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Informal Logic

First published Mon Nov 25, 1996; substantive revision Mon Nov 28, 2011

Informal logic is an attempt to develop a logic that can assess and analyze the arguments that occur in natural language (“everyday,” “ordinary language”) discourse. Discussions in the field may address instances of scientific, legal, and other technical forms of reasoning (and notions like the distinction between science and psuedo-science), but the overriding aim has been a comprehensive account of argument that can explain and evaluate the arguments found in discussion, debate and disagreement as they manifest themselves in daily life — in social and political commentary; in news reports and editorials in the mass media (in newspapers, magazines, television, the World Wide Web, twitter, etc.); in advertising and corporate and governmental communications; and in personal exchange.

In developing its account of argument, informal logic combines logic's traditional emphasis on inference with the study of a broad range of topics relevant to informal reasoning. The latter include, to take only a few examples, competing definitions of “argument”; argument identification; burden of proof; the empirical study of argument; diagramming; cognitive bias; the history of argument analysis; methods of argumentative investigation; the role of emotion in argument; and the implicit rules that characterize argumentative exchange in different social contexts. Hansen 2011 provides a good survey of some of the core methods of informal logic. He emphasizes the study of informal inference. Other discussions in the field range across a broader territory. In doing so, they frequently intersect with, borrow from, and contribute to the attempts to understand and/or model natural language reasoning found in formal logic, cognitive psychology, rhetoric, dialectics, computational modeling, and a range of other fields. The interdisciplinary study of informal reasoning that the amalgam of these approaches has given rise to is often called “argumentation theory.”

In its origins and continued evolution, informal logic has often been allied with educational goals: with the aim of developing ways of analyzing everyday reasoning that can inform, and possibly be the foundation for, general education. In North America and other English speaking countries, such ideals have been associated with the “Critical Thinking Movement,” which aims to inform and improve public reasoning and debate by promoting models of education which emphasize the critical examination of beliefs and decisions, and the development of the skills that this requires. In this and other regards, informal logic has significant affinities to the “pragamatic logic” movement one finds within the Polish logical tradition (see Koszowy 2010).

Especially in its early formulations, informal logic was sometimes understood as a theoretical alternative to formal logic. This characterization reflects early battles in philosophy departments which debated where (or whether) informal logic fit within the study of “real” logic. Today, the field enjoys a more conciliatory relationship with formal logic. While its attempt to understand informal reasoning is usually couched in natural language, research may employ formal methods and the question whether the accounts of argument which characterize informal logic can in principle be formalized is a source of active investigation. It is in this regard significant that recent work in computational modelling attempts to implement informal logic models of natural-language reasoning. It suggests that defeasible (non-monotonic) logic, probability theory and other non-classical formal frameworks may be suited to this task.

1. History

Though informal logic has a number of historical precedents, its origins are found in North America in the 1970s. It comes into being as an offshoot of classical logic which might be described as a child of the 1960s, a time when social and political movements pushed for an education which was “relevant” to the issues of the day. In logic, and especially in the teaching of logic at North American universities, this fostered an interest in the logic of everyday arguments. The study of such arguments this gave rise to began with an attempt to replace artificial examples of good and bad argument that characterized early introductory logic texts (examples like: “All men are mortal. Socrates is a man. So Socrates is mortal.”) with instances of reasoning, argument and debate taken from the social commentary and debate one finds in newspapers, the mass media, advertisements and political campaigns. Kahane 1971 is an early example of this trend (one might contrast Copi 1957).

Though the theoretical interests that this focus on real life examples produced are anticipated in Hamblin's Fallacies (1970) and Toulmin's The Uses of Argument (1964), informal logic proper began with the work of Johnson and Blair at the University of Windsor. Their textbook, Logical Self-Defense (1977), was an early attempt to teach the logic of informal reasoning. The Informal Logic Newsletter they conceived and edited (now the journal Informal Logic) successfully established the discipline as a field for theoretical discussion, development and research. Forty years later, the result is a recognized body of literature that informs discussions within informal logic, and a standard (but evolving) set of topics, problems and issues that define the field. The latter include fallacies; argument schemes; the rhetorical features of argument; dialectical obligations; dialogue theory; kinds of argument (deductive, inductive, conductive); the role of images and diagrams in argument; empirical studies of argument; communication in argumentative contexts; and the history of argument analysis.

Scholarly journals that have played a significant role in the rise of informal logic include Informal Logic, Argumentation, Philosophy and Rhetoric, Argumentation and Advocacy (formerly the Journal of the American Forensic Association), Teaching Philosophy, Inquiry: Critical Thinking Across the Disciplines, Philosophy and Rhetoric and, more recently, Cogency and Argument and Computation. The journals ProtoSociology (1999) and Studies in Logic, Grammar, and Rhetoric (2009) have published important special issues on the field. In 2002 Philosophica devoted a special issue to the implications of Hilary Putnam's philosophy for informal logic.

One early catalyst for work in informal logic was the Critical Thinking Movement (see Siegel 1988, Ennis 2011). It argued that education should be reworked to make the critical scrutiny of our beliefs and assumptions a fundamental goal of education. While the movement's implications have sometimes been interpreted in a very broad way (which may incorporate problem solving in a very generic sense, so called “lateral thinking”, and information literacy) a key theme is the importance of argument and argument assessment in educational curricula. One government decision that promoted the development of informal logic was a 1980 California State University Executive Order that mandated that post secondary education in the state include formal instruction in critical thinking. According to the order: “Instruction in critical thinking is to be designed to achieve an understanding of the relationship of language to logic, which should lead to the ability to analyze, criticize, and advocate ideas, to reason inductively and deductively and to reach factual or judgmental conclusions based on sound inferences drawn from unambiguous statements of knowledge or belief” (Dumke 1980, Executive Order 338).

In keeping with educational interests of this sort, the development of informal logic has been intertwined with pedagogical discussions of the ways in which students can best be taught to reason well. These discussions are reflected in hundreds (perhaps thousands) of textbooks which have been used to teach informal logic to university and college students in Canada, the United States, the United Kingdom, and a growing number of other countries. Texts currently in use take a variety of approaches to the subject. In some cases they are notable for their theoretical as well as their pedagogical innovations. Current texts include Woods, Irvine & Walton 2004; Govier 2006; Groarke & Tindale 2012; Browne & Keeley 2010; Fisher 2004; Seay & Nuccetelli 2012; Fisher 2004; Battersby 2009; and Hughes, Lavery & Doran 2010.

Historical precedents for the pedagogical and research interests that characterize informal logic include Aristotle's rhetorical and logical works, which have been a touchstone for much discussion. One already finds a significant analogue of today's approaches to informal reasoning in nineteenth century texts which aim to raise general standards of reasoning through public education in logic. Whatley 1830 and 1844 are notable in this regard. More recently, the informal logic movement has been compared to a Polish tradition in “pragmatic logic” which promotes the notion that the tools of logic can be used to educate people to (i) think more clearly and consistently, (ii) express their thoughts precisely and systematically, and (ii) justify their claims with proper inferences (see Koszowy 2010 and Ajdukiewicz, K. 1974).

Today, the continued development of informal logic increasingly incorporates approaches to discourse and argumentation found in cognate disciplines and fields like Speech Communication, Rhetoric, Linguistics, Artificial Intelligence, Cognitive Psychology and Computational Modeling. Considered from this perspective, informal logic has become an integral aspect of a much broader multi-disciplinary attempt to develop an “argumentation theory” that can provide a comprehensive account of informal reasoning.

In the course of their development, informal logic and argumentation theory have been highlighted and nurtured at a number of conferences. The most notable are nine biannual University of Windsor conferences hosted by the Ontario Society for the Study of Argumentation (OSSA), and six multi-disciplinary Amsterdam conferences hosted at four-year intervals by the International Society for the Study of Argumentation (ISSA), beginning in 1986. A tenth OSSA conference and a seventh Amsterdam conference are already planned. Other significant initiatives include four Tokyo Conferences on Argumentation hosted by the Japanese Debate Association in 2000, 2004, 2008 and 2012; a series of “ArgDiaP” workshops (dealing with argumentation, critical thinking, dialogue and persuasion) held in Poland, and the “Symposium on Argument and Computation” held in Perthshire, Scotland in 2000.

2.What is argument/ation?

Like classical logic, most work in informal logic has understood an argument as an attempt to present evidence for a conclusion. It does so by providing premises (“propositions” or claims or some sort) that support the conclusion. Hitchcock 2006 provides a precise account of this conception, defining an argument as “a claim-reason complex” consisting of (i) an act of concluding, (ii) one or more acts of premising (which assert propositions in favour of the conclusion), and (iii) a stated or implicit inference word that indicates that the conclusion follows from the premises.

A simple example that can illustrate this notion is the following excerpt from an opinion article in the Western Courier (25/10/08) which criticized conservative groups unwilling to support any kind of embryonic research.

EXAMPLE 1: This [opposition to embryonic research] is shortsighted and stubborn. The fact is, fetuses are being aborted whether conservatives like it or not. Post-abortion, the embryos are literally being thrown away when they could be used in lifesaving medical research. It has become a matter of religious and personal beliefs, and misguided ones at that. Lives could be saved and vastly improved if only scientists were allowed to use embryos that are otherwise being tossed in the garbage.

We may summarize this argument as the following claim-reason complex.

Premise: Fetuses are being aborted anyway and lives could be saved and vastly improved if only scientists were allowed to use embryos that are otherwise being tossed in the garbage.
Inference Indicator (implicit, unstated):(...hence...)
Conclusion:The conservative position is shortsighted and stubborn.

This is an argument that might be analyzed and assessed in a number of ways, in terms of general criteria for good argument or as an instance of a particular scheme of argument (in this case the scheme “two wrongs reasoning” or “argument from waste”).

In some significant ways, Hitchcock's account of argument is purposely broad. It allows premises and conclusions to be any speech acts which assert the truth of a proposition (including acts like suggesting, hypothesizing, boasting, and deducing), and recognizes that arguments in natural language frequently occur without an explicit inference indicator like “since” or “therefore”. In addition, his account recognizes that arguments can incorporate drawings in a geometric proof, diagrams or pictures (as Hitchcock puts it: “a poster with a giant photograph of a starving emaciated child and the words 'make poverty history' can reasonably be construed as an argument”).

When images are employed in these and many other contexts of dispute, they are clearly argumentative, both in the sense that a potential difference of opinion is addressed, and in the sense that some sort of evidence is provided for some conclusion. The evidence in question may be conveyed by the different lengths of the bars on a graph, shown via a step by step demonstration, or communicated through an image that evokes some moral judgment. The use of images in argumentative contexts is increasingly prevalent as technology makes the production and reproduction of images easier.

This use of images challenges the account of argument first assumed by informal logic, which understood arguments as collections of sentences, and did not recognize arguments expressed in non-verbal ways. “Visual” arguments have been defined as arguments which are conveyed, at least in part, through non-verbal visual images. The latter may include graphs, photographic evidence (used in courts, for example), documentary films, art, cartoons, and architecture. In a manner that might be compared to the attempt to expand formal logic to allow for non-verbal visual deductions (see Barwise and Etchemendy 1998), informal logicians have proposed that we analyze and assess visual arguments in a manner similar to the way in which we understand and assess verbal arguments (see Birdsell and Groarke 1996 and 2007, Blair 1996, Collins and Schmid 1999, Lunsford, Ruszkiewicz and Walters 2001, Groarke 2002, Shelley 2003, Feteris et. al. 2011, Dove 2012).

Argument-1 and Argument-2

Recognizing visual (and other kinds of non-verbal) arguments significantly broadens the scope of informal argument, but does so in a manner that is motivated by the same desire that has motivated its development in the first place: the desire to have some theoretical means for understanding and assessing informal arguments (which are replete with images). For the same reason, many informal logicians now distinguish between two senses of “argument” which are commonly designated “argument-1” and “argument-2”.

Argument-1 is argument in the traditional premise and conclusion sense. Argument-2 is argument understood as the disagreement and/or exchange in which argument-1 is typically embedded. Sometimes the difference between these two kinds of argument is expressed by describing argument-2 as process or transaction, and argument-1 as the product that results from it (see Goodwin 2001). In natural language, the word “argument” can be used in either sense. We may say that “Sarah and Sami had a heated argument”, meaning no more than they vehemently disagreed, or that “The arguments outlined for the new legislation on immigration are not convincing”, meaning that the premises offered do not successfully establish the conclusion. In the first case, we are speaking of argument-2, in the second of argument-1.

Informal logic has paid increasing attention to argument-2 as discussions in the field have evolved, for the simple reason that the assessment and analysis of argument-1 often requires an understanding of argument in this broader sense. In judging the reasonableness of a particular example of argument-1, and the extent to which it is appropriate or convincing, we must frequently consider the argument-2 that gives rise to it. A convincing argument in personal exchange may not meet the standards required to resolve a disagreement in parliament, and one that meets these standards may not meet others required by the law of torts.

The significance of argument-2 need not deflect one from a focus on argument-1 (on arguments in the premise-and-conclusion sense), but it does mean that one must pay close attention, in the course of analyzing and assessing instances of argument-1, to “argumentation” understood in the argument-2 sense. Among other things, this suggests that the comprehensive account of informal reasoning which is its goal should include an account of a variety of speech acts that play a key role in argumentation (including questions and commands), the dynamics of disagreement, and contexts of argument. This broadening of the horizons of informal logic is In keeping with the intuition that they too can be judged against standards of rationality.

Argument and Persuasion

A more difficult question for informal logic is the relationship between argument and persuasion. In his discussion, Hitchcock cites Aristotle's account of persuasion in the Rhetoric. It distinguishes three aspects of persuasion: character, emotion, and argument (ethos, pathos, and logos). Like many other commentators, Hitchcock only counts the third of these as argument. As he puts it: “Presentation of oneself as having a certain character may enhance the credibility of what one says, but it is not an argument in the sense defined in the present chapter, since it lacks a premiss conclusion structure. For the same reason, stirring up the emotions of one's audience is not in itself an argument, even though it may be more effective than argument at moving them, and even though it can be combined with argument.”

The distinction between argument and persuasion has some historical significance insofar as it is the basis of the distinction between logic and rhetoric as they are traditionally understood — logic choosing argument as its focus, rhetoric choosing persuasion. This being said, the distinction between persuasion and argument remains an elusive one when one considers the arguments one finds in informal discourse. Certainly it must be said that appeals to emotion and character play a significant role in ordinary arguments that occur in social, moral and political contexts. In an argument about nuclear policy, for example, it would be artificial to remove the emotion inherent in a description of the consequences of nuclear war (say, the dropping of the bomb on Hiroshima), especially as this emotion is likely to play a key role in the argument. In the case of character, why not interpret a segment of a speech in which a politician outlines their accomplishments and their record as an ethotic argument which seeks to establish the conclusion that they are of strong and honest character (and should, therefore, be supported in an election campaign)?

Endorsing the argument-2 conception of argument, Gilbert 1997 (cf. Carozza 2007) proposes a radical move in this direction, understanding argumentation as an attempt to overcome disagreement, propounding a corresponding theory of “coalescent argument.” According to this account, arguments manifest clusters of attitudes, beliefs, feelings and intuitions associated with the arguers. Argumentative exchange is then viewed as an attempt to identify the points of agreement that can characterize different (and possibly opposed) arguers, fostering the “coalescence” of their points of view.

On the basis of this account, Gilbert expands the scope of argument to include whatever can be used to bring about the coalescence which is its aim. This means that the substance of argument can be, not only reasons in the traditional sense, but also emotional or physical means of coalescence. Sometimes, the latter are the more effective than premises as they have been traditionally understood. While he recognizes the traditional “logical” mode of argument, this means that Gilbert adds other modes, proposing that there can be “emotional,” intuitive (“kisceral”), and physical (“visceral”) modes of argument. According to this account, a hug, a forlorn look, or tears may count as argument.

Certainly Gilbert's examples show that actions and expressions of emotion often function as a way to convince an audience of a particular point of view. This suggests that informal argument must be understood in a way that allows for this. It is less clear that this requires the radical re-conception of argument he proposes. One might instead attempt to account for the non-logical arguments he identifies as instances of argument-1 that use non-verbal means of communicating propositions which function as premises in a relatively standard sense. When a student (to take one of Gilbert's examples) cries in a professor's office in order to convey the importance he attaches to an A grade in a course, this might, for example, be understood as a non-verbal enthymeme which forwards the argument “I will be devastated if I do not receive an A in this course; you should act in a way that doesn't leave me devastated upset; so you should award me an A grade.” As Gilbert proposes, this is an emotional argument, but not necessarily one that requires fundamentally different criteria of assessment than arguments traditionally conceived. Once the argument has been recognized, one might instead proceed in the standard way, by judging whether the premises are plausible or not, and whether they entail or make probable the conclusion.

3. An Example: Visual Argument

Examples can best illustrate some of the ways in which informal logic has extended the scope of argument it began with. The advertisement below is an instance of visual argument that can be used to show how informal logic's analysis of argument can be applied to visual images. Under the title “Just Add Vodka” it features a bottle of vodka spilling its contents onto a village below. The time of day (dusk), the inactivity, and the darkness suggest a sleepy hamlet where there is nothing to do at night. In the image, this contrasts sharply with the bustling city scape that has sprung to life where the vodka splashes to the ground — a city scape that boasts a nightlife among the skyscrapers, nightclubs, bars and restaurants.


vodka print ad

If we attempt to understand it literally, the image makes little sense — bottles of vodka are not so absurdly large, do not pour vodka on sleepy villages, and would not create a Manhattan street scape if they did. In view of these incongruities (and the fundamental principles that guide us in the interpretation of speech acts), we do not naturally interpret the image as a literal depiction of some event, but as a visual metaphor. In this case, the metaphor propounds a message of transformation to the viewer, the vodka functioning as the catalyst for the change. One might roughly summarize this message verbally, as the message that: “Vodka can transform your sleepy life into one full of cosmopolitan excitement.”

A detailed analysis of the image might analyse its use of colours, its aesthetic qualities, its relationship to other images, its sexual connotations, and so on. In the context of argumentation, the key point is that the ad is intended as a way to convince us that we should add vodka to our lives (and in a real advertisement, a particular brand of vodka). In view of this, we might express the message as a visual argument, which can be paraphrased as follows:

Premise: If you add vodka to your life, your sleepy nights will be transformed into nights of cosmopolitan excitement.
Conclusion: You should add vodka to your life (i.e. purchase vodka).

One might fill out this analysis by noting that the move from the premise to the conclusion depends on an implicit premise/assumption which we might summarize as the proposition that “A life of cosmopolitan excitement is highly desirable.”

Once the image is recognized as an argument, we can assess it in the way that informal logic assesses verbal arguments. The great advantage of this approach is that it invites a critical assessment of the argument it forwards. To that end, it can be said that the premise of the argument is obviously questionable, for it is not clear that the consumption of vodka is a likely way to transform one's life into an exciting cosmopolitan life (rather than one beset by, for example, alcohol-related problems).

Once we recognize the argumentative structure of the advertisement, we can go further, and consider whether it should be understood as an instance of an argument scheme (a standard pattern of argument). In this case, it can be classified as an instance of a variant of the fallacy “affirming the consequent”, albeit a normative variant which does not allow one to infer that “X is desirable” from the premises that “If X then Y” and “Y is desirable.” The unacceptability of the inferences that make up such arguments can be demonstrated with examples, as with the argument “If all sex acts were eliminated, we would eliminate sexually transmitted diseases. The elimination of sexually transmitted disease is desirable. Therefore the elimination of all sex acts is desirable.”

The key point is that image in question can be recognized as an act of communication with an implicit premise and conclusion structure. Understanding it in this way — as an instance of visual argument — allows us to analyze and evaluate it with the tools of analysis and assessment that informal logic has developed (whether additional tools are needed to assess such arguments remains an open question). In this way, the evaluation of argumentative images can be made a matter of systematic examination and critical inquiry which goes beyond aesthetic assessment. In the present case, this allows one to describe the image as an impressive accomplishment from an artistic or aesthetic point of view (which it surely is), but still criticize it as an image which conveys a fallacious argument with questionable premises and debatable assumptions.

4. NLD and Beyond

One impetus for the development of informal logic has been the view that natural language arguments do not fit the deductive framework emphasized in traditional logic. The extent to which informal arguments can be understood as deductive arguments has, therefore, been a source of significant debate within informal logic. “Natural Language Deductivism” (NLD) is the view that all informal arguments should be interpreted as attempts to create deductively valid inferences.

If the premises of a deductively valid argument are true, its conclusion must be true (i.e. cannot be false). Deductive arguments have traditionally been associated with logical and mathematical reasoning thought to produce certain or necessary conclusions, but good deductive arguments in informal contexts typically yield conclusions that are reasonable or plausible — because they rely on premises which are reasonable or plausible (rather than certain). In such cases, a conclusion is as certain as the premises of an argument, but this does not mean that it is certain. In the valid inference:

EXAMPLE 3: The population of the world will grow from 6 to 9 billion from in the next fifteen years so we will, if we are to provide sufficient food for everyone, need a way to provide for an additional 3 billion people.

the premise of the argument is not, for example, certain, but reasonable (on the basis of other reasoning that extrapolates from current population trends). It follows that the conclusion of the argument is reasonable rather than certain.

The goal of natural language deductivism is an approach to informal arguments which allows one to effectively and efficiently assess the support they provide for their conclusions. It suggests that one should do so by:

(i) interpreting an argument as an attempt to construct a deductively valid inference; and then
(ii) assessing the credibility of the premises of the argument.

Because the conclusion of a deductively valid argument is as certain as its premises, (ii) provides a gauge of the strength of the evidence an argument provides in favour of its conclusion. In the case of EXAMPLE 3 above, step (i) in NLD assessment is straightforward (because the argument is obviously valid). Step (ii) is the judgment that the premise of the argument is a reasonable conjecture. On the basis of (ii), we have already noted that the argument establishes its conclusion as a reasonable conjecture.

The major challenge for natural language deductivism is its account of informal arguments that are not explicitly deductive. In circumstances of this sort, NLD assigns arguments implicit premises which, once recognized, render such arguments deductively valid. Govier 1987 therefore describes NLD as a theory of “reconstructive ” deductivism). The general approach to argument 'reconstruction' it proposes can be illustrated with an example. Consider the following inductive generalization, which would usually be understood as a paradigm example of an argument which is not deductively valid:

EXAMPLE 4: The French are fastidious about their appearance. I have met many of them in the course of my work there and this was true of all of them.

Here the claim that “The many French I have met in the course of my work there were all fastidious about their appearance” acts as a premise for the conclusion that “The French are fastidious about their appearance.” Natural language deductivism suggest that we should treat this as an attempt to construct a deductive inference by understanding it as an argument with an implicit premise. It may, for example, assign the argument the implicit premise that “The French have the same attitude to their appearance that I have witnessed in the many French I have met in the course of my work there.” So understood, the argument can be seen as a deductively valid inference.

According to NLD, we can always assign some implicit premise that will serve the purposes of deductivist reconstruction. In doing so, the deductivist may note that implicit premises are a generally accepted feature of natural language arguments, and invoke standard ways of identifying implicit premises. The pragma-dialectical account of indirect speech acts (Eemeren and Grootendorst 2002) is, for example, well suited to deductivist reconstruction.

In favour of natural language deductivism, it has been argued that it is an attractive theory of informal argument because it proposes a theory that analyzes and assesses all arguments as instances of one well understood form of inference; eliminates difficult distinctions between deductive, inductive, conductive, abductive, etc. arguments (which are not clearly distinguished in natural language argumentation); and recognizes implicit premises in a way that usefully propels dialectical exchange in ordinary argument (see Groarke 1999). Aristotle has been proposed as a key historical figure who adopts the deductivist approach (Groarke 2009). Those who reject deductivism argue that it is an artificial theory which forces informal arguments to adhere to an overly restrictive model of argument that is too narrow to account for the richness of ordinary reasoning (Johnson 2000 and Godden 2004).

Alternative accounts of informal argument grant that deductive reasoning is one component of informal reasoning, but maintain that many informal arguments do not fit this model of reasoning. Many accounts of informal logic categorize arguments in terms of the traditional distinction between “deductive” and “inductive” arguments, a distinction which Govier 1987 dubs “the great divide”), emphasizing the latter over the former. If the premises of an “inductively valid” argument are true, the conclusion is only probable or plausible, leaving open the possibility that the premises are true and the conclusion false.

In classifying the basic forms of inference that characterize natural language arguments, some countenance other kinds of inferences that are said to be unique: notably “conductive” and “abductive” arguments.

Conductive arguments are instances of argument that provide an accumulation of non-decisive reasons in favour of a conclusion (see Zenker and Fischer 2010, Other Internet Resources). Different pieces of evidence may each suggest (but not conclusively prove) that a defendant charged with murder is guilty. Taken summatively (the witness said he pulled the trigger, the ballistics report shows that the bullet came from a gun he owned, he was overheard saying he would “get” the victim, etc.) these different reasons may provide a strong (but not conclusive) conductive argument for this conclusion.

Abductive arguments are “inferences to the best explanation.” They typically recognize some facts, point out that it is entailed by a certain hypothesis, and conclude that the hypothesis is true. Taken at face value, abductive arguments appear to be instances of the fallacy “affirming the consequence,” and might on these grounds be dismissed, though they play a central role in medical, scientific and legal reasoning (see Walton 2004).

Gilbert 1997 proposes a more radical recategorization of arguments which would recognize “emotional arguments” as a fundamental category which demands its own treatment and assessment. “Visual” and “non-verbal” arguments are other categories that are common. The extent to which these different categories need to be recognized as distinct forms of inference (rather than special instances or distinct expressions of more basic categories) remains a matter of debate.

5. Fallacy Theory

Early work in informal logic favoured fallacies as a way of assessing informal arguments. Traditional accounts define a fallacy as a pattern of poor reasoning which appears to be (and in this sense mimics) a pattern of good reasoning (see Hansen 2002). Such accounts are a problematic basis for a general account of fallacies insofar as what appears to be good reasoning to one person may not appear so to another. In assessing ordinary arguments, these issues can be avoided by understanding fallacies more simply, as common patterns of faulty reasoning which can usefully be identified in the evaluation of informal arguments.

In its treatment of fallacies, informal logic revives a tradition which can be traced to Aristotle. In the history of logic and philosophy, its significance is reflected in the writings of figures like Locke, Whately, and Mill. Today, this tradition manifests itself in textbooks and websites which attempt to teach good informal reasoning by teaching students how to detect the standard fallacies.

Theoretical discussions of fallacies have not produced an agreed upon taxonomy, but there is a common set of fallacies which are typically used in the analysis of informal arguments. They include formal fallacies like affirming the consequent and denying the antecedent; and informal fallacies like ad hominem (“against the person”), slippery slope, ad bacculum (“appeal to force”), ad misericordiam (“appeal to pity”), “hasty generalization,” and “two wrongs” (as in “two wrongs don't make a right”). In textbooks, authors may devise their own nomenclature to highlight the properties of particular kinds of fallacious arguments (“misleading vividness” thus designates the misuse of vivid anecdotal evidence, and so on.)

In the research literature, Woods and Walton have discussed the definition, analysis and assessment of a variety of fallacies in a series of articles and books, first as co-authors and then individually (see, e.g., Woods and Walton 1989, Walton 1989, Woods 1995, Walton 1992, Walton 2000). Van Eemeren and Grootendorst 1992 have proposed a “pragma-dialectical” theory which analyses fallacies as violations of the rules of critical discussion (discussion which aims to critically resolve a difference of opinion). A good representative collection of classical and contemporary essays on the fallacies is found in Hansen and Pinto 1995.

Some research in informal logic continues to focus on fallacies, and on the appropriate understanding of particular fallacies, but the field has evolved in different directions which place less emphasis on the fallacy approach. In some cases this has been because fallacies can be subsumed by more general accounts of argument. If one adopts a dialogical approach to argument, for example, then the crux of one's theory of argument is the implicit rules that govern various kinds of dialogical exchange. One can then see fallacies, not as a theoretically distinct notion, but as deviations from these rules. This approach leaves room for fallacies but makes an account of dialogical exchange, not fallacies, the basis of one's account of argument.

In other contexts, many have criticized fallacy theory on the grounds that traditional fallacies are imprecise tools for understanding argument, and because a focus on them inevitably emphasizes poor reasoning rather than good argument. Hitchcock (1995, 324) has, for example, written that the claim that we should teach good reasoning by fallacies is “like saying that the best way to teach somebody to play tennis without making the common mistakes … is to demonstrate these faults in action and get him to label and respond to them.”

The problems with fallacy theory have been compounded by research which has identified many instances of traditional fallacies which appear to be reasonable patterns of inference in day to day contexts of argument. In such discussions, commentators point to examples like the following:

EXAMPLE 5: Martin Luther King Jr., influenced by Gandhi, argued that we can justifiably break laws in a democratic country if our goal is change which has been unjustly obstructed. Such arguments play a central role in the American civil rights movement. They are not obviously fallacious, though they are a case of “two wrongs make a right” suggesting, as they do, that we can justifiably do something wrong (break a law) if we are responding to another wrong (i.e. some law, decision or policy that unjustly obstructs change).
EXAMPLE 6: The argument that “The attempt to use military might to put an end to terrorism is wrong because it will take us down a slippery slope that will end in improper interference in the affairs of independent states” cannot be dismissed as a bad argument simply by saying that it is an instance of the fallacy slippery slope. If such a slippery slope is plausible, then the argument has some merit.
EXAMPLE 7: The argument “No one with a history of heart disease should take up running, for running is a strenuous form of exercise, and no one with a history of heart disease should engage in strenuous exercise” is, like many informal arguments, deductively valid. In such cases, it is impossible for the conclusion of the argument to be false if the premises are true. Sometimes this relationship is described by saying that the premises of the argument already contain the conclusion; but this suggests that all deductive arguments commit the fallacy begging the question, which is occurs when an argument assumes what it attempts to prove.
EXAMPLE 8: The argument that we should not listen to the metaphysical arguments of someone who has accosted us, on the grounds that he is psychotically disturbed and doesn't know what he is taking about, is an instance of ad hominem, but it is not fallacious. Assuming these premises true, this is eminently reasonable practical advice.

In the wake of many examples and discussions of this sort, contemporary accounts of fallacies widely recognize there are in which arguments have the form of traditional fallacies, but cannot be rejected as fallacious. Why the field of informal logic still recognizes key fallacies (e.g., equivocation and false dilemma) in pedagogical and theoretical discussion, the problems with fallacy theory have convinced many that theories of informal logic should focus, not on fallacies, but on general criteria for good reasoning (premise acceptability and relevance, etc.). The latter is often manifest in the study of structures for good inference (“argument schemes”) which set standards for particular kinds of good reasoning.

Grennan 1997 has proposed an approach to informal reasoning which proposes logical adequacy and pragmatic adequacy as the key criteria for judging and evaluating everyday inferences. He attempts to build an account of informal logic that extends beyond fallacies and deductive forms of reasoning by identifying good patterns of reasoning used in successful everyday contexts. Groarke & Tindale 2012 use traditional fallacies as a basis for the definition of positive argument schemes, by treating ad hominem, guilt by association, appeals to ignorance, two wrongs reasoning, etc. as legitimate schemes of argument — and by treating fallacious instances of them as deviations from an (inherently correct) norm.

Other authors do not go this far, but informal logic has, since its inception, evolved in a way that places less emphasis on the traditional fallacies, and more on the identification of cogent appeals to authority, arguments by analogy, and other schemes or argument, and on the general issues that arise in the construction of good arguments.

6. An Example: Ad Hominem

Different approaches to fallacies can be illustrated with the fallacy ad hominem. Consider as a first example a remark adapted from a Danish television debate over the question whether the Danish church should be separated from the Danish state (Jorgensen 1995, 369).

EXAMPLE 9: You should not listen to my opponent. He wants to sever the Danish church from the state for his own personal sake.

This remark attempts to cast doubt on the proposal that the Danish church and state be seperated by casting doubt on the motivation behind the proposal — by alleging that it is motivated by its proponent's own personal interests (which the speaker goes on to elaborate). Here we have an attempt to provide a reason (and hence an argument) for the conclusion that one should not listen to the proposal to separate the Danish church and state.

Looked at from the point of view of fallacy theory, this is a classic case of ad hominem. Kahane 1995 (p. 65), for example, describes it as a fallacy that occurs when an arguer is guilty “of attacking his opponent rather than his opponent's evidence and arguments.” In the case at hand, this means that the debater constructs an argument which attacks the motivation and the character of the person promoting the separation of the Danish church and state, instead of showing what is wrong with the arguments he has provided for his proposal. On these grounds, fallacy the argument can be dismissed as an instance of the fallacy ad hominem.

Consider a second example from Velonews: The Journal of Competitive Cycling. In the wake of an article on the retirement of Lance Armstrong, the seven time winner of the Tour de France (17/02/2011), its website featured an exchange between its readers. In response to a contributer who argued that Armstrong was a great athlete and that everyone should be happy for Armstrong and celebrate his accomplishments, one commentator wrote:

He's not a great athlete, he's a fraud, a cheat and a liar. That's why not everybody is “happy for Lance.”

Here the explanation why not everyone is “happy for Lance” forwards a reason why one shouldn't celebrate his career: i.e. because he is a cheater and a liar (because he allegedly violated doping regulations). In answer to this retort, the initial arguer responded with the comment:

EXAMPLE 10: Jealousy is a bummer.

Here we have another paradigm example of ad hominem. As in EXAMPLE 9, the arguer dismisses an argument they oppose, not on the grounds that the premises or inferences it incorporates are problematic, but by discrediting (and in this and many other cases, insulting) the arguer who proposes it.

Dialogical approaches to argument have a different theoretical structure than fallacy theory, but they invite a very similar analysis of these examples. According to Van Eemeren and Grootendorst 1992, an instance of ad hominem is a violation of the first rule for critical discussion, which maintains that “Parties [to a dispute] must not prevent each other from advancing standpoints or casting doubts on arguments.” Different kinds of ad hominem (abusive, tu quoque, and circumstantial ad hominem) are different violations of this rule. In this case, it suffices to say that the debater's attack on his opponent can be seen as an illegitimate attempt to deny him his right to make a case for his position.

Other approaches to informal arguments are critical of the fallacy approach, proposing a more sympathetic approach to ad hominem. As they point out, there are circumstances where criticisms of the person are legitimate grounds for doubting or rejecting their point of view. If we can demonstrate that a politican has millions of dollars to gain from the passage of a particular motion, this is a reason to be sceptical of their point of view. If an arguer has repeatedly shown poor judgment or lacks the requisite knowledge to make reasonable judgments about some issue, then this may be a good reason to dismiss their point of view. This is especially true in informal contexts, in which arguers may be inundated with many more arguments and positions than they can possibly investigate, forcing them to decide which arguments merit their attention. In such contexts, ad (or pro) hominem considerations may be the most reasonable way to make these decisions.

Rhetorical approaches to argument invite this approach to ad hominem, which can be understood in terms of Aristotle's suggestion that the ethos of a speaker plays a crucial role in determining whether an argument is persuasive or not. In keeping with this, an ad hominem argument may be understood as an attack on the ethos of an arguer which is in principle acceptable. This does not mean that every ad hominem is acceptable, but only those which convincingly undermine the credibility of the arguer who is criticized. In the extreme cases, where ad hominem attacks tend to be ad hoc insults (as in EXAMPLE 10 above), the intemperate and arbitrary nature of such attacks are likely to undermine, not the ethos of the person attacked, but the ethos of the arguer who launches the attack.

One may enshrine the notion that ad hominem moves can be acceptable in different ways within a theory of informal argument. If one understands ad hominem as a pattern of argument (providing reasons for the conclusion that one should dismiss or be sceptical of someone's point of view), then one must find a method for distinguishing between instances of this pattern which are and are not acceptable. If one analyzes ad hominem as a particular kind of move in dialectical exchange, the one may develop rules of dialogue which distinguish circumstances in which such moves are and are not acceptable. It goes without saying that these ways of trying to accomodate ad hominem do not eradicate the problematic nature of many of the ad hominem that appear in everyday argument. What is right about the traditional view that ad hominem arguments are fallacious can still be captured in the observation that such arguments cannot definitively show that there are flaws in the arguments offered for the position they dismiss. In order to demonstrate the latter, one must deal directly with these arguments — and not merely the arguers who propound them.

7. Rhetoric

Especially when one considers non-fallacy approaches to informal argument, one might compare informal logic to classical formal logic. In both cases one finds an attempt to identify general criteria for good reasoning and argument schemes that incorporate specific forms of reasoning. In the latter case, this is reflected in a focus on validity and soundness, and on deductive argument schemes encapsulated in rules of inference like modus ponens (“Affirming the Antecedent”), double negation, modus tollens (“Denying the Consequent”), etc. In the case of informal logic, the standard criteria for good argument can be reduced to (i) premise acceptability and (ii) a conclusion that follows from the premises. This second criterion is typically understood in terms of relevance and sufficiency, making a good argument an argument with premises that are relevant to the conclusion and sufficient to establish it as (at least) acceptable. Within informal logic, the key argument schemes discussed include arguments from authority, causal reasoning, arguments by analogy, and various forms of moral argument.

In other ways, informal logic might be contrasted with formal logic insofar as it aims to understand the dynamics of arguments which operate in complex varied social interactions which serve a many different purposes. In a particular circumstance, this may mean that the success or failure of an argument needs to be understood and assessed in ways that extend beyond the notions that define classical logic. The latter evaluates arguments in terms of “soundness,” defining a sound argument as a deductively valid inference with true premises that establishes the truth of its conclusion. This is a conception of good argument which can be applied to many instances of ordinary argument, but there are many situations in which the success and failure of arguments may be measured in other ways.

Different informal contexts may be characterized by different levels of uncertainty (sometimes extreme uncertainty); by deep and fundamentally different worldviews; by ethical and aesthetic judgments which are not easily categorized as true or false (or correct and incorrect); and by variable social contexts with different aims, in which which particular assumptions may be accepted, rejected or reversed (in arguments about international affairs, in the court room, in alternative dispute mediation, in commentary on the arts, in the formation of science policy, and so on). Pinto 2001 suggests that the aim of many arguments does not appear to be assent to the truth of a proposition but the withholding of assent (or full assent) or a particular attitude. An argument may, for example, function as a means of instilling fear or hope or disapprobation. In order to leave room for these kinds of examples, he defines an argument as “an invitation to inference” (68–69) which is not limited to the aim of establishing the truth of some proposition.

In looking for ways to account for the features of argument that are not captured by traditional logical conceptions, informal logicians have turned to rhetorical traditions. Insofar as it takes persuasion to be the goal of argument, it recognizes its social function and the role this must play in understanding successful argument. Looked at from this point of view, soundness is not sufficient for successful argument, for there is no guarantee that a (deductively) valid argument with true premises will convince an audience of its conclusion (or instill in them the attitude an arguer intends). At the very least, a successful argument must offer premises they accept (and, ideally, embrace). As successful arguers have always known, this means that the construction of a successful argument requires, not only a search for true premises, but an understanding of the members of one's audience (their beliefs, attitudes and values) and the premises that will consequently 'speak' to them.

Those aspects of argument which play a key role in their success as vehicles of persuasion are the three components of argument which are the foundation for Aristotelean rhetoric: pathos (the convictions of the audience to whom an argument is addressed), logos (the logic of the argument), and ethos (the character of the arguer). Ethos plays a role in persuasion because we are, as Aristotle suggests, more likely to be convinced by an arguer we believe to be credible and trustworthy. It is this which explains why arguers who indulge in frequent insult, exaggeration and other questionable tactics frequently undermine their own use of argument. The relevance of rhetorical analysis to informal logic is emphasized by Tindale (1999, 2004, 2010), who advocates an approach to informal logic which incorporates traditional rhetoric.

8. Dialectics

Other aspects of ordinary argument which extend the scope of informal logic are dialectical. Dialectics understands argument as a kind of exchange — what can roughly be described as the exchange of positions (theses) and counter-positions. The dialectical approach places argument within the broader scope of dispute and debate. In contemporary discussions of argument, the most influential dialectical approach is pragma-dialectics, an approach developed by Van Eemeren and Grootendorst 1992(sometimes known as “the Amsterdam School”). It sees argumentation as a means of resolving differences of opinion which must operate within particular rules for critical discussion.

The pragma-dialectical approach incorporates many of the standard features of argument analysis. Fallacies can, for example, be understood as violations of the rules for critical discussion, and the development of such discussion incorporates the use of schemes of argument. Rhetorical influences are incorporated as a form of “strategic maneouvring,” understood as the attempt to rhetorically influence the outcome of a dispute (see Tindale 2004, ch. 1; Eemeren & Houtlosser 2002] and Feteris et. al. 2011). In understanding strategic maneouvring, rhetorical considerations are brought to bear in three ways: (i) through topical potential (the way the topic is framed and presented); (ii) by addressing audience demands (by “communion” with the audience); and (iii)through presentational devices (by choosing the best figure or scheme to achieve one's ends).

Within informal logic, the dialectical aspects of argument have given rise to the notion that arguers have “dialectical obligations” which are a key component of proper argument (see Johnson 2000). As arguer's our key dialectical obligation is an obligation to respond to (and anticipate) objections that might be raised by our opponents in the dispute in which we are engaged. To emphasize this point, Johnson distinguishes between the “illative” core of an argument and its “dialectical” tier. The illative core is the set of premises offered in support of the conclusion, the dialectical tier consists of alternative points of view, likely objections to the conclusion and the premises and whatever assumptions characterize debate about the conclusion. This raises the question whether logic as it has been traditionally conceived pays too much attention to the illative core of arguments, not recognizing that a rational arguer must pay as much attention to their dialectical tier.

According to Johnson, all genuine arguments are dialectical and must discharge dialectical obligations. This suggests that the paradigm example of argument in the history of logic — a giving of reasons for some conclusion can, without elaboration, be classified only as a “proto-argument.” Most authors (e.g., Govier 1999 and Hitchcock 2002) have rejected the suggestion that we should broaden our definitions to make dialectical obligations a necessary component of an argument, but now grant that some accounting of the dialectical aspects of argumentative exchange must be an integral part of any comprehensive understanding of ordinary argument.

9. Dialogue Theory

Dialectical approaches to argument have highlighted the extent to which argumentation is a dialogue between (real or imagined) interlocutors who argue for different points of view. In view of this, the structure of the dialogues in which arguments are embedded has become a major area of research in informal logic. Pragma-dialectics take critical discussion as a model, distinguishing different stages of such dialogue (confrontation, opening, argumentation and closing) and the rules that apply at each stage. Others distinguish different types of dialogues that are characterized by different goals and structures.

The intuitive basis for the distinction between different types of dialogue is evident if one compares the norms of argument in different kinds of contexts. In an inquiry, arguments are used as tools in an attempt to establish what is true. So understood, arguments must adhere to strict standards that determine what counts as evidence and counter-evidence for some point of view. In collective bargaining, a form of negotiation dialogue, arguments function in a very different way. Not as a means for establishing what is true, but as tools in an attempt to find a negotiated settlement between two parties which have conflicting interests (an employer and their employees in a union). Rigourous rules govern such exchange (prohibiting “bargaining in bad faith” and so on), but they are different rules than those that govern a dialogue which functions as a search for truth. Collective bargaining is, for example, a kind of dialogue in which the use of threats (to strike or lock employees out) are a key part of the process. In contrast, threats have no clear role in critical inquiry, where they would ordinarily be classed as instances of the fallacy ad bacculum.

Walton 2007 has emerged as one of the most significant proponents of a dialogue approach. He understands a dialogue as an exchange made up of an opening stage, an argumentation stage, and a closing stage. In the opening stage, the arguers in the dialogue agree to participate. The rules for the dialogue define what types of moves are allowed. What kinds of questions are permitted, for example, and how they can be responded to.

Walton distinguishes seven basic types of dialogue which can be summarized as follows.

Dialogue Type Initial Situation Participant's Goal Goal of Dialogue
Persuasion Conflict of Opinion Persuade Other Party Resolve Issue
Inquiry Need to Have Proof Verify Evidence Prove Hypothesis
Discovery Need for Explanation Find a Hypothesis Support Hypothesis
Negotiation Conflict of Interests Secure Interests Settle Issue
Information Need Information Acquire Information Exchange Information
Deliberation Practical Choice Fit Goals and Actions Decide What to Do
Eristic Personal Conflict Attack an Opponent Reveal Deep Conflict

The dialogue approach provides a clear way to recognize the different norms and expectations tied to different argumentative context. It raises the question whether the proposed accounts of particular dialogues are adequate, whether the kinds of dialogues that have been identified are adequate (or necessary) to explain the different kinds of argumentation that characterize ordinary discourse, and whether there are types of dialogues that have not yet been identified (or whether there are kinds of argumentation that resist categorizations of this sort).

10. The Components of Informal Logic

As a field of study and research, informal logic has evolved into a complex attempt to understand the nature and assessment of informal arguments. Though any list of informal logic issues cannot be definitive, the current state of the field suggests that a complete theory of informal logic would have to include:

  1. an account of the principles of communication which argumentative exchange depends upon;
  2. a distinction between different kinds of dialogue in which argument may occur, and the ways in which they determine appropriate and inappropriate moves in argumentation (e.g. the difference between scientific discussion and negotiation);
  3. an account of logical consequence, which explains when it can be said (and what it means to say) that some claim (or attitude) is a logical consequence of another;
  4. a typology of argument which provides a framework of argument and analysis by indentifying the basic types of argument that need to be distinguished (deductivism is monistic, hence one of the simplest typologies; others will distinguish between fundamentally different kinds of argument);
  5. an account of good argument which specifies general criteria for deductive, inductive, and conductive arguments;
  6. definitions of positive argument schema which define good patterns of reasoning (reasonable appeals to authority, reasonable attacks against the person; etc.);
  7. some theoretical account of fallacies and the role they can (and cannot) play in understanding and assessing informal arguments;
  8. an account of the role that audience (pathos) and ethos and other rhetorical notions should play in analysing and assessing argument;
  9. an explanation of the dialectical obligations that attach to arguments in particular kinds of contexts.

Each of these components subsumes more specific issues and questions that would have to be addressed in a full account of argument. A complete account of the principles of communication that argumentation depends on must, for example, incorporate principles that can account for the meaning of images (photographs, graphs, diagrams, illustrations, videos, specimens, etc.) and other non-verbal elements of argument. In developing a general account of good argument, a full theory would include an account of the extent to which the criteria for good argument can be formalized and the best ways of doing so. In the course of the latter, one might ask whether the account of argument that emerges from informal logic can provide a basis for computational modeling and attempts to use computers to assist with, or engage in, the kinds of reasoning that characterize informal contexts (see, e.g., Reed & Norman 2004).

11. New Horizons

Informal logic continues to extend its scope as it evolves. One area of development combines the theory of informal argument and computational modeling. Informal logic models of argument have informed the attempt to model interactions between agents in multi-agent systems, and the attempt to mimic or assist human reasoning. Computational applications include systems that involve the development of large-scale webs of inter-connected arguments, reasoning about medical decisions, legal decision making, chemical properties and other complex systems, and general models of argument (see, e.g., Rahwana et. al. 2007, Carbogim et al. 2000, Prakken and Vreeswijk 2001, Reed 1997, Reed and Long 1998, and Prakken 2011). Verheij 1999 has developed systems of automated argument assistance which function as computational aids that can assist in the generation of an argument (a link to his Automated Argument Assistance web site is included in Other Internet Resources below). Reed and Norman [2003] have published a pioneering collection of essays which attempt to look at “argument machines” and the ways they might be conceptualized and developed.

Insofar as informal logic remains an attempt to develop a logic that is accessible to the everyday reasoner, it and computational modelling will remain separate theoretical endeavours. That said, both depend on a theoretical understanding of the way in which informal reasoning works and should be assessed. In the long run, the formal modelling this inspires may reestablish stronger links between formal and informal logic (links that will depend on logics which are more sensitive to the different facets of ordinary reasoning than classical logic). The results may foster the development of informal logic within a more integrated logic (or argumentation theory) that recognizes the differences between formal and informal logic, but recognizes an overarching model of reasoning that can explain both endeavours.

As informal logic has extended its scope, some researchers have looked for empirical ways to test it. To this end, they have looked for evidence that can show that the teaching of informal logic improves (or does not improve) informal reasoning skills. Questions about the efficacy of informal logic in the classroom are, however, inherently complex. Among other things, a careful attempt to test its effects would have to distinguish between very different approaches to the teaching of informal reasoning. One cannot assume that approaches which emphasize fallacies will, for example, have the same results as those which emphasize argument schemes or rules of dialogue. Ideally, the collection of the empirical evidence would, if it could be collected on the basis of a convincing testing regime, help settle continuing disputes about the relative efficacy of theoretically distinct approaches to teaching.

Empirical testing has been complicated by debates about the adequacy of the tests that have been used to measure informal reasoning skills. Creating a valid test is a complex endeavor because good informal reasoning is an inherently complex phenomenon which subsumes many specific skills. While some of these are not difficult to measure — e.g., the ability of students to make straightforward deductions and distinguish between necessary and sufficient conditions — it is not clear that these are the most important skills in reasoning that requires that one adeptly weave one's way through the enormous web of debate and discussion that characterizes ordinary discourse (in, to take one example, global debates about what should be done about government debts and deficits).

What counts as good reasoning or, “critical thinking” (or, even more so, creative thinking) tends to be open ended and unpredictable, dialectical, and influenced by pragmatic and contextual considerations which are not easily assessed using the standard means of large scale testing, i.e. multiple choice tests. Instruments like the California Critical Thinking Test have therefore been criticized (see Groarke 2007 and Sobocan et. al. 2007). This does not mean that good testing is in principle impossible, but it does suggest that the discussion and development of methods of assessment needs to be one aspect of the future development of informal logic.

The assumptions of informal logic are being tested in another way by commentators who study argument “corpora” — large collections of argument drawn from natural language discourse. Jorgenson, Kock and Rorbech 1991 studied a series of 37 one-hour televised debates from Danish public TV which featured well-known public figures arguing for and against current policy proposal. A representative audience of 100 voters voted before and after the debate, in an attempt to statistically establish what moves and properties are likely to win votes in a representative audience. These conclusions were then compared with commonly held notions about “proper” or “valid” argumentation. Other studies are considering corpora made up of large data bases of selected written texts (see, e.g., Goodwin & Cortes [forthcoming], and Mochales & Ieven 2009). In principle corpora made up of whole libraries are possible in the future.

12. Informal Logic and Philosophy

Philosophy's association with theories of argument is already evident in ancient times. The relationship flows both ways, philosophy requiring an account of argument as it assembles evidence for particular philosophical perspectives, the theory of argument raising fundamental questions about the nature of reason, rationality and what counts as evidence. In keeping with this association, philosophy and philosophers have played, and continue to play, the defining role in the evolution of informal logic, though work in the field often overlaps with developments in cognate disciplines such as Communication Studies, Rhetoric and Artificial Intelligence.

Within informal logic, one finds two distinct attitudes to philosophical considerations. The work of some sees philosophy as the core element of informal logic. The paradigm example of such a view is found in Johnson 2000, who argues that a comprehensive account of argument must be built upon a philosophical account of rationality. An alternative view suggests that informal logic's relationship to philosophy is more comparable to the relationship that exists between the latter and formal logic, and that developments in the means of analyzing and assessing ordinary argument can (at least in many instances) take place independently of a consideration of the philosophical questions which may be raised about its ultimate justification and its philosophical implications. Such a view suggests that we might distinguish between informal logic and the philosophy of informal logic — i.e. between the development of our understanding of day-to-day reasoning and the attempt to provide a philosophical account of it. Even on this view, these two endeavours are closely related and likely to cross fertilize one another.

However one understands the role of philosophy within informal logic, its investigation of standards of argument and reason has obvious ties to a variety of philosophical concerns about truth, justification and knowledge. The natural connections between informal logic and epistemology are evident in Goldman 1999, who attempts to defend an account of knowledge and the acquisition of knowledge which situates knowledge within social interactions that take place within interpersonal exchange and knowledge institutions. This allows him to evaluate social practices in terms of their veritistic value (i.e., their tendency to produce states like knowledge, error and ignorance). In the process, his account devotes considerable attention to the practice of argumentation, and the constraints which make it a practice which is to be valued because it produces positive veritistic results. In doing so, he draws on work in informal logic and reflects its interest in both monological and dialogical argumentation, and in a broad understanding of argument that incorporates rhetorical and dialectical responsibilities.

In this and other ways, informal logic's attempt to model reasoning reflects, and has important implications for, philosophical concerns about the nature of rationality, the nature of the mind and its processes, the standards of good reasoning, the value of logic and rhetoric, and the social, political and epistemological role of reasoning and argument. In many ways, the discussion of informal logic's ties to philosophy of mind, ethics and epistemology, has just begun. A more extensive exploration of these ties is likely to be one significant aspect of discussion in the future.


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