Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to John Locke

1. The scope of the activities engaged in by members of the Royal Society was much broader than what we recognize as modern science. The very idea of science was emerging during this period. Thus, only a minority of the early members were what we would call scientists. Similar societies were being founded in other European countries during this period. The Society still exists today and is one of the pillars of the orthodox scientific establishment in England. To be a member of it today implies that one has made a substantial contribution to experimental or theoretical science and membership thus confers the highest prestige. For more information about the Royal Society, one might consult Chapter 5 in Woolhouse (1988).

2. This controversy is of some interest for a variety of reasons. The constitution, for example, has quite liberal views concerning the formation of churches. Consider provision CIX for example. It reads: “No person whatsoever shall disturb, molest, or persecute another for his speculative opinions in religion, or his way of worship.” Was Locke responsible for this provision? On the other hand, Sir Leslie Stephan charged Locke with personal racism for inserting section CX: “Every freeman of Carolina shall have absolute power and authority over his negro slaves, of what opinion or religion soever.” There is some evidence to suggest that Locke did play a part in formulating the sections on religion — though it is possible this may have been at the bidding of Lord Ashley. Either Lord Ashley or Sir John Colleton are much more likely candidates for the authorship of the sentence about Negro slaves. Colleton, the real originator of the Carolinas project and one of the proprietors, was a Barbados planter who owned slaves. Part of the plan for the Carolinas was that people were going to emigrate from the over-crowed Barbados taking their slaves with them. They might well worry about whether this move might endanger the power they held over their slaves. It would be natural for Colleton or Shaftesbury to propose such a clause to allay their fears. Recent work has shown that Locke emended the clause on Negro slavery. (Bernasconi 1992 316 n4.) This strongly suggests that Locke was not its original author. The change that Locke made gives slave owners the same powers over their slaves that the proprietors of the Carolinas had over the colonists. Thus the inclusion of this clause and its amendment by Locke may well say little or nothing about Locke's personal views. On the other hand, David Armitage has shown that Locke was involved over the years in amending the Fundamental Constitutions of the Carolinas right up to the time at which he was writing the Two Treatises of Government, and while many articles of the Constitutions were removed at various times, this was not the case with the clause about negro slavery. Armitage implies that this shows not only that Locke agreed with the clause about negro slavery in the Fundamental Constitutions but that we should interpret the Second Treatise account of slavery as intended to justify the institutions and practices of Afro-American slavery.

3. Some commentators distinguish between the corpuscular and the atomic hypotheses on the grounds that corpuscles may be only relatively simple while atoms are supposed to be genuinely indivisible. (See Jolley, 1999) Thus it is possible to be committed to the existence of corpuscles but not atoms. While this distinction has its uses (especially in taking about the simplicity of simple ideas) I am convinced that in respect to physical corpuscles or atoms that Locke treats the two hypotheses as equivalent. One would expect that if the distinction were important for Locke, if he did believe in the existence of corpuscles but not atoms, he would not regularly use the terms ‘atom’ or ‘atoms’, but he does.