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Lord Shaftesbury [Anthony Ashley Cooper, 3rd Earl of Shaftesbury]

First published Wed Mar 13, 2002; substantive revision Wed Jul 20, 2011

Anthony Ashley Cooper, the third Earl of Shaftesbury, lived from 1671 to 1713. He was one of the most important philosophers of his day, and exerted an enormous influence throughout the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries on British and European discussions of morality, aesthetics, and religion.

Shaftesbury's philosophy combined a powerfully teleological approach, according to which all things are part of a harmonious cosmic order, with sharp observations of human nature (see section 2 below). Shaftesbury is often credited with originating the moral sense theory, although his own views of virtue are a mixture of rationalism and sentimentalism (section 3). While he argued that virtue leads to happiness (section 4), Shaftesbury was a fierce opponent of psychological and ethical egoism (section 5) and of the egoistic social contract theory of Hobbes (section 6). Shaftesbury advanced a view of aesthetic judgment that was non-egoistic and objectivist, in that he thought that correct aesthetic judgment was disinterested and reflected accurately the harmonious cosmic order (section 7). Shaftesbury's belief in an harmonious cosmic order also dominated his view of religion, which was based on the idea that the universe clearly exhibits signs of perfect divine design (section 8). According to Shaftesbury, the ultimate end of religion, as well as of virtue, beauty, and philosophical understanding (all of which turn out to be one and the same), is to identify completely with the universal system of which one we are a part.

1. Shaftesbury's Life and Works

Shaftesbury lived from 1671 to 1713. His grandfather, the first Earl of Shaftesbury, oversaw Shaftesbury's early upbringing and put John Locke in charge of his education. Shaftesbury would eventually come to disagree with many aspects of Locke's philosophy (such as the latter's anti-innatist empiricism, his social contract theory, and what Shaftesbury perceived to be his egoism), but Locke was clearly a crucially important influence on Shaftesbury's philosophical development, and the two remained friends until Locke's death.

Shaftesbury served in Parliament and the House of Lords, but ill health curtailed his political career when he was 30 years old. From then on, he concentrated his energies on his philosophical and literary writings.

The first work Shaftesbury published was an edited collection of sermons by Benjamin Whichcote, which came out in 1698. Shaftesbury wrote an unsigned preface to the sermons in which he praised Whichcote's belief in the goodness of human beings and urged his readers to use Whichcote's “good nature” as an antidote to the poisonous egoism of Hobbes and the pessimistic supralapsarianism of the Calvinists.

In 1699, John Toland published an early version of Shaftesbury's Inquiry concerning Virtue or Merit (IVM). Shaftesbury renounced this version of the Inquiry, claiming that it was produced without his authorization, although the details of the episode remain unclear.

Most of the works for which Shaftesbury is famous were written between 1705–1710. It was during this period that he rewrote the Inquiry concerning Virtue or Merit and completed versions of A Letter concerning Enthusiasm (LCE), Sensus Communis: An Essay on the Freedom of Wit and Humour (SC), The Moralists (M) and Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author (SA).

In 1711, he collected his mature works into a single volume and added to them extensive notes and commentary, naming the book Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times (C). He revised the Characteristics over the course of the next two years, up until his death in 1713. A new edition came out in 1714. Shaftesbury took great pains to design illustrations for the Characteristics, which he thought would advance his central claims as effectively as the written text (see Paknadel 1974).

In addition to the Characteristics, there are two posthumous collections of Shaftesbury's writings: the Second Characteristics, which is concerned chiefly with the visual arts, and Shaftesbury's philosophical notebooks, which Rand collected in The Life, Unpublished Letters, and Philosophical Regimen of Anthony, Earl of Shaftesbury. The notebooks are particularly interesting, as they offer a view of Shaftesbury's private ruminations and his profound commitment to Stoic philosophy. Shaftesbury's fame and influence are chiefly due to the Characteristics, however.

The Characteristics is a remarkable volume. It covers a great many topics, ranging freely over morality, art, politics, religion, aesthetics, and culture, and it is written in a variety of different styles, including epistles, soliloquies, dialogues, and treatises. The overarching goal of the book, as Klein has put it in his very helpful introduction, is to make its readers “effective participants in the world” (C viii). Shaftesbury saw the Characteristics as an exercise in practical (and not merely speculative) philosophy—a work that would make people happier, more virtuous, and more civil. (See M part 1, section 1.)

The Characteristics was extremely popular in Britain and Europe. As Den Uyl points out, "Other than Locke's Second Treatise, Shaftesbury's Characteristics ... was the most reprinted book in English in the [eighteenth] century" (Den Uyl vii). Anybody with intellectual aspirations was sure to be acquainted with it. Shaftesbury was a towering figure in Britain in the 18th century in much the same way as J.S. Mill was in Victorian England and J.P. Sartre was in post-war France.

And yet, by the second half of the 20th century, Shaftesbury had fallen into something approaching obscurity, at least among Anglophone philosophers. Even those who worked in early modern philosophy might have read only a few excerpted pages of his works (usually in the British Moralists anthologies edited by Selby-Bigge and Raphael). Recently, considerably more attention has been paid to Shaftesbury's work, and that trend seems to be gathering steam. But it's worth diagnosing the decline in Shaftesbury's philosophical readership from the 18th century to the 20th, as it brings to light some salient features of his thought.

The most likely reason for that decline is the forms Shaftesbury's philosophy took. He did write one work—the Inquiry concerning Virtue or Merit—that has the kind of clearly-telegraphed thesis development and argumentation we've come to expect from a philosophical treatise. That helps explain why it is passages from that work that have been widely anthologized. But the Inquiry was Shaftesbury's first work, and he later distanced himself from it. The shortcomings of the Inquiry, in Shaftesbury's view, were not substantive but stylistic. It was too dry, too beholden to abstract structure, and too akin to the barren theoretical philosophizing of the Scholastics or the modern metaphysicians. In all of his later works, Shaftesbury adopted literary forms that, as it happens, academic philosophy in the 20th century moved sharply away from. In some works, he adopted epistolary personae. In others, he soliloquized enthusiastically. What he took to be his masterwork—The Moralists—reads like nothing so much as a philosophical novel, with the development of half a dozen characters, narratives of the arcs of friendships and enmities, and expansive descriptions of rooms, gardens, dinners, and landscapes. A third of the Characteristics consists of "miscellaneous reflections" in which Shaftesbury, in the voice of an anonymous commentator, boasts of the "random" presentation and lack of "regularity and order" in his writing (C 336, 339). As he put it at one point, "My reader, doubtless, by this time must being to wonder through what labyrinth of speculation and odd texture of capricious reflection I am offering to conduct him" (C 437). Shaftesbury famously said, "The most ingenious way of becoming foolish is by a system" (C 127). But there seems to have been little danger of his becoming foolish by writing in too systematic a fashion. It was systematic philosophical writing, however, that traveled better from the 18th century to the 20th.

But the different literary forms in which Shaftesbury wrote, as well as the attention he gave to his book's illustrations, points to a deep element of his philosophy. As Klein has shown, Shaftesbury sought to marry morality, on the one hand, with politeness, on the other. In attempting this goal, Shaftesbury was opposing the view that politeness—good manners, agreeability, pleasantness—is a shallow, merely cosmetic concern distinct from the virtue of a person (see Klein 1994). As this view has it, virtue has a solitary, difficult, Calvinist flavor. Shaftesbury, in contrast, sought to convince his readers that true virtue is pleasant, well-mannered, polished, and above all sociable. Moral beauty is, for Shaftesbury, not an internal struggle but an appealing character. And philosophical writing should be appealing as well—not only good but also agreeable. Philosophy should not be ponderous, difficult, and unpleasant, as it was in the hands of the Scholastics and the modern metaphysicians. It should, rather, move people to virtue in the same way inspiring art does. A well-crafted literary performance is what a philosopher should aim to produce, and it's just such a performance that the Characteristics constitutes.

2. Shaftesbury's View of Human Nature: Teleology and Observation

Shaftesbury's view of human nature was both teleological and observation-based. Indeed, he believed that teleology and observation must go hand-in-hand—that accurate observation of human psychology requires a teleological conception of humanity, and that one needs to observe human beings to learn about the human telos. He criticized philosophers who examined human beings without placing their findings within a teleological context, comparing them to someone who examines the individual parts of a watch without taking into account the purpose for which the watch was designed. Just as the latter person will never come to a proper understanding of the watch, Shaftesbury argued, so too the former will never come to a proper understanding of human nature. Shaftesbury thought that Descartes and Locke were guilty of this narrow, non-teleological type of philosophizing. (See SA part 2, section 1; IVM book 1, part 2, section 1; M part 2, section 4.)

3. Shaftesbury's View of Virtue: Moral Sentimentalism and Moral Rationalism

Shaftesbury, like most teleologically-minded philosophers, held that the end or telos of human nature is virtue, and much of his writing is devoted to an explication of his conception of virtue. The account of virtue he proposed has often been taken to be the origin of moral sentimentalism, which Hutcheson and Hume would later develop. But while there are parts of Shaftesbury's account of virtue that are undeniably sentimentalist, there are also rationalist elements that defy the sentimentalist label.

To understand Shaftesbury's account of virtue, we must first examine his account of goodness. Something is good, according to Shaftesbury, if it contributes to the “existence or well-being” of the system of which it is a part (C 168). Every animal, for instance, is a part of its species. So a particular animal, say a tiger, is a good member of its species—it's a good tiger—if it contributes to the well-being of the tiger species as a whole. There is also “a system of all animals,” which consists of the “order” or “economy” of all the different animal species (C 169). So a good animal is one that contributes to the well-being of “animal affairs” in general (Ibid). The system of all animals, moreover, works with the system “of vegetables and all other things in this inferior world” to constitute “one system of a globe or earth” (Ibid). So something is a good earthly thing if it contributes to the existence of earthly things in general. And the system of this earth is itself part of a “universal system” or “a system of all things” (Ibid). So to be “wholly and really” good a thing must contribute to the good of the universe as a whole (Ibid). This progression of ever-larger systems is a bit dazzling, and we might wonder how we can ever know (or even make sense of) whether something is contributing to the well-being of the universe as a whole. But Shaftesbury avoids this problem by discussing in detail only that which makes “a sensible creature” a good member of its species—by focusing on whether an individual creature is promoting the well-being of its species (C 169). Perhaps Shaftesbury believed that a creature that contributes to the well-being of its species will also always contribute to the well-being of the universe as a whole, in which case being a good member of one's species would be equivalent to being “wholly and really” good. (See IVM book 1, part 2, section 1)

Shaftesbury went on to say that the goodness or evilness of a sensible creature is based on the creature's motives, and not simply on the results of the creature's actions (C169). This led him to a crucial claim: every motive to action involves affection or passion (C 173, 177–79, 193). Reason alone, Shaftesbury maintained, cannot motivate. This claim clearly anticipates some of the most influential anti-rationalist arguments of Hutcheson and Hume. (See IVM book 1, part 2, section 3; IVM book 1, part 2, section 4; IVM book 1, part 3, section 1; IVM book 2, part 1, section 1.)

Also crucial to his philosophy is Shaftesbury's distinction between goodness and virtue. Goodness is something that is within the reach of all sensible creatures, not only humans but also non-human animals, such as tigers. This is because a creature is good if its affections promote the well-being of the system of which it is a part, and non-human animals are just as capable of possessing this type of affection as humans. “Virtue or merit,” on the other hand, is within the reach of “man only” (C 172), and that is because virtue or merit is tied to a special kind of affection that only humans possess. This special kind of affection is a second-order affection, an affection that has as its object another affection. We humans experience these second-order affections because we, unlike non-human animals, are conscious of our own passions. Not only do we possess passions, but we also reflect on or become aware of the passions we have. And when we reflect on our own passions, we develop feelings about them. Imagine, for instance, you feel the desire to help a person in distress. In addition to simply feeling that desire, you may also become aware that you are feeling that desire. And when you become aware of that, you may experience a positive feeling (or “liking”) towards your desire to help. Or imagine you feel the desire to harm a person who has bested you in a fair competition. In addition to simply feeling the desire to harm, you may also become aware that you are feeling that desire. And when you become aware of that, you may experience a negative feeling (or “dislike”) towards your desire to harm. These are the kinds of phenomena Shaftesbury had in mind when he wrote that “the affections of pity, kindness, gratitude and their contraries, being brought into the mind by reflection, become objects. So that, by means of this reflected sense, there arises another kind of affection towards those very affections themselves, which have been already felt, and are now become the subject of a new liking or dislike” (C 172). (See IVM book 1, part 2, section 3.)

Shaftesbury called this capacity to feel second-order affections the “sense of right and wrong” or the “moral sense” (C 179–80), although the term is not one he emphasized much or explained in detail (see Rivers 124). Indeed, there is little evidence that he thought the moral sense is a distinct psychological faculty in the way that, for instance, Hutcheson did. Nevertheless, Shaftesbury did think that the moral sense (whether one faculty or several working in tandem) is that which produces in us feelings of “like” or “dislike” for our own (first-order) affections. When the moral sense is operating properly, it produces positive feelings towards affections that promote the well-being of humanity and negative feelings towards affections that detract from the well-being of humanity. The second-order feelings that the moral sense produces can themselves motivate one to action, and people are virtuous if they act from those second-order feelings. In contrast, non-human animals, because they lack the powers of reflection necessary for consciousness of their own affections, do not possess a moral sense. So non-human animals are incapable of achieving virtue (C 175). (See IVM book 1, part 2, section 3.)

Also in line with sentimentalist moral theory is Shaftesbury's discussion of how a person can come to lose his or her sense of right and wrong. He argued (in a manner that anticipates Hume) that because our sense of morality is a sentiment, it can be opposed only by another sentiment, and not by reason or belief. “Sense of right and wrong,” he wrote, “therefore being as natural to us as natural affection itself, and being a first Principle in our constitution and make, there is no speculative opinion, persuasion or belief which is capable immediately or directly to exclude or destroy it… [T]his affection being an original one of earliest rise in the soul or affectionate part, nothing beside contrary affection, by frequent check and control, can operate upon it, so as either to diminish it in part, or destroy it in the whole” (C 179). (See IVM book 1, part 3, section 1.)

But while Shaftesbury claimed that human moral judgment and human virtue essentially involve affection, he did not believe that all value depends on human affections. Goodness, which is the basis of morality and virtue, is an objective property, one that is independent of all human minds, and it is reason that can inform us of what that property consists. Goodness is real, eternal, and immutable, not something created by will, command, opinion, custom, or social contract. So even if every member of society were to approve of something harmful to humanity, it would still be vicious. For that which is destructive of the species can never be “virtue of any kind or in any sense but must remain still horrid depravity, notwithstanding any fashion, law, custom or religion which may be ill and vicious itself but can never alter the eternal measures and immutable independent nature of worth and virtue” (C 175). Fashion, law, custom, and religion can cause people to develop positive affections towards things harmful to humanity. But the development of such affections will never make such things right. The “eternal Measures” of right and wrong are not constituted by human affections. Right and wrong have an “immutable independent nature.” And we are virtuous just to the extent that our affections lead us to act in accord with these eternal and immutable moral truths. (See LCE section 4; SC part 1, section 6; SC part 2, section 1; SC part 3, section 1; SC part 3, section 2; SA part 3; IVM book 1, part 2, section 1; IVM book 1, part 3, section 2; M part 2, section 2; M part 2, section 3; M part 2, section 4.)

Shaftesbury's commitment to a mind-independent moral standard fits well with his frequent claims of the naturalness of virtue and the unnaturalness of vice. There is a standard of morality, according to Shaftesbury, that is as real and mind-independent as standards of harmony and order in numbers. Moreover, Shaftesbury followed Stoic thinking in holding that human beings are designed to recognize that standard, that anticipations of it have been implanted in or imprinted on our souls. In making these claims about nature and virtue, Shaftesbury opposed those anti-innatists (such as Locke) whom he took to hold that morality originates solely custom, fashion, or education, a view that Shaftesbury thought people were drawn to in part by a foolish belief in ridiculous travel stories. In insisting on the naturalness of virtue, Shaftesbury also opposed those who held that morality originates solely in the external commands of a law-giver (divine or political). Shaftesbury believed that both of these incorrect views imply that our only reason to be moral is to acquire reward and avoid punishment (doled out by either society or lawgiver). Further, he insisted that such a position is both false, in that each of us has conclusive reason to be moral independently of rewards and punishments, as well as pernicious, in that belief in those other views can strengthen our selfishness and weaken our natural sociability. (For full discussion of many of the points in this paragraph, see Carey.)

In Shaftesbury's account of virtue, then, reason and sentiment both play essential roles. A person is virtuous if and only if her actions flow from the properly functioning moral sentiments. And reason tells us that moral sentiments are functioning properly if and only if they promote the well-being of the species as a whole. Shaftesbury's “sense of right and wrong” is truly a sentiment, but it is a sentiment that accurately represents an objective reality—i.e., a reality that is independent of human sentiments.

4. Virtue and Happiness

Shaftesbury maintained that virtue promotes the good of all humankind. As he wrote, “To love the public, to study universal good, and to promote the interest of the whole world, as far as lies within our power, is surely the height of goodness” (C 20). Or as he put it elsewhere, the virtuous person is the one who strives to develop an “equal, just and universal friendship” with all humankind (C 256). This view of the content of virtue—that to be virtuous is to promote the good of all humankind—fits well with Shaftesbury's teleological approach, for he believed that everything is designed to promote the good of the system of which it is a part. He also believed that every human being is a part of the system that is the human species as a whole. It was natural for him to think, therefore, that every human being is designed to promote the good of the human species as a whole. (It is important to remember, however, that this view of a system and its parts explains only Shaftesbury's view of the content of goodness, which is something that non-humans can also attain. Virtue or merit, which humans alone can attain, involves not merely acting for the good of the system but performing such actions in a self-aware or reflective manner.) Shaftesbury also consistently maintained that, in addition to promoting the good of humanity, virtue promotes the happiness of the virtuous person him or herself, and that vice harms not only humanity as a whole but also the vicious person. As Shaftesbury put it, “Virtue and interest may be found at last to agree” (C 167). Or as he wrote in the conclusion of the Inquiry, “And thus virtue is the good and vice the ill of everyone” (C 229–330). (See SC section 3; IVM book 2; M part 2).

This coincidence of virtue and happiness is just what Shaftesbury's teleological approach should lead us to expect. For teleological thinking generally involves the idea that the best life for a being is one that fulfills the being's natural end or purpose, and being virtuous is the end or purpose for which humans were designed. Shaftesbury corroborated this teleological connection between virtue and happiness by investigating the pleasures and pains of which human happiness and unhappiness consist. This investigation starts by drawing a broad distinction between pleasures of the body and pleasures of the mind. He next contends that a person's happiness depends more on mental pleasures than on bodily pleasures. He then seeks to show that living virtuously is by far the best way to gain the crucially important mental pleasures. Shaftesbury based much of his argument for the connection between virtue and happiness on the idea that the mental pleasures are within one's own control, insulated from the vicissitudes of “fortune, age, circumstances and humour” (C 334). As one of Shaftesbury's characters rhetorically asks, “How can we better praise the goodness of Providence than in this, ‘That it has placed our happiness and good in things we can bestow upon ourselves’?” (C 335). The importance Shaftesbury placed on our control over our mental pleasures grows directly out of his appreciation for the Stoics. Indeed, it can be plausibly maintained that Stoicism is one of the strongest and most fundamental commitments of Shaftesbury's thought overall. (See SA part 3, section 2; IVM book 2; M part 3, section 3.)

What does the virtuous/natural life look like? What is the content of morality? Shaftesbury did not provide a set of moral principles of maxims that constitute morality (although he approved of those put forward in Henry More's Enchiridion Ethicum; see Rivers 130). But it is clear that he took the central feature of a virtuous life to be sociability, living in harmony with and promoting the happiness of other people.

5. Attacks on Egoism

Although Shaftesbury believed that being virtuous makes a person happy, it would be wrong to label him an egoist. In fact, he launched many attacks on both psychological egoism and ethical egoism, attacks that had as their main target Hobbes, and which clearly anticipated the influential anti-egoist arguments in Butler, Hutcheson, and Hume.

Shaftesbury argued that psychological egoism does a simply terrible job of explaining the wide spectrum of observable activities humans engage in. He ridiculed, for instance, egoistic interpretations of such things as “civility, hospitality, humanity towards strangers or people in distress,” maintaining that it is much easier to explain such phenomena simply by positing real sociability and benevolence (C 55). He further pointed out that humans are often motivated by “passion, humour, caprice, zeal, faction and a thousand other springs, which are counter to self-interest” (C 54) He also claimed that the only way psychological egoism can be plausibly maintained is at the expense of becoming tautologous. (See SC section 2; SC section 3; M part 2, section 1.)

Shaftesbury also presented a pleasantly ironic ad hominem argument against egoists like Hobbes. A truly selfish knave, Shaftesbury tells us, would never publically advance the egoist thesis. While he would secretly hold that religion and morality are “a mere cheat,” he would give others to think that he believed in them wholeheartedly, and would try to get them to believe in them as well, so that he could more easily use them to his “private advantage.” Such knaves have “no quarrel with religion or morals, but know what use to make of both upon occasion… They are sure to preach honesty and go to church… [They] naturally speak the best of human nature that they may the easier abuse it” (C 44). But Hobbes did not behave like this. He tried to convince people of the selfishness of human beings precisely because he wanted to help humans beings, even though this conduct placed him at great peril. His very advancement of the egoist thesis refutes it. That “good sociable man, as savage and unsociable as he would make himself and all mankind appear by his philosophy, exposed himself during his life, and took the utmost pains that after his death we might be delivered from the occasion of those terrors. He did his utmost to show us that … ‘there was nothing … which naturally drew us to the love of what was without or beyond ourselves’ — though the love of such great truths and sovereign maxims, as he imagined these to be, made him the most laborious of all men in composing systems of this kind for our use and forced him, notwithstanding his natural fear, to run continually the highest risk of being a martyr for our deliverance” (C 42–3).

Against ethical egoism, Shaftesbury argued that virtue can exist only if people can be motivated by something other than self-interest. For persons’ virtue, according to Shaftesbury, consists not in the actions they perform, but in their motives for performing them. And the motive with which we identify virtue is benevolence, not self-interest. Shaftesbury emphasized this point by drawing attention to the difference between a knave and a saint. We judge the saint virtuous, he explains, because we think he is motivated by something other than the selfishness of the knave. And if we came to believe that the saint were motivated solely by self-interest, we would no longer judge him to be virtuous. As he put it, “If the love of doing good be not of itself a good and right inclination, I know not how there can possibly be such a thing as goodness or virtue” (C 46). (See SC part 2, section 3, part 3; SC section 4, part 4, Section 1; SA part 1, section 2; IVM book 2, part 2, section 2; IVM book 2, part 2, section 4.)

Shaftesbury's belief that true virtue must flow from non-egoistic motives led him to criticize sharply the emphasis many religious moralists place on reward and punishment in the afterlife. As one of his characters explains when summarizing the goal of the Inquiry, “[The author of the Inquiry] endeavors chiefly to establish virtue on principles by which he is able to argue with those who are not as yet induced to own a god or future state. If he cannot do thus much, he reckons he does nothing” (C 266). Shaftesbury eschewed considerations of the afterlife in his case for virtue because he believed that persons who perform virtuous actions only because they desire reward and fear punishment have no real virtue in them at all. And persons who are constantly made to dwell on reward and punishment are likely to become overly concerned with their own “self-good and private interest,” which must “insensibly diminish the affections towards public good or the interest of society and introduce a certain narrowness of spirit” (C 184). So an emphasis on reward and punishment cannot make people more virtuous, and it may very well make them less so (C 45–46). (See SC part 3, section 3; IVM book 1, part 3, section 3; M part 3, section 3.)

Shaftesbury thought that Locke's account of morality ultimately led to a view that was as perniciously egoistic as Hobbes's. Locke's denial of innate moral ideas, Shaftesbury believed, implied that morality was not something “real” or in the world but rather merely the result of custom or fashion. As Shaftesbury saw it, Locke's anti-innateness implies what we would call a culturally relativist position on morality. But if morality had such a status — if it made no demands that were independent of social sanction — then the only reason a person would have for being moral would be to avoid punishment and achieve reward. And if a person believed that morality originated only in societal sanction — regardless of whether that position was true — he or she would view morality as nothing more than an instrumental good to his or her own selfish ends. Shaftesbury thus took Locke's anti-innatism to be not only philosophically incorrect but also morally corrosive.

Shaftesbury did not try to defend his view by using the terminology of innate ideas, and his position may differ in some ways from thinkers such as Herbert of Cherbury or Ralph Cudworth, who did use such terminology. But what Shaftesbury claimed, and what he took to be in direct opposition to Locke, is that virtue is natural to humans. Shaftesbury emphasized that this does not mean that we are born with moral ideas already in our minds. Nor does it mean that all or even most humans will grow to be virtuous. Indeed, Shaftesbury thought that most people have upbringings that are flawed enough to prevent them from ever becoming fully natural. But just as most members of an animal species may fail to become fully healthy adult specimens (because, say, most of them live in unfavorable environments) while nonetheless it remains natural for members of that species to become fully healthy adults, so too it is natural for humans to be virtuous individuals even if most fail to do so.

Shaftesbury's anti-egoistic view also led him to an interesting consideration of what we should say to someone who asks for a reason to be virtuous, knowing that he will not be punished for vice; or, as Shaftesbury put the question, “Why should a man be honest in the dark?” (C 58). At times Shaftesbury suggested that a person who asks this question is already lost to virtue—that someone who cares about virtue for its own sake won't need another reason to act virtuously, and that someone who needs another reason doesn't have what it takes to be truly virtuous in the first place. In other contexts, Shaftesbury suggested that we should be honest even in the dark (i.e., virtuous even when we will not be punished for vice) because such conduct is a necessary condition for having an identity or unified self at all (C 127). The importance of developing a (unified) self is a striking, recurring theme in Shaftesbury's writings, and he suggested that helping one to develop such a self is the raison d'etre of philosophy (see Mijuskovic, Purviance, and Winkler). (See SC part 3, section 4; SA part 3, section 1).

A fascinating additional response Shaftesbury offered to the “Why be moral?” question is to equate a commitment to morality to the love of beauty. He wrote, “[A] real genius and thorough artist in whatever kind, can never, without the greatest unwillingness and shame, be induced to act below his character, and for mere interest, be prevailed with to prostitute his by performing contrary to its known rules … Be they ever so idle, dissolute or debauched, how regardless soever of other rules, they abhor any transgression and would choose to lose customers and starve rather than, by a base compliance with the world, to act contrary to what they call the justness and of work. ‘Sir,’ says a poor fellow of this kind, to his rich customer, ‘you are mistaken in coming to me for such a piece of workmanship. Let who will make it for you as you fancy, I know it to be wrong. Whatever I have made hitherto has been true work. And neither for your sake or anybody's else shall I put my hand to any other.’ This is virtue, real virtue and love of truth, independent of opinion and above the world. This disposition transferred to the whole of life perfects a character and makes that probity and worth which the learned are often at such a loss to explain. For is there not a workmanship and a truth in actions?” (C 117). Here Shaftesbury points out that we readily accept the possibility of an artist remaining committed to his or her art, regardless of the external rewards that may result from betraying it. We don't think such an artist needs an answer to the question, “Why produce beautiful works of art rather than schmaltz?” because we understand his or her valuing the art as an end in itself. But one's life — one's character and conduct — can be, or can fail to be, morally beautiful. And the commitment a person who appreciates moral beauty has to instantiate it can have the same force on her conduct as as an artist's commitment to produce beautiful works of art. Some might think that collapsing morality into beauty minimizes or undermines the importance of the former. But given Shaftesbury's realist view of beauty — and his equating truth with beauty — no such thing follows on his account.

It is noteworthy that despite his anti-egoism, Shaftesbury went to great lengths (as we mentioned in the previous section) to show that the virtuous person will be happier than the vicious person (IVM book II). At one point, he justified this procedure by contending that while it is best to act from entirely disinterested motives, we sometimes might have to rely on interested considerations to induce to morally correct action those people (including ourselves) who are not yet capable of achieving the heights of virtue. As he put it, “[W]e ought all of us to aspire, so as to endeavour that the excellence of the object, not the reward or punishment, should be our motive, but … where, through the corruption of our nature, the former of these motives is found insufficient to excite to virtue, there the latter should be brought in aid and on no account be undervalued or neglected” (C 269). (See IVM book 2; M part 2, section 3.)

6. Attacks on Social Contract Theory and Defense of Political Liberty

Shaftesbury was highly critical of Hobbesian social contract theory. He argued that the selfish beings Hobbes described in his state of nature bear no resemblance to humans as they actually are. For naturally, Shaftesbury contended, humans are sociable. And society is thus humankind's natural condition. “In short, if generation be natural, if natural affection and the care and nurture of the offspring be natural, things standing as they do with man and the creature being of that form and constitution he now is, it follows that society must be also natural to him and that out of society and community he never did, nor ever can, subsist” (C 287). Shaftesbury also argued that if Hobbes's description of an amoral state of nature were correct, then it would be impossible for Hobbes ever to establish a duty to obey the laws of society. For if there had been no duty to keep one's promises in the state of nature, then the original contract could not have created a duty. And if the original contract did give rise to a duty, then there must have been a duty to keep one's promises even in the state of nature (C 51). Shaftesbury was not the first to criticize social contract theories in this way, but his version of this criticism is stated very clearly and was probably among the most influential. (See SC part 3, section 1; M part 3, section 4.)

Shaftesbury's positive political views emphasized the importance of "liberty in general" (C 443). He believed that totalitarianism made citizens less civil and increased the chances of violent conflict, while greater liberty made citizens more “polite” and peaceful. He thought, consequently, that government should grant its citizens broad freedom to publish what they wish and practice religion in the way they choose. (See SC passim; M part 2, Section 3.)

Shaftesbury endorsed freedom of speech in numerous works, maintaining that society will benefit from wide toleration of almost any opinion. His most conspicuous statement of this position comes in his discussions of enthusiasm, where he contended that religious views of all kinds out to be allowed expression and that ridicule of any kind of religion ought also be allowed. Shaftesbury argued for this position in a way that anticipates J.S. Mill's arguments for liberty of speech in chapter 2 of On Liberty. Shaftesbury claimed that widespread freedom of speech will eventually lead to correct opinions' winning out — that in the long run, right views will vanquish wrong, so long as there is an open field of intellectual competition. Later proponents of free speech would put this point in terms of “the marketplace of ideas.” Shaftesbury used a similar simile — that of liberty of expression's being like “a free port” (C 31).

7. Aesthetics

Shaftesbury's aesthetic theory was one of the first and most influential produced by an English-speaking philosopher. Beauty, for Shaftesbury, is a kind of harmony, proportion, or order. There is a sense in which it can be said that Shaftesbury believed that beauty is mind-dependent, in that he thought the beauty of the universe is dependent on the mind of God, the universe's artist-creator. But it is clear that Shaftesbury also thought that beauty is independent of human minds. The human responses that are the origin of human judgments of beauty are not the origin of beauty itself. Indeed, that there is a real standard of beauty (including moral beauty)—i.e., a standard with a real existence independent of human minds—is perhaps the central idea of Shaftesbury's thought as a whole. (See SC part 4, section 3; M part 3, Section 2.)

Shaftesbury held that all beauty can be placed in a three-part hierarchy. The lowest order of beauty belongs to “the dead forms”—physical things such as manmade works of art and natural objects (C 323). The second order of beauty belongs to human minds, or “the forms which form, that is, which have intelligence, action, and operation” (Ibid). The third order of beauty belongs to that “which forms not only such as we call mere forms but even the forms which form” (Ibid). This highest, most supreme and sovereign beauty, belongs to God, who has created everything in the world, including human minds. (See M part 1, section 3; M part 2, section 4; M part 3, section 2.)

Shaftesbury held that aesthetic appreciation is essentially disinterested. There has been some controversy about the sense in which Shaftesburean aesthetic judgment can be said to be disinterested, but it is clear enough that he thought true aesthetic appreciation of an object (like the motivation underlying true moral conduct) is independent of any ideas of how the object might promote one's own interests. Establishing this non-egoistic position on aesthetic judgment would also be the main goal of Hutcheson in his Inquiry concerning Beauty. (See M part 3, section 2.) But as we have already noted, Shaftesbury did not reduce beauty to subjective mental states, while Hutcheson's account of beauty may be reductionist in this way (i.e., ultimately based on the experience of the pleasures of an internal sense of beauty).

On some construals of aesthetic disinterestedness, true aesthetic considerations are independent of considerations of every other type. Aesthetics, on this view, is autonomous, the value of art is utterly distinct from value of any other sort, aesthetic responses are utterly distinct from any other responses. Shaftesbury did not affirm this kind of aesthetic independence. In fact, Shaftesbury's account of beauty is inextricably linked to his realist and theistic commitments, and he seeks to show that one and the same attitude toward the order of the universe is aesthetic, moral, and religious all at once. (That Shaftesbury believed in the unity of beauty, morality, and religion is another reason to doubt that he believed that there are distinct internal senses, such as the moral sense and the sense of beauty, a point we discussed in section 3.)

Shaftesbury maintained that virtue is a species of beauty, or that virtue and beauty are “one and the same.” He suggested that the positive reaction we have when observing a moral action or character is the same as (or one example of) the positive reaction we have when observing the beauty of nature or works of art, and that the motive to act virtuously is the same as (or one example of) an artist's motive to create beauty. Shaftesbury also said that the virtuous person is one who attempts to make his or her life a thing of moral beauty in the same way that an artist tries to make beautiful works of art. In a similar vein, Shaftesbury equated bad taste with vice in that both constitute an opposition to the natural order of the universe. Developing good taste is, for Shaftesbury, a duty in the same way that developing a virtuous character is. (See SC part 4, section 3; SA part 3, Section 3; IVM book 1, part 2, section 3; M part 2, section 1; M part 3, section 2.)

Shaftesbury held that aesthetic judgment originates in an instinctive, natural human tendency. But he also maintained that one needs training in order to make correct aesthetic judgments. A great deal of practice and study are needed in order to develop true discernment or “taste.” The judgment of an accomplished critic is thus likely to be more natural than the judgment of an uneducated rustic. To achieve the pinnacle of aesthetic appreciation and virtuous activity—to become fully natural—one has to have an education and acumen that most people do not possess. (See SA part 1, section 3; SA part 2, section 2; SA part 2, section 3; M part 3, section 2; Miscellaneous Reflections (MR) 3.)

8. Religion

Shaftesbury believed that everything in the world was created by a morally perfect God and that the world God created is the best of all possible ones. Any evil we observe is only apparent or subordinate, not real or ultimate. It's no surprise, then, that Leibniz said of Shaftesbury's work, “I found in it almost all of my Theodicy before it saw the light of day…. If I had seen this work before my Theodicy was published, I should have profited as I ought and should have borrowed its great passages.” (See LCE section 5; M part 1, sections 2; M part 1, section 3; M part 2, section 3; M part 2, section 4.)

Shaftesbury based his belief in the existence of God on the argument for design (although at one point, C 306, he suggested that it is possible to give an a priori argument for the existence of God as well). He emphasized what he took to be the systematic nature of the universe. Everything in the universe fits together and works in perfect order, he argued, and so we can only conclude that the universe was created by a perfectly ordered, rational mind. Later versions of the argument from design, such as Paley's, are much indebted to Shaftesbury, and Hume's attack on the argument in his Dialogues concerning Natural Religion could have been aimed at Shaftesbury's Moralists just as easily as it could have been aimed at Butler's Analogy of Religion. (See M part 2, section 4; M part 2, section 5; M part 3, section 1.)

Shaftesbury was a proponent of natural religion. He denied that humans need supernatural revelation in order to discover and realize what constitutes true religion. Shaftesbury's natural religion had much in common with the views of the English Deists. However, he differed from them in holding that the essence of religion is not merely dispassionate belief in a few rationally-established tenets, but rather a feeling of expansive love for the universe as a whole. The truly religious frame of mind, for Shaftesbury, is that of reasonable enthusiasm. Shaftesbury took great pains to distinguish this kind of enthusiasm from false, non-rational enthusiasm, which leads to superstition, zealotry, fanaticism, and sectarian violence. Shaftesbury's reasonable enthusiasm is exemplified by Theocles, the hero of The Moralists, and it unites Shaftesbury's views of aesthetics, religion, and virtue. To truly appreciate the beauty of the world, as the character of Theocles is supposed to show, is to revere the world's Creator, which reverence also gives rise to love for all the Creator's creatures. (See LCE, passim; M part 1, section 3; M part 2, section 3; M part 3, section 2.)

The correct view is theism, which is the belief “that every thing is governed, ordered or regulated for the best by a designing principle or mind, necessarily good and permanent” (C 165). The incorrect view is daemonism, which is the belief that the governing mind is “not absolutely and necessarily good nor confined to what is best, but capable of acting according to mere will or fancy” (Ibid.). Theism, by holding up a perfect God for emulation, strengthens one's “benignity, firmness, or constancy [and the] good composure of the affections or uniformity of mind. And thus the perfection and height of virtue must be owing to the belief of a god” (C 192). Daemonism, in contrast, by holding up an arbitrary God, encourages selfish, cruel, and capricious conduct (C 191).

Still, even allowing the bare possibility of atheistic virtue was exceedingly controversial in Shaftesbury's day (not the least because it was commonplace to hold that duties to God constituted a significant part of virtue). It earned him in some quarters the dubious title of “free thinker” and marked a significant disengaging of religion and morality, even if Shaftesbury himself often emphasized the ways in which true religion promotes virtue.

His theology seems to have more in common with ancient Greek philosophy than with any specifically Christian teaching. Shaftesbury was highly critical of what he took to be the pernicious moral influence of certain Christian sects (such as Calvinism and other kinds of Puritanism) that emphasized the depravity of human nature and the jealousy of God. He seems to have believed that such religions were a form of daemonism, which, as we've seen, have a worse moral influence than even atheism. (See LCE section 4; LCE section 5; IVM book 1, part 3.) Shaftesbury's emphasis on the orderly functioning of the universe also led him to reject the traditional Christian view of miracles. He certainly did not think that miracles were needed to prove the existence of God. And he probably did not think that a perfectly ordered, rational mind, such as God's, would countenance miracles at all, as they constituted a violation of the natural order. (See M part 2, section 5.) In concert with his doubts about miracles, Shaftesbury was critical of claims of the Bible's infallibility and authority (C 436–442). The Scriptures are not self-verifying, he contended, and we ought to accept only those parts that can withstand rational scrutiny. He even raised questions about the more moderate Christian view that the Bible, while not completely infallible, is accurate about the general “substance” and “principal facts” of its subject-matter (C 438). According to Shaftesbury,we should extend the same historical methods to the Bible as we do to any other text whose accuracy we deem it important to determine (C 472–81)


Shaftesbury's Works

Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, edited by Lawrence E. Klein, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
Letter Concerning Enthusiasm (in C, pp. 4–28).
Sensus Communis: An Essay on the Freedom of Wit and Humour (in C, pp. 29–69).
Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author (in C, pp. 70–162).
Inquiry Concerning Virtue or Merit (in C, pp. 163–230).
The Moralists, a Philosophical Rhapsody (in C, pp. 231–338).
Miscellaneous Reflections (in C, pp. 339–483).
The Life, Unpublished Letters and Philosophical Regimen of Anthony, Earl of Shaftesbury, edited by Benjamin Rand, London: Swan Sonnenschein, 1900.
Second Characters or the Language of Forms by the Right Honourable Anthony, Early of Shaftesbury, edited by Benjamin Rand, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1914; reprinted, New York: Greenwood Press, 1969.
Preface to Benjamin Whichcote, The Works, Volume III, New York & London: Garland Publishing, Inc., 1977.

The Liberty Fund has published an excellent three-volume edition of the Characteristics, with Shaftesbury's original spelling and punctuation and with stellar reproductions of all of the illustrations: Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, edited and with a forward by Douglas Den Uyl, Indianapolis: Liberty Fund 2001.

Secondary Literature

Biography of Shaftesbury with extensive discussion of his thought as a whole

Book length treatments of Shaftesbury's thought as a whole

Detailed discussions of many aspects of Shaftesbury's philosophy and its historical context

On Shaftesbury's account of morality

On Shaftesbury's view of innate ideas

On Shaftesbury's religious views

On Shaftesbury's aesthetics

On Shaftesbury's views on self and personal identity

On Shaftesbury's illustrations of the Characteristics

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

aesthetics: British, in the 18th century | contractarianism | creationism | deism | egoism | emotion: 17th and 18th century theories of | Hobbes, Thomas | Hume, David | Locke, John | Stoicism | teleology: teleological arguments for God's existence