Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Descartes' Theory of Ideas

1. The “veil of perception” phrase comes from Bennett 1971, p.68.

2. For example, Malebranche disputes Descartes's claim that we have a clear idea of the mind (Search III.2.7, 238ff.; Elucidation 11, 633ff.), a debate which turns primarily on what constitutes the clarity/distinctness of an idea. See Schmaltz 1996.

3. Cf. “Descartes’ Epistemology,” “Descartes’ Modal Metaphysics.”

4. “Scholastic philosophy” encompasses centuries of debate between many thinkers, so there is no single “scholastic” position on anything. In what follows I sketch a scholastic philosophy, a generally Thomistic one, with which we may be reasonably sure that Descartes was familiar. At the same time I suggest some of the major points at which various scholastics diverge.   I largely leave out consideration of Ockham's anti-representationalism, since, as King 2005 notes, Ockham's theory of cognition had few proponents and the family of notions related to “objective being” became prominent again in late Scholasticism, just prior to Descartes. For greater detail, especially useful resources include M. Adams 1987, Pasnau 1997, Hatfield 1998, Lagerlund 2005, King 2005, and “Mental Representation in Medieval Philosophy” (SEP). 

5. References to Descartes's texts are both to CSM (here II.127) and to AT.

6. Cf. Aquinas:  “…[W]henever Augustine, who was imbued with the doctrines of the Platonists, found in their teaching anything consistent with faith, he adopted it: and those things which he found contrary to faith he amended … But since it seems contrary to faith that forms of things should subsist of themselves, outside the things themselves and apart from matter, as the Platonists held … Augustine … substituted the types of all creatures existing in the Divine mind, according to which types all things are made in themselves …” (ST 1.84.a5, 427).

7. Cf. Aquinas:  “But the sensible image is not what is perceived, but rather that by which sense perceives. Therefore the intelligible species is not what is actually understood, but that by which the intellect understands.”  (ST 1.85.2, 433).

8. But for a dissenting opinion see Hoffman 2002. 

9. Cf. King 2005, and “Mental Representation in Medieval Philosophy” (SEP), for various accounts of “resemblance” or “likeness” and their relationship to forms. Indeed some scholastics stressed that species could not literally resemble objects in this way, lest they become themselves objects of cognition, generating the “veil of perception.”  (See Hatfield 1998, 957ff.)  On the other hand, at least one scholastic -- William Crathorn -- did insist on the literal resemblance between the species and the quality sensed.

10. Or perhaps not:  perhaps a thought of O owes its being “of O” not to the form of O but to some extrinsic relation (such as a causal one) between the act of thought and O -- in which case one might be less inclined to consider the act of thought a way in which O itself exists in the intellect.

11. Wells 1990 provides references for these phrases (n.26). He also notes that “Suárez is not above explicitly characterizing the formal concept as an ‘image’ (imago)” (40), consistent with our earlier observation that “image” may be used simply for entities which realize or convey a form without actually becoming a thing of that kind.

12. Or more strictly, “properly and immediately known or represented (proprie et immediate per conceptum formalem cognoscitur seu repraesentatur)” (DM 2.1.1, 25, 65).

13. This quite literal sense of “image” clearly differs from the sense in definition (5) above. (See Rules 12, I.43, AT X.416-7, and 14, I.58, AT X.441;  Treatise on Man, I.106, AT XI.176-7.)

14. Jolley 1990 discusses this issue at length (17ff). Some important texts include 3rd Replies, II.132, AT VII.189; 4th Replies, II.171-2, AT VII.246-7; Comments I.303-305, AT VIIIB.357ff. See also Kenny 1968, McRae 1965, 1972, Chappell 1986.

15. It may depend on our will whether we reason or self-reflect, but is not simply “up to us” (say) which properties we may include in the contents of our innate ideas. (Cf. 5th Med., II.44, 46, AT VII.64, 67.)

16. Indeed in the later text Descartes may have a third sense of “innate” in mind. In both the earlier and later texts Descartes stresses that sensory ideas fail to resemble their corporeal objects or causes; but in the later text this fact becomes an additional argument for their innateness, in the sense that their content cannot be said to have been “transmitted” from outside to inside the mind.   

17. For ease of discussion I’ll exclude cases of self-reflection, where the “external” object of the idea or thought is the mind itself.

18. “…[I]f by essence we understand a thing as it is objectively in the intellect, and by existence the same thing in so far as it is outside the intellect, it is manifest that the two are really distinct.” (To ***, 1645 or 1646, III.280-1, AT IV.349-351.)  Descartes's basic account of the real, modal, and conceptual distinctions, largely following his scholastic predecessors, is in Principles I.60-62, I.213-215, AT VIIIA.28-30, with further discussion in the letter just quoted. A real distinction obtains, roughly, where two entities are capable of existing independently of each other. 

19. A conceptual distinction obtains, very roughly, where we apply two distinct concepts to something which is in itself, so to speak, an indivisible unity with respect to the two:  for example, the distinction between a substance and its duration is merely conceptual (Principles I.62, I.214, AT VIIIA.30).

20. Cf. Kenny 1970, Bennett 1994, Chappell 1997, Nolan 1997, Rozemond (forthcoming).

21. For more on hylomorphism, see “Aristotle's Psychology” (SEP) and also “Medieval Theories of Universals” (SEP).

22. For some of the subtle scholastic differences of opinion on the nature of forms, see Bolton 1998.

23. Sample texts for (i)-(iii) include: To Regius, January 1642, III.206-209, AT III.499-509; Optics 1, I.152ff., AT VI.83ff.; 4-6, I.165ff., AT VI.112ff.; 3rd Med., II.27, AT VII.40; 6th Replies, II.293-8, AT VII.434-42; Principles IV.197-98, I.284-85, AT VIIIA.320-23. Rozemond 1998, Ch. 4, and Garber 1994 provide useful accounts of Descartes's rejection of substantial and accidental forms (or “real qualities,” construed to be qualities in principle separable from their underlying substances). 

24. For more on nominalism see “Medieval Theories of Universals,” “Properties” (SEP).

25. One text perhaps roughly supporting this characterization: To [Mesland], 5/2/44, III.232, AT IV.113.

26. Cf. n. 2 above.

27. There's much scholarly controversy over this point with respect to non-intellectual thought, such as sensation and the passions, but since our focus is on the intellectual, that controversy needn’t concern us here.

28. Recall that thoughts do have “other” forms too, determining whether they are willings, denials, etc. That Descartes admits at least some distinctively mental forms clearly takes away some motivation for the scholastic reading, but it doesn’t actually affect any of the considerations now being explored. 

29. Indeed that Descartes explicitly uses the phrase “the sun itself” with respect both to the formal and objective suns (1st Replies, II.74-75, AT VII.102), despite also recognizing the real distinction between corresponding formal and objective objects, on its own strongly suggests his adoption of the scholastic account.

30. Compare this example from Goldman 1970 (3):  John answers the phone with “hello” because he wants to greet the caller; but because he's feeling tense, having just argued with his wife, he says “hello” very loudly. Although there's arguably one act here -- saying-hello-loudly -- that he says hello, and that he says it loudly, appear to have (partly) different causal explanations.   In general, a “single” event may be susceptible to different causal explanations, depending on how it's described, the context of explanation, etc. 

31. “Mind-independence” may similarly be cashed out this way:  there's a reasonable sense in which we may say that there are truths about triangles even if no human mind is currently thinking about them. (Cf. Bennett 1994, 659.)  Both these claims are the tip of a deep iceberg: Descartes may require a theory of rational normativity, and/or of subjunctive conditionals, here, discussion of which is beyond the scope of this article.

32. Pessin 2003 develops this point with respect to Descartes on causation.

33. The “ultimately” here is deliberately vague: cashing it out requires an account of clear and distinct perception, as well as of rational normativity, subjunctive conditionals, etc. (cf. n. 31).  That the notion of “cognitive structure” is linked to these modal notions is no accident:  our cognitive structure is roughly constituted by what is “possible” (in various senses) for our minds to think. 

34. There are other ways to go here too:  one might argue that, in the 4th Replies, Descartes accepts a sense in which God may be said to be His own efficient cause. Alternatively, perhaps He may be said to be the efficient cause of His own decrees, qua agent-cause, despite the sense in which His decrees are non-distinct from Him.  

35. Or, of course, in God.

36. Useful analyses of what “direct” and “indirect” cognition might involve may be found in Nadler 1989, Tipton 1992, Hoffman 2002.

37. Questions remain, of course, about how we can think of particulars, if thought is constituted in this way by forms, and about how thought can count as “direct” when we are able to think of non-(formally)-existing objects. Answers to these questions were vigorously debated throughout the scholastic period.

38. Pessin 2007 argues for a direct account of Cartesian sensation as well.

39. Thanks to students in my Fall 2006 seminar on Descartes's Meditations at Connecticut College, who patiently helped me find my way through many of the issues discussed above. I thank in particular Neema Nassiri-Motlagh, Adam Weber, and Casey Johnson, who not only made regular seminal contributions to class discussion, but who also provided helpful comments on an earlier draft of this article. I also thank Dirk Held, who helped me avoid making a fallacious argument based on a misreading of a bit of Latin. And most of all I thank Derek Turner, Steven Nadler, and especially Tad Schmaltz, who generously provided detailed written comments on an earlier draft of this article.