x which might have been both the pope's son and possibly a priest is a contingently nonconcrete object that at some other world is the pope's son and at yet another world is a priest.