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Descartes' Epistemology

First published Wed Dec 3, 1997; substantive revision Tue Jul 20, 2010

René Descartes (1596–1650) is widely regarded as the father of modern philosophy. His noteworthy contributions extend to mathematics and physics. This entry focuses on his philosophical contributions in the theory of knowledge. Specifically, the focus is on the epistemological project of Descartes' famous work, Meditations on First Philosophy. Upon its completion, the work was circulated to other philosophers for their comments and criticisms. Descartes responded with detailed replies that provide a rich source of further information about the original work. He indeed published the first edition (1641) of the Meditations together with six sets of objections and replies, adding a seventh set with the second edition (1642).

1. Conception of Knowledge

1.1 Analysis of Knowledge

Famously, Descartes defines knowledge in terms of doubt. While distinguishing rigorous knowledge (scientia) and lesser grades of conviction (persuasio), Descartes writes:

I distinguish the two as follows: there is conviction when there remains some reason which might lead us to doubt, but knowledge is conviction based on a reason so strong that it can never be shaken by any stronger reason. (1640 letter, AT 3:64–65)

Elsewhere, while answering a challenge as to whether he succeeds in founding such knowledge, Descartes writes:

But since I see that you are still stuck fast in the doubts which I put forward in the First Meditation, and which I thought I had very carefully removed in the succeeding Meditations, I shall now expound for a second time the basis on which it seems to me that all human certainty can be founded.

First of all, as soon as we think that we correctly perceive something, we are spontaneously convinced that it is true. Now if this conviction is so firm that it is impossible for us ever to have any reason for doubting what we are convinced of, then there are no further questions for us to ask: we have everything that we could reasonably want. … For the supposition which we are making here is of a conviction so firm that it is quite incapable of being destroyed; and such a conviction is clearly the same as the most perfect certainty. (Replies 2, AT 7:144–45)

These passages (and others) clarify that Descartes understands doubt as the contrast of certainty. As my certainty increases, my doubt decreases; conversely, as my doubt increases, my certainty decreases. The requirement that knowledge is to be based in complete, or perfect certainty, amounts to requiring a complete absence of doubt — an indubitability, or inability to undermine one's conviction. Descartes' methodic emphasis on doubt, rather than on certainty, marks an epistemological innovation. This so-called ‘method of doubt’ will be discussed below (Section 2).

The certainty/indubitability of interest to Descartes is psychological in character, though not merely psychological — not simply an inexplicable feeling. It has also a distinctively epistemic character, involving a kind of rational insight. During moments of certainty, it is as if my perception is guided by “a great light in the intellect” (Med. 4, AT 7:59). This rational illumination empowers me to “see utterly clearly with my mind's eye”; my feelings of certainty are grounded — indeed, “I see a manifest contradiction” in denying the proposition of which I'm convinced. (Med. 3, AT 7:36)

Should we regard Descartes' account as a version of the justified true belief analysis of knowledge tracing back to Plato? The above texts (block quoted) are among Descartes' clearest statements concerning the brand of knowledge he seeks. Yet they raise questions about the extent to which his account is continuous with other analyses of knowledge. Prima facie, his characterizations imply a justified belief analysis of knowledge — or in language closer to his own (and where justification is construed in terms of unshakability), an unshakable conviction analysis. There's no stated requirement that the would-be knower's conviction is to be true, as opposed to being unshakably certain. Is truth, therefore, not a requirement of Descartes' brand of strict knowledge?

Many will balk at the suggestion. For in numerous texts Descartes writes about truth, even characterizing a “rule for establishing the truth” (Med. 5, AT 7:70, passim). It might therefore seem clear, whatever else is the case, that Descartes conceives of knowledge as advancing truth. Without denying this, let me play devil's advocate. It is not inconsistent to hold that we're pursuing the truth, even succeeding in establishing the truth, and yet to construe the conditions of success wholly in terms of the certainty of our conviction. Thus construed, to establish a proposition just is to perceive it with certainty; the result of having established it — i.e., what gets established — is the proposition's truth. Note again that Descartes says, of the perfect certainty he seeks, that it provides “everything that we could reasonably want,” adding (in the same passage):

What is it to us that someone may make out that the perception whose truth we are so firmly convinced of may appear false to God or an angel, so that it is, absolutely speaking, false? Why should this alleged “absolute falsity” bother us, since we neither believe in it nor have even the smallest suspicion of it? (Replies 2, AT 7:144–45)

On one reading of this remark, Descartes is explicitly embracing the consequence of having defined knowledge wholly in terms of unshakable conviction: he's conceding that achieving the brand of knowledge he seeks is compatible with being — “absolutely speaking” — in error. If this is the correct reading, the interesting upshot is that Descartes' ultimate aspiration is not absolute truth, but absolute certainty.

On a quite different reading of this passage, Descartes is clarifying that the analysis of knowledge is neutral not about truth, but about absolute truth: he's conveying that the truth condition requisite to knowledge involves truth as coherence.

A definitive interpretation of these issues has yet to gain general acceptance in the literature. What is clear is that the brand of knowledge Descartes seeks requires, at least, unshakably certain conviction. Perhaps this seeming preoccupation with having the right kind of certainty — including its being available to introspection — is linked with an internalist conception of knowledge.

1.2 Internalism and Justification

One way to divide up theories of justification is in terms of the internalism-externalism distinction. Very roughly: a theory of epistemic justification is internalist insofar as it requires that the justifying factors are accessible to the knower's conscious awareness; it is externalist insofar as it does not impose this requirement.

Descartes' internalism requires that all justifying factors take the form of ideas. For he holds that ideas are, strictly speaking, the only objects of immediate perception, or conscious awareness. (More on the directness or immediacy of perception in Section 5.2.) Independent of this theory of ideas, Descartes' methodical doubts underwrite an assumption with similar force: for almost the entirety of the Meditations, his meditator-spokesperson — hereafter referred to as the ‘meditator’ — adopts the assumption that all his thoughts and experiences are occurring in a dream. This assumption is tantamount to requiring that justification come in the form of ideas.

An important consequence of the interpretation here being developed — namely, a traditional representationalist reading of Descartes — is that rigorous philosophical inquiry must proceed via an inside-to-out strategy. This strategy is assiduously followed in the Meditations, and it endures as a hallmark of many early modern epistemologies. Ultimately, all judgments are grounded in an inspection of the mind's ideas. Philosophical inquiry is, properly understood, an investigation of ideas. The methodical strategy of the Meditations has the effect of forcing readers to adopt this mode of inquiry.

In recent years, some commentators have questioned this traditional way of understanding the mediating role of ideas in Descartes' philosophy. Noteworthy in this regard is John Carriero's outstanding commentary on the Meditations (2009) which provides a challenge to the kind account developed in the present essay.

1.3 Indefeasibility in Context

In characterizing knowledge as “incapable of being destroyed,” Descartes portrays knowledge as enduring. Our conviction must be, writes Descartes, “so strong that it can never be shaken”; “so firm that it is impossible for us ever to have any reason for doubting.” Descartes wants a brand of certainty/indubitability that is of the highest rank, both in terms of degree and durability. He wants knowledge that is utterly indefeasible. (Sceptical doubts count as defeaters.)

This indefeasibility requirement implies more than mere stability. A would-be knower could achieve stability simply by never reflecting on reasons for doubt. But this would result in mere undoubtedness, not indubitability. Referring to such a person, Descartes points out that although a reason for “doubt may not occur to him, it can still crop up if someone else raises the point or if he looks into the matter himself” (Replies 2, AT 7:141).

Many readers conclude that Descartes' standards of justification are too high, for they have the consequence that almost nothing we ordinarily count as knowledge measures up. Before jumping to this conclusion, we should put the indefeasibility requirement into context.

Descartes is a contextualist in the sense that he allows that different standards of justification are appropriate to different contexts. This is not merely to say the obvious: that depending on the context of inquiry, knowledge-worthy justification will sometimes be needed, but other times not. It's to say something stronger: that depending on the context of inquiry, the standards of knowledge-worthy justification might vary. For example, a contextualist might accept that ‘knowledge’-talk is equally appropriate whether one is describing the best achievements of empirical science, or the best achievements of mathematics, while acknowledging that the former rest on weaker standards of proof than the latter. This example is potentially misleading, in that Descartes appears loath to count mere empirical evidence as knowledge-worthy justification. But upon ramping up the standard to what he finds minimally acceptable, the standard admits of context dependent variation.

Descartes' minimum standard targets the level of certainty arising when the mind's perception is both clear and distinct. (For Descartes, clarity contrasts with obscurity, and distinctness contrasts with confusion.) He allows that judgments grounded in clear and distinct perception are defeasible (at least, for those who've not yet read the Meditations). But he regularly characterizes defeasible judgments at this level of certainty using terminology (e.g., ‘cognitio’ and its cognates) that translates well into the English ‘knowledge’ (and its cognates).

In the context of inquiry at play in the Meditations, Descartes insists on indefeasibility. (Typically, he reserves the term ‘scientia’ for this brand of knowledge, though he uses ‘cognitio’ and its cognates for either context.) Descartes' aim is, once and for all, to lay a lasting foundation for knowledge. To achieve this, he contends that we “cannot possibly go too far in [our] distrustful attitude” (Med. 1, AT 7:22). Better to have a standard that excludes some truths, than one that justifies some falsehoods.

An interesting thesis emerges — call it the ‘No Atheistic Knowledge Thesis’. Descartes maintains that though atheists are quite capable of impressive knowledge, including in mathematics, they are incapable of the indefeasible brand of knowledge he seeks:

The fact that an atheist can be “clearly aware [clare cognoscere] that the three angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles” is something I do not dispute. But I maintain that this awareness [cognitionem] of his is not true knowledge [scientiam], since no act of awareness [cognitio] that can be rendered doubtful seems fit to be called knowledge [scientia]. Now since we are supposing that this individual is an atheist, he cannot be certain that he is not being deceived on matters which seem to him to be very evident (as I fully explained). (Replies 2, AT 7:141)

Hereafter, I refer to the indefeasible brand of knowledge Descartes seeks as ‘Knowledge’ (uppercase ‘K’).

1.4 Methodist Approach

How is the would-be Knower to proceed in identifying candidates for Knowledge? Distinguish particularist and methodist responses to the question. The particularist is apt to trust our prima facie intuitions regarding particular knowledge claims. These intuitions may then be used to help identify more general epistemic principles. The methodist, in contrast, is apt to distrust our prima facie intuitions. The preference is instead to begin with general principles about proper method. The methodical principles may then be used to arrive at settled, reflective judgments concerning particular knowledge claims.

Famously, Descartes is in the methodist camp. Those who haphazardly “direct their minds down untrodden paths” are sometimes “lucky enough in their wanderings to hit upon some truth,” but “it is far better,” writes Descartes, “never to contemplate investigating the truth about any matter than to do so without a method” (Rules 4, AT 10:371). Were we to rely on our prima facie intuitions, we might suppose it obvious that the earth is unmoved, or that ordinary objects (as tables and chairs) are just as just as they seem. Yet, newly emerging mechanist doctrines of the 17th century imply that these suppositions are false. Such cases underscore the unreliability of our prima facie intuitions and the need for a method by which to distinguish truth and falsity.

Descartes' view is not that all our pre-reflective intuitions are mistaken. He concedes that “no sane person has ever seriously doubted” such particular claims as “that there really is a world, and that human beings have bodies” (Synopsis, AT 7:16). But pre-reflective such judgments may be ill-grounded, even when true.

The dialectic of the First Meditation features a confrontation between particularism and methodism, with methodism emerging the victor. For example, the meditator (while voicing empiricist sensibilities) puts forward, as candidates for the foundations of Knowledge, such prima facie obvious claims as “that I am here, sitting by the fire, wearing a winter dressing-gown, holding this piece of paper in my hands, and so on” — particular matters “about which doubt is quite impossible,” or so it would seem (AT 7:18). In response (and at each level of the dialectic), Descartes invokes his own methodical principles to show that the prima facie obviousness of such particular claims is insufficient to meet the burden of proof.

1.5 Innate Ideas

Descartes' commitment to innate ideas places him in a rationalist tradition tracing back to Plato. Knowledge of the nature of reality derives from ideas of the intellect, not the senses. An important part of metaphysical inquiry therefore involves learning to think with the intellect. Plato's allegory of the cave portrays this rationalist theme in terms of epistemically distinct worlds: what the senses reveal is likened to shadowy imagery on the wall of a poorly lit cave — what the intellect reveals is likened to a world of fully real beings illuminated by bright sunshine. The metaphor aptly depicts our epistemic predicament on Descartes' own doctrines. An important function of his methods is to help would-be Knowers redirect their attention from the confused imagery of the senses, to the luminous world of the intellect's clear and distinct ideas.

Further comparisons arise with Plato's doctrine of recollection. The Fifth Meditation meditator remarks — having applied Cartesian methodology, thereby discovering innate truths within: “on first discovering them it seems that I am not so much learning something new as remembering what I knew before” (Med. 5, AT 7:64). Elsewhere Descartes adds, of innate truths:

[W]e come to know them by the power of our own native intelligence, without any sensory experience. All geometrical truths are of this sort — not just the most obvious ones, but all the others, however abstruse they may appear. Hence, according to Plato, Socrates asks a slave boy about the elements of geometry and thereby makes the boy able to dig out certain truths from his own mind which he had not previously recognized were there, thus attempting to establish the doctrine of reminiscence. Our knowledge of God is of this sort. (1643 letter, AT 8b:166–67)

The famous wax thought experiment of the Second Meditation is supposed to illustrate (among other things) a procedure to “dig out” what is innate. The thought experiment purports to help the meditator achieve a “purely mental scrutiny,” thereby apprehending more easily the innate idea of body. (Med. 2, AT 7:30–31) According to Descartes, our minds come stocked with a variety of intellectual concepts — ideas whose content derives solely from the nature of the mind. This storehouse includes ideas in mathematics, logic, and metaphysics. Interestingly, Descartes holds that even our sensory ideas involve innate content. On his understanding of the new mechanical physics, bodies have no real properties resembling our sensory ideas of colors, sounds, tastes, and the like, thus implying that the content of such ideas draws from the mind itself. Unlike purely intellectual concepts, however, the formation of these sensory ideas depends on sensory stimulation. Elsewhere (2006), I argue that on Descartes' official doctrine, ideas are innate insofar as their content derives from the nature of the mind alone, as opposed to deriving from sense experience. This characterization allows that both intellectual and sensory concepts draw on native resources, though not to the same extent.

Though the subject of rationalism in Descartes' epistemology deserves careful attention, the present essay generally focuses on Descartes' efforts to achieve indefeasible Knowledge. Relatively little attention is given to his doctrines of innateness, or, more generally, his ontology of thought.

Further reading: On the internalism-externalism distinction, see Alston (1989) and Plantinga (1993). For a partly externalist interpretation of Descartes, see Della Rocca (2005). For coherentist interpretations of Descartes' project, see Frankfurt (1970) and Sosa (1997a). For a stability interpretation of Descartes, see Bennett (1990). On the indefeasibility of Knowledge, see Newman and Nelson (1999). On contextualism in Descartes, see Newman (2004). On the methodism-particularism distinction, see Chisholm (1982). On Descartes' rationalism, see Adams (1975), Jolley (1990), and Newman (2006).

2. Methods: Foundationalism and Doubt

Of his own methodology, Descartes writes:

Throughout my writings I have made it clear that my method imitates that of the architect. When an architect wants to build a house which is stable on ground where there is a sandy topsoil over underlying rock, or clay, or some other firm base, he begins by digging out a set of trenches from which he removes the sand, and anything resting on or mixed in with the sand, so that he can lay his foundations on firm soil. In the same way, I began by taking everything that was doubtful and throwing it out, like sand … (Replies 7, AT 7:537)

The theory whereby items of knowledge are best organized on an analogy to architecture traces back to ancient Greek thought — to Aristotle, and to work in geometry. That Descartes' method effectively pays homage to Aristotle is, of course, welcome by his Aristotelian audience. But Descartes views Aristotle's foundationalist principles as incomplete, at least when applied to metaphysical inquiry. I suggest that his method of doubt is intended to complement foundationalism. The two methods are supposed to work in cooperation, as conveyed in the above quotation. Let's consider each method.

2.1 Foundationalism

The central insight of foundationalism is to organize knowledge in the manner of a well-structured, architectural edifice. Such an edifice owes its structural integrity to two kinds of features: a firm foundation and a superstructure of support beams firmly anchored to the foundation. A system of justified beliefs might be organized by two analogous features: a foundation of unshakable first principles, and a superstructure of further propositions anchored to the foundation via unshakable inference.

Exemplary of a foundationalist system is Euclid's geometry. Euclid begins with a foundation of first principles — definitions, postulates, and axioms or common notions — on which he then bases a superstructure of further propositions. Descartes' own designs for metaphysical Knowledge are inspired by Euclid's system:

Those long chains composed of very simple and easy reasoning, which geometers customarily use to arrive at their most difficult demonstrations, had given me occasion to suppose that all the things which can fall under human knowledge are interconnected in the same way. (Discourse 2, AT 6:19).

It would be misleading to characterize the arguments of the Meditations as unfolding straightforwardly according to geometric method. But Descartes maintains that they can be reconstructed as such, and he expressly does so at the end of the Second Replies — providing a “geometrical” exposition of his central constructive steps, under the following headings: definitions, postulates, axioms or common notions, and propositions (AT 7:160ff).

As alluded to above, the Meditations contains a destructive component that Descartes likens to the architect's preparations for laying a foundation. Though the component finds no analogue in the method of the geometers, Descartes appears to hold that this component is needed in metaphysical inquiry. The discovery of Euclid's first principles (some of them, at any rate) is comparatively unproblematic: such principles as that things which are equal to the same thing are also equal to one another (one of Euclid's axioms) accord not only with reason, but with the senses. In contrast, metaphysical inquiry might have first principles that conflict with the senses:

The difference is that the primary notions which are presupposed for the demonstration of geometrical truths are readily accepted by anyone, since they accord with the use of our senses. Hence there is no difficulty there, except in the proper deduction of the consequences, which can be done even by the less attentive, provided they remember what has gone before. … In metaphysics by contrast there is nothing which causes so much effort as making our perception of the primary notions clear and distinct. Admittedly, they are by their nature as evident as, or even more evident than, the primary notions which the geometers study; but they conflict with many preconceived opinions derived from the senses which we have got into the habit of holding from our earliest years, and so only those who really concentrate and meditate and withdraw their minds from corporeal things, so far as possible, will achieve perfect knowledge of them. (Replies 2, AT 7:156–57)

Among Descartes' persistent themes is that such preconceived opinions can have the effect of obscuring our mental vision of innate principles; that where there are disputes about first principles, it is not “because one man's faculty of knowledge extends more widely than another's, but because the common notions are in conflict with the preconceived opinions of some people who, as a result, cannot easily grasp them”; whereas, “we cannot fail to know them [innate common notions] when the occasion for thinking about them arises, provided that we are not blinded by preconceived opinions” (Prin. 1:49–50, AT 8a:24). These “preconceived opinions” must be “set aside,” says Descartes, “in order to lay the first foundations of philosophy” (1643 letter, AT 8b:37). Unless they are set aside, we're apt to regard — as first principles — the mistaken (though prima facie obvious) sensory claims that particularists find attractive. Such mistakes in the laying of the foundations weaken the entire edifice. Descartes adds:

All the mistakes made in the sciences happen, in my view, simply because at the beginning we make judgements too hastily, and accept as our first principles matters which are obscure and of which we do not have a clear and distinct notion. (Search, AT 10:526)

Though foundationalism brilliantly allows for the expansion of knowledge from first principles, Descartes thinks that a complementary method is needed to help us discover genuine first principles. He devises the method of doubt for this purpose — a method to help “set aside” preconceived opinions.

2.2 Method of Doubt

Descartes opens the First Meditation asserting the need “to demolish everything completely and start again right from the foundations” (AT 7:17). The passage adds:

Reason now leads me to think that I should hold back my assent from opinions which are not completely certain and indubitable just as carefully as I do from those which are patently false. So, for the purpose of rejecting all my opinions, it will be enough if I find in each of them at least some reason for doubt. (AT 7:18)

In the architectural analogy, we can think of bulldozers as the ground clearing tools of demolition. For Knowledge building, Descartes construes sceptical doubts as the ground clearing tools of epistemic demolition. Bulldozers undermine literal ground; doubt undermines epistemic ground. Using sceptical doubts, the meditator shows us how to find “some reason for doubt” in all our preexisting opinions.

Descartes' ultimate aims, however, are constructive. Unlike “the sceptics, who doubt only for the sake of doubting,” Descartes aims “to reach certainty — to cast aside the loose earth and sand so as to come upon rock or clay” (Discourse 3, AT 6:28–29). Bulldozers are typically used for destructive ends, as are sceptical doubts. Descartes' methodical innovation is to employ demolition for constructive ends. Where a bulldozer's force overpowers the ground, its effects are destructive. Where the ground's firmness resists the bulldozer's force, the bulldozer might be used constructively — using it to reveal the ground as firm. Descartes' innovation is to use epistemic bulldozers in this way. He uses sceptical doubts to test the firmness of candidates put forward for the foundations of Knowledge.

According to at least one prominent critic, this employment of sceptical doubt is unnecessary and excessive. Writes Gassendi:

There is just one point I am not clear about, namely why you did not make a simple and brief statement to the effect that you were regarding your previous knowledge as uncertain so that you could later single out what you found to be true. Why instead did you consider everything as false, which seems more like adopting a new prejudice than relinquishing an old one? This strategy made it necessary for you to convince yourself by imagining a deceiving God or some evil demon who tricks us, whereas it would surely have been sufficient to cite the darkness of the human mind or the weakness of our nature. (Objs. 5, AT 7:257–58; my italics)

Here, Gassendi singles out two features of methodic doubt — its universal and hyperbolic character. In reply, Descartes remarks:

You say that you approve of my project for freeing my mind from preconceived opinions; and indeed no one can pretend that such a project should not be approved of. But you would have preferred me to have carried it out by making a “simple and brief statement” — that is, only in a perfunctory fashion. Is it really so easy to free ourselves from all the errors which we have soaked up since our infancy? Can we really be too careful in carrying out a project which everyone agrees should be performed? (Replies 5, AT 7:348)

Evidently, Descartes holds that the universal and hyperbolic character of methodic doubt is helpful to its success. Further appeal to the architectural analogy helps elucidate why. Incorporating these features enables the method to more effectively identify first principles. Making doubt universal and hyperbolic helps to distinguish genuine unshakability from the mere appearance of it.

Consider first the universal character of doubt — the need “to demolish everything completely and start again right from the foundations” (Med. 1, AT 7:17). The point is not merely to apply doubt to all candidates for Knowledge, but to apply doubt collectively. Descartes offers the following analogy:

Suppose [a person] had a basket full of apples and, being worried that some of the apples were rotten, wanted to take out the rotten ones to prevent the rot spreading. How would he proceed? Would he not begin by tipping the whole lot out of the basket? And would not the next step be to cast his eye over each apple in turn, and pick up and put back in the basket only those he saw to be sound, leaving the others? In just the same way, those who have never philosophized correctly have various opinions in their minds which they have begun to store up since childhood, and which they therefore have reason to believe may in many cases be false. They then attempt to separate the false beliefs from the others, so as to prevent their contaminating the rest and making the whole lot uncertain. Now the best way they can accomplish this is to reject all their beliefs together in one go, as if they were all uncertain and false. They can then go over each belief in turn and re-adopt only those which they recognize to be true and indubitable. (Replies 7, AT 7:481)

That even one falsehood would be mistakenly treated as a genuine first principle — say, the belief that the senses are reliable, or that ancient authorities should be trusted — threatens to spread falsehood to other beliefs in the system. A collective doubt helps avoid such mistakes. It ensures that the method only approves candidate first principles that are unshakable in their own right: it rules out that the appearance of unshakability is owed to logical relations with other principles, themselves not subjected to doubt.

How is the hyperbolic character of methodic doubt supposed to contribute to the method's success? The architectural analogy is again helpful. Suppose that an architect is vigilant in employing a universal/collective doubt. Suppose, further, that she attempts to use bulldozers for constructive purposes. A problem nonetheless arises. How big a bulldozer is she to use? A light-duty bulldozer might be unable to distinguish a medium-sized boulder, and immovable bedrock. In both cases, the ground would appear immovable. The solution lies in using not light-duty, but heavy-duty tools of demolition — the bigger the bulldozer, the better. The lesson is clear for the epistemic builder: the more hyperbolic the doubt, the better.

A potential problem remains. Does not the problem of the “light-duty bulldozer” repeat itself? No matter how firm one's ground, would it not be dislodged in the face of a yet bigger bulldozer? This raises the worry that there might not be unshakable ground, but only that which is yet unshaken. Descartes' goal of utterly indubitable epistemic ground may simply be elusive.

Perhaps the architectural analogy breaks down in a manner that serves Descartes well. For though there is no most-powerful literal bulldozer, perhaps epistemic bulldozing is not subject to this limitation. Descartes seems to think that there is a most-powerful doubt — a doubt than which none more hyperbolic can be conceived. The Evil Genius Doubt (and equivalent doubts) is supposed to fit the bill. If the method reveals epistemic ground that stands fast in the face of a doubt this hyperbolic, then, as Descartes seems to hold, this counts as epistemic bedrock if anything does.

Hence the importance of the universal and hyperbolic character of the method of doubt. Gassendi's suggestion that we forego methodic doubt in favor of a “simple and brief statement to the effect that [we're] regarding [our] previous knowledge as uncertain” misses the intended point of methodic doubt.

Before turning attention to the First Meditation demolition project, I want to address what I believe are significant misconceptions about the method of doubt. Two of these are suggested in a passage from the pragmatist Peirce:

We cannot begin with complete doubt. We must begin with all the prejudices which we actually have when we enter upon the study of philosophy. These prejudices are not to be dispelled by a maxim [viz., the maxim that the philosopher “must begin with universal doubt”], for they are things which it does not occur to us can be questioned. Hence this initial skepticism will be a mere self-deception, and not real doubt … A person may, it is true, in the course of his studies, find reason to doubt what he began by believing; but in that case he doubts because he has a positive reason for it, and not on account of the Cartesian maxim. Let us not pretend to doubt in philosophy what we do not doubt in our hearts. (1955, 228f)

It is a misconception that universal doubt is intended to result from the mere effort to adhere to the maxim — as if by sheer effort of will. To the contrary, Descartes introduces sceptical arguments precisely in acknowledgement that we need reasons for doubt:

I did say that there was some difficulty in expelling from our belief everything we have previously accepted. One reason for this is that before we can decide to doubt, we need some reason for doubting; and that is why in my First Meditation I put forward the principal reasons for doubt. (Replies 5, appendix, AT 9a:204)

Another misconception is suggested by Peirce's reference to a “doubt in our hearts.” Distinguish two kinds of doubt, in terms of two kinds of ways that doubt can defeat knowledge. Some doubts purport to undermine one's conviction or belief — call these ‘belief-defeating doubts’. Other doubts purport to undermine one's justification (whether or not they undermine belief) — call these ‘justification-defeating doubts’. What Peirce calls a ‘doubt in our hearts’ is suggestive of a belief-defeating doubt. The resulting misconception is that only belief-defeating doubts can undermine knowledge. Longstanding traditions in philosophy acknowledge that there may be truths we believe in our hearts (as it were), but which we do not know. This is one of the lessons of methodic doubt. The sceptical doubts are supposed to help us appreciate that though we believe that 2+3=5, and believe that we're awake, and believe that there is an external world, we may nonetheless lack Knowledge. Justification-defeating doubts are sufficient to undermine Knowledge, and this is the sort of doubt that Descartes puts forward.

A related misconception has the method calling not merely for doubt, but for disbelief or dissent. One of Gassendi's objections reads in this manner. He seems to take Descartes to be urging us, quite literally, to “consider everything as false,” a strategy which, as he says to Descartes, “made it necessary for you to convince yourself” of the sceptical hypotheses (Objs. 5, AT 7:257–58). But Descartes' method does not require us to dissent from the beliefs it undermines. Surely the spirit (even if not always the letter) of the invocation to doubt is that we are to “hold back [our] assent from opinions which are not completely certain and indubitable just as carefully as [we] do from those which are patently false” (Med. 1, AT 7:18).

Finally, a common misconception has it that the universality of doubt undermines the method of doubt itself, since the sceptical hypotheses themselves are so dubious. But this misses the point of the method: namely, to extend doubt universally to candidates for Knowledge, but not also to the very tools for founding Knowledge. As Descartes concedes: “there may be reasons which are strong enough to compel us to doubt, even though these reasons are themselves doubtful, and hence are not to be retained later on” (Replies 7, AT 7:473–74).

Further reading: On foundationalism: for Descartes' treatment, see Discourse, First Meditation, and Seventh Objections and Replies; for its treatment by ancients, see Euclid (1956) and Aristotle (Posterior Analytics); by interpreters of Descartes, see Sosa (1997a) and Van Cleve (1979). On Cartesian inference, see Gaukroger (1989) and Hacking (1980). On methodical doubt: for Descartes' treatment, see Rules, Discourse, First Meditation, and Seventh Replies; by commentators, see Frankfurt (1970), Garber (1986), Newman (2006), Williams (1983), and Wilson (1978). On needing reasons for doubt (nonvoluntarism), see Newman (2007). On the analysis-synthesis distinction (closed related to issues of doubt and methodology): see the Second Replies (AT 7:155ff); see also Galileo (1967, 50f), Arnauld (1964, 4:2–3), Curley (1986), and Hintikka (1978).

3. First Meditation Doubting Arguments

3.1 Dreaming Doubt

Historically, there are at least two distinct dream-related doubts. The one doubt undermines the judgment that I am presently awake — call this the ‘Now Dreaming Doubt’. The other doubt undermines the judgment that I am ever awake (i.e., in the way normally supposed) — call this the ‘Always Dreaming Doubt’. A textual case can be made on behalf of both formulations being raised in the Meditations.

Both doubts appeal to some version of the thesis that the experiences we take as dreams are (at their best) qualitatively similar to those we take as waking — call this the ‘Similarity Thesis’. The Similarity Thesis may be formulated in a variety of strengths. A strong Similarity Thesis might contend that some dreams are experientially indistinguishable from waking, even subsequent to waking-up; a weaker thesis might contend merely that dreams seem similar to waking while having them, but not upon waking. Debates about precisely how similar waking and dreaming can be, have raged for more than two millennia. The tone of the debates suggests that the degree of qualitative similarity may vary across individuals (or, at least, across their recollections of dreams). Granting such variation, dreaming doubts that depend on weaker versions of the Similarity Thesis are (other things equal) apt to be more persuasive. I want to consider a textually defensible formulation that is relatively weak. (Note, however, that some texts suggest a strong thesis: “As if I did not remember other occasions when I have been tricked by exactly similar thoughts while asleep” (Med. 1, AT 7:19, my italics).)

The relatively weak thesis I have in mind is this: that the similarity between waking and dreaming is sufficient to render it thinkable that a dream experience would seem realistic, even when reflecting on the experience, while having it. As Descartes writes: “every sensory experience I have ever thought I was having while awake I can also think of myself as sometimes having while asleep” (Med. 6, AT 7:77). This version of the Similarity Thesis is endorsable by those who never recollect dreams that seem, on hindsight, experientially indistinguishable from waking; indeed, it's endorsable even by those who simply do not remember their dreams to any significant degree.

This weak Similarity Thesis is sufficient to generate straightaway the Now Dreaming Doubt. Since it is thinkable that a dream would convincingly seem as realistic (while having it) as my present experience seems, then, for all I Know, I am now dreaming.

Recall that Descartes' method requires only a justification-defeating doubt, not a belief-defeating doubt. The method requires me to appreciate that my present belief (that I'm awake) is not sufficiently justified. It does not require that I give up that belief. (I might continue to hold it on some merely psychological grounds.) Nor does the belief need to be false — I might, in fact, be awake. The Now Dreaming Doubt does its epistemic damage so long as it undermines my reasons for believing I'm awake — i.e., so long as I find it thinkable that a dream would seem this good. The First Meditation makes a case that this is indeed thinkable. As Descartes writes: “there are never any sure signs by means of which being awake can be distinguished from being asleep” (Med. 1, AT 7:19).

The conclusion — that I don't Know that I'm now awake — has widespread sceptical consequences. For if I don't Know this, then neither do I Know that I'm now “holding this piece of paper in my hands,” to cite an example the meditator had supposed to be “quite impossible” to doubt. Reflection on the Now Dreaming Doubt changes his mind. He comes around to the view that, for all he Knows, the sensible objects of his present experience are mere figments of a vivid dream.

Much ado has been made about whether dreaming arguments are self-refuting. According to an influential objection, Similarity Theses presuppose that we can reliably distinguish dreams and waking, yet the conclusion of dreaming arguments presupposes that we cannot. Therefore, if the conclusion of such an argument is true, then the premise stating the Similarity Thesis cannot be. Some formulations of the thesis do make this mistake. Of present interest is whether all do — specifically, whether Descartes makes the mistake. He does not. Interestingly, his formulation presupposes simply the truism that we do in fact distinguish dreaming and waking (never mind whether reliably). He states his version of the thesis in terms of what we think of as dreams, versus what we think of as waking: “every sensory experience I have ever thought I was having while awake I can also think of myself as sometimes having while asleep” (Med. 6, AT 7:77). This formulation avoids the charge of self-refutation, for it is compatible with the conclusion that we cannot reliably distinguish dreams and waking.

Does Descartes also put forward a second dreaming argument, the Always Dreaming Doubt? I believe there is strong textual evidence to support this, though it is by no means the standard interpretation. (I make a case for this interpretation in my 1994.) The conclusion of the Always Dreaming Doubt is generated from the very same Similarity Thesis, together with a further sceptical assumption, namely: that for all I Know, the processes producing what I take as waking are no more veridical than those producing what I take as dreams. As Descartes writes:

[E]very sensory experience I have ever thought I was having while awake I can also think of myself as sometimes having while asleep; and since I do not believe that what I seem to perceive in sleep comes from things located outside me, I did not see why I should be any more inclined to believe this of what I think I perceive while awake. (Med. 6, AT 7:77)

The aim of the Always Dreaming Doubt is to undermine not whether I'm now awake, but whether “sensation” is produced by external objects even on the assumption I'm now awake. For in the cases of both waking and dreaming, my cognitive access extends only to the productive result, but not the productive process. On what basis, then, do I conclude that the productive processes are different — that external objects play more of a role in waking than in dreaming? For all I Know, both sorts of experience are produced by some subconscious faculty of my mind. As Descartes has his meditator say:

[T]here may be some other faculty [of my mind] not yet fully known to me, which produces these ideas without any assistance from external things; this is, after all, just how I have always thought ideas are produced in me when I am dreaming. (Med. 3, AT 7:39)

The sceptical consequences of the Always Dreaming Doubt are even more devastating than those of the Now Dreaming Doubt. If I do not Know that “normal waking” experience is produced by external objects, then, for all I Know, all of my experiences might be dreams of a sort. For all I Know, there might not be an external world. My best evidence of an external world derives from my preconceived opinion that external world objects produce my waking experiences. Yet the Always Dreaming Doubt calls this into question:

All these considerations are enough to establish that it is not reliable judgement but merely some blind impulse that has made me believe up till now that there exist things distinct from myself which transmit to me ideas or images of themselves through the sense organs or in some other way. (Med. 3, AT 7:39–40)

The two dreaming doubts are parasitic on the same Similarity Thesis, though their sceptical consequences differ. The Now Dreaming Doubt raises the universal possibility of delusion: for any one of my sensory experiences, it is possible (for all I Know) that the experience is delusive. The Always Dreaming Doubt raises the possibility of universal delusion: it is possible (for all I Know) that all my sensory experiences are delusions (say, from a God's-eye perspective).

3.2 Evil Genius Doubt

Though dreaming doubts do significant demolition work, they are light-duty bulldozers relative to Descartes' most power sceptical doubt. What further judgments are left to be undermined? Following the discussion of dreaming, the meditator tentatively concludes that the results of empirical disciplines “are doubtful” — e.g., “physics, astronomy, medicine,” and the like. Whereas:

[A]rithmetic, geometry and other subjects of this kind, which deal only with the simplest and most general things, regardless of whether they really exist in nature or not, contain something certain and indubitable. For whether I am awake or asleep, two and three added together are five, and a square has no more than four sides. It seems impossible that such transparent truths should incur any suspicion of being false. (Med. 1, AT 7:20)

In the final analysis, Descartes holds that such transparent truths — along with demonstrable truths, and many judgments of internal sense — are indeed Knowable. To become actually Known, however, they must stand unshakable in the face the most powerful of doubts. The stage is thus set for the introduction of another sceptical hypothesis.

The most famous rendering of Descartes' most hyperbolic doubt takes the form of the Evil Genius Doubt. Suppose I am the creation of a powerful but malicious being. This “evil genius” (or deceiving “God, or whatever I may call him,” AT 7:24) has given me flawed cognitive faculties, such that I am in error even about epistemically impressive matters — even the simple matters that seem supremely evident. The suggestion is unbelievable, but not unthinkable. It is intended as a justification-defeating doubt that undermines our judgments about even the most simple and evident matters.

Many readers of Descartes assume that the Evil Genius Doubt draws its sceptical force from the “utmost power” attributed to the deceiver. This is to misunderstand Descartes. He contends that an equally powerful doubt may be generated on the opposite supposition — namely, the supposition that I am not the creature of an all-powerful being:

Perhaps there may be some who would prefer to deny the existence of so powerful a God rather than believe that everything else is uncertain. … yet since deception and error seem to be imperfections, the less powerful they make my original cause, the more likely it is that I am so imperfect as to be deceived all the time. (Med. 1, AT 7:21).

Descartes makes essentially the same point in a parallel passage of the Principles:

[W]e have been told that there is an omnipotent God who created us. Now we do not know whether he may have wished to make us beings of the sort who are always deceived even in those matters which seem to us supremely evident … We may of course suppose that our existence derives not from a supremely powerful God but either from ourselves or from some other source; but in that case, the less powerful we make the author of our coming into being, the more likely it will be that we are so imperfect as to be deceived all the time. (Prin. 1:5, AT 8a:6)

Descartes' official position is that the Evil Genius Doubt is merely one among multiple hypotheses that can motivate the more general hyperbolic doubt. Fundamentally, the doubt is about my cognitive nature — about the possibility that my mind is flawed. Descartes consistently emphasizes this theme throughout the Meditations (italics added):

God could have given me a nature such that I was deceived even in matters which seemed most evident. (Med. 3, AT 7:36)

I can convince myself that I have a natural disposition to go wrong from time to time in matters which I think I perceive as evidently as can be. (Med. 5, AT 7:70)

I saw nothing to rule out the possibility that my natural constitution made me prone to error even in matters which seemed to me most true. (Med. 6, AT 7:77)

What is essential to the doubt is not a specific story about how I got my cognitive wiring; it's instead the realization — regardless the story — that I can worry that my cognitive wiring is flawed. Elsewhere, I have suggested that we name the underlying doubt ‘Meta-Cognitive Doubt’, to make clear that it is fundamentally about the implications of having a flawed cognitive nature, rather than of being made by an omnipotent creator. (Carriero makes a similar point with the name ‘imperfect-nature doubt’ (2009, 27).) Even so, I regularly speak in terms of the evil genius (following Descartes' lead), as a kind of mnemonic for the more general doubt about our cognitive nature.

Having introduced the Evil Genius Doubt, the First Meditation program of demolition is not only hyperbolic but universal. As the meditator remarks, I “am finally compelled to admit that there is not one of my former beliefs about which a doubt may not properly be raised” (Med. 1, AT 7:21). As will emerge, the early paragraphs of the Third Meditation clarify a further nuance of the Evil Genius Doubt — a nuance consistently observed thereafter. Descartes clarifies there that the Evil Genius Doubt operates in an indirect manner, a topic to which we return (in Section 5.1).

Further reading: On Descartes' sceptical arguments, see Bouwsma (1949), Curley (1978), Newman (1994), Newman and Nelson (1999), Williams (1986 and 1995). For a contrary reading of the Evil Genius Doubt, see Gewirth (1941) and Wilson (1978). For a more general philosophical treatment of dreaming arguments, see Dunlap (1977).

4. Cogito Ergo Sum

4.1 The First Item of Knowledge

Famously, Descartes puts forward a very simple candidate as the “first item of knowledge.” The candidate is suggested by methodic doubt — by the very effort at thinking all my thoughts might be mistaken. Early in the Second Meditation, Descartes has his meditator observe:

I have convinced myself that there is absolutely nothing in the world, no sky, no earth, no minds, no bodies. Does it now follow that I too do not exist? No: if I convinced myself of something then I certainly existed. But there is a deceiver of supreme power and cunning who is deliberately and constantly deceiving me. In that case I too undoubtedly exist, if he is deceiving me; and let him deceive me as much as he can, he will never bring it about that I am nothing so long as I think that I am something. So after considering everything very thoroughly, I must finally conclude that this proposition, I am, I exist, is necessarily true whenever it is put forward by me or conceived in my mind. (Med. 2, AT 7:25)

As the canonical formulation has it, I think therefore I am. (Latin: cogito ergo sum; French: je pense, donc je suis.) This formulation does not expressly arise in the Meditations.

Descartes regards the ‘cogito’ (as I shall refer to it) as the “first and most certain of all to occur to anyone who philosophizes in an orderly way” (Prin. 1:7, AT 8a:7). Testing the cogito by means of methodic doubt is supposed to reveal its unshakable certainty. As earlier noted, the existence of my body is subject to doubt. The existence of my thinking, however, is not. The very attempt at thinking away my thinking is indeed self-stultifying.

The cogito raises numerous philosophical questions and has generated an enormous literature. In summary fashion, I'll try to clarify a few central points.

First, a first-person formulation is essential to the certainty of the cogito. Third-person claims, such as “Icarus thinks,” or “Descartes thinks,” are not unshakably certain — not for me, at any rate; only the occurrence of my thought has a chance of resisting hyperbolic doubt. There are a number of passages in which Descartes refers to a third-person version of the cogito. But none of these occurs in the context of establishing the actual existence of a particular thinker (in contrast with the conditional, general result that whatever thinks exists).

Second, a present tense formulation is essential to the certainty of the cogito. It's no good to reason that “I existed last Tuesday, since I recall my thinking on that day.” For all I Know, I'm now merely dreaming about that occasion. Nor does it work to reason that “I'll continue to exist, since I'm now thinking.” As the meditator remarks, “it could be that were I totally to cease from thinking, I should totally cease to exist” (Med. 2, AT 7:27). The privileged certainty of the cogito is grounded in the “manifest contradiction” (cf. AT 7:36) of trying to think away my present thinking.

Third, the certainty of the cogito depends on being formulated in terms of my cogitatio — i.e., my thinking, or awareness/consciousness more generally. Any mode of thinking is sufficient, including doubting, affirming, denying, willing, understanding, imagining, and so on (cf. Med. 2, AT 7:28). My non-thinking activities, however, are insufficient. For instance, it's no good to reason that “I exist, since I am walking,” because methodic doubt calls into question the existence of my legs. Maybe I'm just dreaming that I have legs. A simple revision, such as “I exist since it seems I'm walking,” restores the anti-sceptical potency (cf. Replies 5, AT 7:352; Prin. 1:9).

Fourth, a caveat is in order. That Descartes rejects formulations presupposing the existence of a body commits him to no more than an epistemic distinction between mind and body, but not yet an ontological distinction (as in so-called mind-body dualism). Indeed, in the passage following the cogito, Descartes has his meditator say:

And yet may it not perhaps be the case that these very things which I am supposing to be nothing [e.g., “that structure of limbs which is called a human body”], because they are unknown to me, are in reality identical with the “I” of which I am aware? I do not know, and for the moment I shall not argue the point, since I can make judgements only about things which are known to me. (Med. 2, AT 7:27)

Fifth, and related to the foregoing quotation, is that Descartes' reference to an “I”, in the “I think”, is not intended to presuppose the existence of a substantial self. In the very next sentence following the initial statement of the cogito, the meditator says: “But I do not yet have a sufficient understanding of what this ‘I’ is, that now necessarily exists” (Med. 2, AT 7:25). The cogito purports to yield certainty that I exist insofar as I am a thinking thing, whatever that turns out to be. The ensuing discussion is intended to help arrive at an understanding of the ontological nature of the thinking subject.

More generally, we should distinguish issues of epistemic and ontological dependence. In the final analysis, Descartes thinks he shows that the occurrence of thought depends (ontologically) on the existence of a substantial self — to wit, on the existence of an infinite substance, namely God (cf. Med. 3, AT 7:48ff). But Descartes denies that an acceptance of these ontological matters is epistemically prior to the cogito: its certainty is not supposed to depend (epistemically) on the abstruse metaphysics that Descartes thinks he eventually establishes.

If the cogito does not presuppose a substantial self, what then is the epistemic basis for injecting the “I” into the “I think”? Some critics have complained that, in referring to the “I”, Descartes begs the question by presupposing what he means to establish in the “I exist.” Among the critics, Bertrand Russell objects that “the word ‘I’ is really illegitimate”; that Descartes should have, instead, stated “his ultimate premiss in the form ‘there are thoughts’.” Russell adds that “the word ‘I’ is grammatically convenient, but does not describe a datum.” (1945, 567) Accordingly, “there is pain” and “I am in pain” have different contents, and Descartes is entitled only to the former.

One effort at reply has it that introspection reveals more than what Russell allows — it reveals the subjective character of experience. On this view, there is more to the experiential story of being in pain than is expressed by saying that there is pain: the experience includes the feeling of pain plus a point-of-view — an experiential addition that's difficult to characterize except by adding that “I” am in pain, that the pain is mine. Importantly, my awareness of this subjective feature of experience does not depend on an awareness of the metaphysical nature of a thinking subject. If we take Descartes to be using ‘I’ to signify this subjective character, then he is not smuggling in something that's not already there: the “I”-ness of consciousness turns out to be (contra Russell) a primary datum of experience. Though, as Hume persuasively argues, introspection reveals no sense impressions suited to the role of a thinking subject, Descartes, unlike Hume, has no need to derive all our ideas from sense impressions. Descartes' idea of the self does ultimately draw on innate conceptual resources.

Sixth, much of the debate over whether the cogito involves inference, or is instead a simple intuition (roughly, self-evident), is preempted by three observations. One observation concerns the absence of an express ‘ergo’ (‘therefore’) in the Second Meditation account. It seems a mistake to emphasize this absence, as if suggesting that Descartes denies any role for inference. For the Second Meditation passage is the one place (of his various published treatments ) where Descartes explicitly details a line of inferential reflection leading up to the conclusion that I am, I exist. His other treatments merely say the ‘therefore’; the Meditations treatment unpacks it. A second observation is that it seems a mistake to assume that the cogito must either involve inference, or intuition, but not both. There is no inconsistency in the view that the meditator comes to appreciate the persuasive force of the cogito by means of inferential reflection, while also holding that his eventual conviction is not grounded in inference. A third observation is that what one intuits might well include an inference: it is widely held among philosophers today that modus ponens is self-evident, and yet it contains an inference. There is no inconsistency in claiming a self-evident grasp of a proposition with inferential structure — a fact applicable to the cogito. As Descartes writes:

When someone says “I am thinking, therefore I am, or I exist,” he does not deduce existence from thought by means of a syllogism, but recognizes it as something self-evident by a simple intuition of the mind. (Replies 2, AT 7:140)

4.2 But is it Knowledge?

There are interpretive disputes about whether the cogito is supposed to count as indefeasible Knowledge. (That is, about whether it thus counts upon its initial introduction, prior to the arguments for a non-deceiving God.) Many commentators hold that it is supposed to count, but the case for this interpretation is by no means clear.

There is no disputing that Descartes characterizes the cogito as the “first item of knowledge [cognitione]” (Med. 3, AT 7:35); as the first “piece of knowledge [cognitio]” (Prin. 1:194, AT 8a:7). Noteworthy, however, is the Latin terminology (‘cognitio’ and its cognates) that Descartes uses in these characterizations. As discussed in Section 1.3, Descartes is a contextualist in the sense that he uses ‘knowledge’ language in two different contexts of clear and distinct judgments: the less rigorous context includes defeasible judgments, as in the case of the atheist geometer (who can't block hyperbolic doubt); the more rigorous context requires indefeasible judgments, as with the brand of Knowledge sought after in the Meditations.

Worthy of attention is that Descartes characterizes the cogito using the same cognitive language that he uses to characterize the atheist's defeasible cognition. Recall that Descartes writes of the atheist's clear and distinct grasp of geometry: “I maintain that this awareness [cognitionem] of his is not true knowledge [scientiam]” (Replies 2, AT 7:141). This alone does not prove that the cogito is supposed to be defeasible. It does, however, prove that calling it the “first item of knowledge [cognitione]” doesn't entail that Descartes intends it as indefeasible Knowledge.

Bearing further on whether the cogito counts as indefeasible Knowledge — prior to having refuted the Evil Genius Doubt — is the No Atheistic Knowledge Thesis (cf. Section 1.3 above). Descartes makes repeated and unequivocal statements implying this thesis. Consider the following texts, each arising in a context of clarifying the requirements of indefeasible Knowledge (all italics are mine):

For if I do not know this [i.e., “whether there is a God, and, if there is, whether he can be a deceiver”], it seems that I can never be quite certain about anything else. (Med. 3, AT 7:36)

I see that the certainty of all other things depends on this [knowledge of God], so that without it nothing can ever be perfectly known [perfecte sciri]. (Med. 5, AT 7:69)

[I]f I did not possess knowledge of God … I should thus never have true and certain knowledge [scientiam] about anything, but only shifting and changeable opinions. (Med. 5, AT 7:69)

And upon claiming finally to have achieved indefeasible Knowledge:

Thus I see plainly that the certainty and truth of all knowledge [scientiae] depends uniquely on my awareness of the true God, to such an extent that I was incapable of perfect knowledge [perfecte scire] about anything else until I became aware of him. (Med. 5, AT 7:71)

These texts make a powerful case that nothing else can be indefeasibly Known prior to establishing that we're creatures of an all-perfect God, rather than an evil genius. These texts make no exceptions. Descartes looks to hold that hyperbolic doubt is utterly unbounded — that it undermines all manner of propositions, including therefore the proposition that “I exist.”

By contrast, other texts seem to support the interpretation whereby the cogito counts as indefeasible Knowledge. For example, we have seen texts making clear that it resists hyperbolic doubt. Often overlooked, however, is that it is only subsequent to the introduction of the cogito that Descartes has his meditator first notice the manner in which clear and distinct perception is both resistant and vulnerable to hyperbolic doubt: the extraordinary certainty of such perception resists hyperbolic doubt while it is occurring; it is vulnerable to hyperbolic doubt upon redirecting one's perceptual attention away from the matter in question. This theme is developed more fully in the next Section below.

As will emerge, there are two main kinds of interpretive camps concerning how to deal with the so-called Cartesian Circle. The one camp contends that hyperbolic doubt is utterly unbounded. On this view, the No Atheist Knowledge Thesis is taken quite literally. The other camp contends that hyperbolic doubt is bounded; that is, that the cogito, and a few other special truths, are in a lockbox of sorts, utterly protected from even the most hyperbolic doubt. This view allows that atheists can have indefeasible Knowledge. These two kinds of interpretations are developed in Section 6.

Further reading: For important passages in Descartes' handling of the cogito, see the second and third sets of Objections and Replies. In the secondary literature, see Beyssade (1993), Broughton (2002), Carriero (2009), Cunning (2007), Hintikka (1962), Markie (1992) Sarkar (2003), and Vinci (1998).

5. Epistemic Privilege and Defeasibility

The extraordinary certainty and doubt-resistance of the cogito marks an Archimedean turning point in the meditator's inquiry. Descartes builds on its impressiveness to help clarify further epistemic theses. The present Section considers two such theses about our epistemically privileged perceptions. First, that clarity and distinctness are, jointly, the mark of our epistemically best perceptions (notwithstanding that such perception remains defeasible). Second, that judgments about one's own mind are epistemically privileged compared with those about bodies.

5.1 Our Epistemic Best: Clear and Distinct Perception and its Defeasibility

The opening four paragraphs of the Third Meditation are pivotal. Descartes uses them to codify the phenomenal marks of our epistemically best perceptions, while clarifying also that even this impressive epistemic ground falls short of the goal of indefeasible Knowledge. This sobering realization leads to Descartes' infamous efforts to refute the Evil Genius Doubt, by proving a non-deceiving God.

The first and second paragraphs portray the meditator attempting to build on the success of the cogito by identifying a general principle of certainty: “I am certain that I am a thinking thing. Do I not therefore also know what is required for my being certain about anything?” (AT 7:35). What are the phenomenal marks of this impressive perception — what is it like to have perception that good? Descartes' answer: “In this first item of knowledge [cognitione] there is simply a clear and distinct perception of what I am asserting” (ibid.).

The third and fourth paragraphs help clarify (among other things) what Descartes takes to be epistemically impressive about clear and distinct perception, though absent from external sense perception. The third paragraph has the meditator observing:

Yet I previously accepted as wholly certain and evident many things which I afterwards realized were doubtful. What were these? The earth, sky, stars, and everything else that I apprehended with the senses. But what was it about them that I perceived clearly? Just that the ideas, or thoughts, of such things appeared before my mind. Yet even now I am not denying that these ideas occur within me. But there was something else which I used to assert, and which through habitual belief I thought I perceived clearly, although I did not in fact do so. This was that there were things outside me which were the sources of my ideas and which resembled them in all respects. Here was my mistake; or at any rate, if my judgement was true, it was not thanks to the strength of my perception. (Med. 3, AT 7:35)

The very next paragraph (the fourth) draws an epistemically important contrast with external sense perception (as just characterized). External sense perception does not admit of any great “strength of perception,” quite unlike clear and distinct perception. As earlier noted (Section 1.1), the certainty of interest to Descartes is psychological in character, though not merely psychological. Not only does occurrent clear and distinct perception resist doubt, it provides a kind of cognitive illumination. Both of these epistemic virtues — its doubt-resistance, and its luminance — are noted in the fourth paragraph:

[Regarding] those matters which I think I see utterly clearly with my mind's eye … when I turn to the things themselves which I think I perceive very clearly, I am so convinced by them that I spontaneously declare: let whoever can do so deceive me, he will never bring it about that I am nothing, so long as I continue to think I am something; or make it true at some future time that I have never existed, since it is now true that I exist; or bring it about that two and three added together are more or less than five, or anything of this kind in which I see a manifest contradiction. (Med. 3, AT 7:36)

The contrast drawn in the third and fourth paragraphs gets at a theme that Descartes thinks crucial to his broader project: namely, that there is “a big difference” — an introspectible difference — between external sense perception, and perception that is genuinely clear and distinct. The external senses result in, at best, “a spontaneous impulse” to believe something, an impulse we're able to resist. In contrast, occurrent clear and distinct perception is utterly irresistible: “Whatever is revealed to me by the natural light — for example that from the fact that I am doubting it follows that I exist, and so on — cannot in any way be open to doubt.” (Med. 3, AT 7:38) As Descartes repeatedly conveys: “my nature is such that so long as I perceive something very clearly and distinctly I cannot but believe it to be true” (Med. 5, AT 7:69; cf. 3:64, 7:36, 7:65, 8a:9).

Because of the epistemic impressiveness of clear and distinct perception (notably, as exhibited in the cogito), the meditator concludes that such perception will issue as the mark of truth, if anything will. He tentatively formulates the following candidate for a criterion of truth: “I now seem [videor] to be able to lay it down as a general rule that whatever I perceive very clearly and distinctly is true” (Med. 3, AT 7:35). I shall call this general principle the ‘C&D Rule’. The announcement of the candidate criterion is carefully tinged with caution (videor), as the C&D Rule has yet to be subjected to hyperbolic doubt. Should it turn out that clarity and distinctness — as an epistemic ground — is shakable, then, there would remain some doubt about the general veracity of clear and distinct perception. In that case, when reflecting back on having perceived something clearly and distinctly, it would not seem so impressive, after all — it “would not be enough to make me certain of the truth of the matter” (ibid.). This cautionary note anticipates the sobering realization of the fourth paragraph, that, for all its impressiveness, even clear and distinct perception is in some sense defeasible.

In what sense defeasible? Recall that the Evil Genius Doubt is, fundamentally, a doubt about our cognitive natures. Maybe my mind was made flawed, such that I go wrong even when my perception is clear and distinct. As the meditator conveys in the fourth paragraph, my creator might have “given me a nature such that I was deceived even in matters which seemed most evident,” with the consequence that “I go wrong even in those matters which I think I see utterly clearly with my mind's eye” (AT 7:36). The result is a kind of epistemic schizophrenia:

Moments of epistemic optimism: While I am directly attending to a proposition — perceiving it clearly and distinctly — I enjoy an irresistible cognitive luminance and my assent is compelled.

Moments of epistemic pessimism: When no longer directly attending — no longer perceiving the proposition clearly and distinctly — I can entertain the sceptical hypothesis that such feelings of cognitive luminance are epistemically worthless, arising from a defective cognitive nature.

The doubt is thus indirect, in the sense that these moments of epistemic pessimism arise when I am no longer directly attending to the propositions in question. This indirect operation of hyperbolic doubt is conveyed not only in the fourth paragraph, but in numerous other texts, including the following:

Admittedly my nature is such that so long as I perceive something very clearly and distinctly I cannot but believe it to be true. But my nature is also such that I cannot fix my mental vision continually on the same thing, so as to keep perceiving it clearly; and often the memory of a previously made judgement may come back, when I am no longer attending to the arguments which led me to make it. And so other arguments can now occur to me which might easily undermine my opinion, if I were unaware of [the true] God; and I should thus never have true and certain knowledge about anything, but only shifting and changeable opinions. For example, when I consider the nature of a triangle, it appears most evident to me, steeped as I am in the principles of geometry, that its three angles are equal to two right angles; and so long as I attend to the proof, I cannot but believe this to be true. But as soon as I turn my mind's eye away from the proof, then in spite of still remembering that I perceived it very clearly, I can easily fall into doubt about its truth, if I am unaware of God. For I can convince myself that I have a natural disposition to go wrong from time to time in matters which I think I perceive as evidently as can be. (Med.5, AT 7:69–70; cf. AT 3:64–65; AT 8a:9–10).

Granted, this indirect doubt is exceedingly hyperbolic. Even so, it means that we lack fully indefeasible Knowledge. Descartes thus closes the fourth paragraph as follows:

And since I have no cause to think that there is a deceiving God, and I do not yet even know for sure whether there is a God at all, any reason for doubt which depends simply on this supposition is a very slight and, so to speak, metaphysical one. But in order to remove even this slight reason for doubt, as soon as the opportunity arises I must examine whether there is a God, and, if there is, whether he can be a deceiver. For if I do not know this, it seems that I can never be quite certain about anything else. (Med. 3, AT 7:36)

The leading role played by the cogito in this four paragraph passage is easily overlooked. Not only is it (in paragraph two) the exemplar of judging clearly and distinctly, it is listed (paragraph four) among the propositions that are compellingly certain while attended to, though undermined when we no longer thus attend.

What next? How does Descartes think we're to make epistemic progress if even our epistemic best is subject to hyperbolic doubt? This juncture of the Third Meditation (the end of the fourth paragraph) marks the beginning point of Descartes' notorious efforts to refute the Evil Genius Doubt. His efforts involve an attempt to establish that we are the creatures not of an evil genius, but an all-perfect creator who would not allow us to be deceived about what we clearly and distinctly perceive. Before turning our attention (in Section 6) to these efforts, let's digress somewhat to consider a Cartesian doctrine that has received much attention in its subsequent history.

5.2 The Epistemic Privilege of Judgments About the Mind

Descartes holds that our judgments about our own minds are epistemically better-off than our judgments about bodies. In our natural, pre-reflective condition, however, we're apt to confuse the sensory images of bodies with the external things themselves, a confusion leading us to think our judgments about bodies are epistemically impressive. The confusion is clearly expressed (Descartes would say) in G. E. Moore's famous claim to knowledge — “Here is a hand” — along with his more general defense of common sense:

I begin, then, with my list of truisms, every one of which (in my own opinion) I know, with certainty, to be true. … There exists at present a living human body, which is my body. This body was born at a certain time in the past, and has existed continuously ever since … But the earth had existed also for many years before my body was born … (1962, 32–33)

In contrast, Descartes writes:

[I]f I judge that the earth exists from the fact that I touch it or see it, this very fact undoubtedly gives even greater support for the judgement that my mind exists. For it may perhaps be the case that I judge that I am touching the earth even though the earth does not exist at all; but it cannot be that, when I make this judgement, my mind which is making the judgement does not exist. (Prin. 1:11, AT 8a:8–9)

Methodical doubt is intended to help us appreciate the folly of the commonsensical position — helping us to recognize that the perception of our own minds is “not simply prior to and more certain … but also more evident” than that of our own bodies (Prin. 1:11, AT 8a:8). “Disagreement on this point,” writes Descartes, comes from “those who have not done their philosophizing in an orderly way”; from those who, while properly acknowledging the “certainty of their own existence,” mistakenly “take ‘themselves’ to mean only their bodies” — failing to “realize that they should have taken ‘themselves’ in this context to mean their minds alone” (Prin. 1:12, AT 8a:9).

In epistemological contexts, Descartes underwrites the mind-better-known-than-body doctrine with methodic doubt. For example, while reflecting on his epistemic position in regards both to himself, and to the wax, the Second Meditation meditator says:

Surely my awareness of my own self is not merely much truer and more certain than my awareness of the wax, but also much more distinct and evident. For if I judge that the wax exists from the fact that I see it, clearly this same fact entails much more evidently that I myself also exist. It is possible that what I see is not really the wax; it is possible that I do not even have eyes with which to see anything. But when I see, or think I see (I am not here distinguishing the two), it is simply not possible that I who am now thinking am not something. (Med. 2, AT 7:33)

Other reasons motivate Descartes as well. The doctrine is closely allied with his commitment to a representational theory of sense perception. On his view of sense perception, our sense organs and nerves serve as literal mediating links in the perceptual chain: they stand between (both spatially and causally) external things themselves, and the brain events that occasion our perceptual awareness (cf. Prin. 4:196). In veridical sensation, the immediate objects of sensory awareness are not external bodies themselves, nor are we immediately aware of states of our sense organs or nerves. Rather, the immediate objects of awareness — whether in veridical sensation, or dreams — are the mind's ideas. Descartes thinks that the fact of physiological mediation helps explain delusional ideas, because roughly the same kinds of physiological processes that produce waking ideas are employed in producing delusional ideas:

[I]t is the soul which sees, and not the eye; and it does not see directly, but only by means of the brain. That is why madmen and those who are asleep often see, or think they see, various objects which are nevertheless not before their eyes: namely, certain vapours disturb their brain and arrange those of its parts normally engaged in vision exactly as they would be if these objects were present. (Optics, AT 6:141; cf. Med. 6, AT 7:85ff; Passions 26)

Various passages of the Meditations lay important groundwork for this theory of perception. For instance, one of the messages of the wax passage is that sensory awareness does not reach to external things themselves:

We say that we see the wax itself, if it is there before us, not that we judge it to be there from its colour or shape; and this might lead me to conclude without more ado that knowledge of the wax comes from what the eye sees, and not from the scrutiny of the mind alone. But then if I look out of the window and see men crossing the square, as I just happen to have done, I normally say that I see the men themselves, just as I say that I see the wax. Yet do I see any more than hats and coats which could conceal automatons? I judge that they are men. (Med. 2, AT 7:32)

Descartes thinks we're apt to be “tricked by ordinary ways of talking” (ibid.). In ordinary contexts we don't say that it seems there are men outside the window; we say we see them. Nor, in such contexts, are our beliefs about those men apt to result from conscious, inferentially complex judgments, say, like this one: “Well, I appear to be awake, and the window pane looks clean, and there's plenty of light outside, and so on, and I thus conclude that I am seeing men outside the window.” Even so, our ordinary ways of speaking and thinking often mislead. Descartes' view is that the mind's immediate perception does not, strictly speaking, extend beyond itself, to external bodies. This is an important basis of the mind-better-known-than-body doctrine. In the concluding paragraph of the Second Meditation, Descartes writes:

I see that without any effort I have now finally got back to where I wanted. I now know that even bodies are not strictly [proprie] perceived by the senses or the faculty of imagination but by the intellect alone, and that this perception derives not from their being touched or seen but from their being understood; and in view of this I know plainly that I can achieve an easier and more evident perception of my own mind than of anything else. (Med. 2, AT 7:34)

Related is a Third Meditation remark. Discussing sense perception and our ideas of external things, Descartes writes that the mind's sensation extends strictly and immediately only to the ideas: “the ideas were, strictly speaking, the only immediate objects of my sensory awareness [solas proprie et immediate sentiebam]” (Med. 3, AT 7:75). The theme that ideas are the only immediate objects of awareness repeats itself elsewhere in Descartes' writings. As he tells Hobbes: “I make it quite clear in several places … that I am taking the word ‘idea’ to refer to whatever is immediately perceived by the mind” (Replies 3, AT 7:181).

Complicating an understanding of such passages is that Descartes scholarship is divided on whether to attribute to him some version of an indirect theory of perception, or instead some version of a direct theory. According to indirect perception accounts, in normal sensation the mind's perception of bodies is mediated by an awareness of its ideas of those bodies. By contrast, direct perception interpretations allow that in normal sensation the mind's ideas play a mediating role, though this role doesn't have ideas functioning as items of awareness; rather, the objects of direct awareness are the external things, themselves. On both accounts, ideas mediate our perception of external objects. On direct theory accounts, the mediating role is only a process role. By analogy, various brain processes mediate our perception of external objects, but in the normal course of perception we are not consciously aware of those processes; and likewise for the mind's ideas, according to direct perception accounts. I hold an indirect perception interpretation. On the version of the interpretation I favor — and elsewhere defend (2009) — sensory ideas mediate our perception of the external bodies they're of, in much the same way that pictures (or other representational imagery) mediate our perception of what they portray. More generally, Descartes seems to view all ideas as mental pictures, of a sort. As he writes: “the term ‘idea’ is strictly appropriate” only for thoughts that “are as it were the images of things” (Med. 3, AT 7:37); he adds that “the ideas in me are like {pictures, or} images” (Med. 3, AT 7:42).

Indirect perception interpretations have figured prominently in the history of Descartes scholarship. A number of recent commentators, however, have challenged this traditional view. For example, John Carriero's recent book on Descartes defends a direct perception interpretation: “I don't read Descartes as holding that I am (immediately) aware only of my sensory ideas and only subsequently (and perhaps indirectly) aware of bodies or their qualities” (2009, 25). Thus on Carriero's reading, Descartes' broader argument rebutting our doubts about the external world is not to be understood as an effort to get on the other side (as it were) of our ideas:

The argument (as I understand it) is not intended to get us from a realm of inner mental objects (“sensory ideas”) to some other realm of outer, physical objects (“bodies”); rather, it is to confirm our instinctive feeling that we have been receiving information (“directly”) from outer objects, bodies, all along. (2009, 26)

Returning to Descartes' views of epistemic privilege, it is generally overlooked that his mind-better-known-than-body doctrine is intended as a comparative rather than a superlative thesis. For Descartes, the only superlative perceptual state is that of clarity and distinctness: only it is correctly characterized as our epistemic best. All manner of judgments are susceptible to error except when based on clear and distinct perception.

This understanding of Descartes deviates from a “Cartesian” view widely attributed to him, namely: that we simply cannot be mistaken about the present contents of consciousness; that such judgments about the mind are, by their very nature, as good as it gets. (People widely attribute to Descartes a variety of related doctrines. Compare the doctrines of the infallibility of the mental — roughly, the doctrine that sincere introspective judgments are always true; the indubitability of the mental — roughly, that sincere introspective judgments are indefeasible; and omniscience with respect to the mental — roughly, that one has Knowledge of every true proposition about one's own present contents of consciousness. There is some variation in the way these doctrines are formulated in the literature.) Am I really denying that this is Descartes' view? How could we be mistaken about the present contents of consciousness? And how do I explain the passages in which Descartes explicitly embraces the thesis?

Descartes' view is that introspective judgments are indeed privileged, but he regards them as nonetheless subject to error. Even introspective perception — e.g., our awareness of occurrent pains and other sensations — must be rendered clear and distinct to be counted among our epistemic best. Such matters may be clearly and distinctly perceived, writes Descartes,

…provided we take great care in our judgements concerning them to include no more than what is strictly contained in our perception — no more than that of which we have inner awareness. But this is a very difficult rule to observe, at least with regard to sensations. (Prin. 1:66, AT 8a:32; cf. Prin. 1:68)

Elsewhere, Descartes writes that we do “frequently make mistakes, even in our judgements concerning pain” (Prin. 1:67). These mistakes arise because “people commonly confuse this perception [of pain] with an obscure judgement they make concerning the nature of something which they think exists in the painful spot and which they suppose to resemble the sensation of pain” (Prin.1:46, AT 8a:22).

But how could I be mistaken in judging, say, that I seem to see a speckled hen with two speckles? Descartes holds that we can be mistaken quite simply, by thinking obscurely or confusedly. On his view, the key to infallibility is not merely that the mind's attention is on its ideas, but that it renders its ideas clear and distinct. To help appreciate his view, notice that judgments about seeming to see hens with two speckles are the same, in kind, as those about seeming to see hens with two hundred forty-seven speckles. Quite obviously, I might be confused in this latter case. (Indeed, it is plausible to hold that only in confusion could I seem to be seeing exactly that many speckles.) Yet there is no relevant difference that would explain why the one judgment is infallible (not merely correct), while the other is fallible. For Descartes, both are fallible; the relevant consideration distinguishing their susceptibility to error is that the two-speckled case is so much easier to render clear and distinct. But though simpler ideas are generally easier to make clear and distinct, simplicity is not a requirement: “A concept is not any more distinct because we include less in it; its distinctness simply depends on our carefully distinguishing what we do include in it from everything else” (Prin. 1:63, AT 8a:31; cf. Prin. 1:45).

What about the texts wherein Descartes seems explicitly to embrace the infallibility of introspective judgments? Consider two key texts often cited in this connection:

I certainly seem to see, to hear, and to be warmed. This cannot be false; what is called “having a sensory perception” is strictly just this, and in this restricted sense of the term it is simply thinking. (Med. 2, AT 7:29)

Now as far as ideas are concerned, provided they are considered solely in themselves and I do not refer them to anything else, they cannot strictly speaking be false; for whether it is a goat or a chimera that I am imagining, it is just as true that I imagine the former as the latter. As for the will and the emotions, here too one need not worry about falsity; for even if the things which I may desire are wicked or even non-existent, that does not make it any less true that I desire them. Thus the only remaining thoughts where I must be on my guard against making a mistake are judgements. (Med. 3, AT 7:37)

On close inspection, these texts make no claim about the possibility of introspective judgment error, because these texts — barring the final sentence of the second passage — are not about fully formed judgments. Rather, Descartes is isolating the components of judgment. His two-faculty theory of judgment requires an interaction between the perceptions of the intellect and the will's assent (a theory elaborated in the Fourth Meditation). A sine qua non of judgment error is that there be an act of judgment, but acts of judgment require both a perception and a volition. Descartes' claim that mere seemings “cannot strictly speaking be false” is therefore innocuous: for in isolating the mere seeming, he isolates the perceptual from the volitional. My merely seeming to see a speckled hen with two speckles could not, per se, involve judgment error, because it is not in itself a judgment.

Further reading: On discussions of truth criteria in the 16th and 17th centuries, see Popkin (1979). On Descartes' theory of ideas, see Carriero (2009), Chappell (1986), Hoffman (1996), Jolley (1990), Nadler (2006), Nelson (1997), and Newman (2009). On the defeasibility of clear and distinct perception (including the cogito), see Carriero (2009, 339ff), Newman and Nelson (1999). On contemporary treatments of infallibility, indubitability, and omniscience, see Alston (1989) and Audi (1993).

6. Cartesian Circle

At the end of Section 5.1 we left off with the fourth paragraph of the Third Meditation. That passage clarifies that the Evil Genius Doubt undermines even clear and distinct perception: upon turning my attention away from matters thus perceived, I can then wonder whether I have a defective cognitive nature that makes me go wrong even in such cases. In his Principles treatment of the same issues, Descartes summarizes the broader problem as follows:

The mind, then, knowing itself, but still in doubt about all other things, looks around in all directions in order to extend its knowledge [cognitionem] further. … Next, it finds certain common notions from which it constructs various proofs; and, for as long as it attends to them, it is completely convinced of their truth. … But it cannot attend to them all the time; and subsequently, when it happens that it remembers a conclusion without attending to the sequence which enables it to be demonstrated, recalling that it is still ignorant as to whether it may have been created with the kind of nature that makes it go wrong even in matters which appear most evident, the mind sees that it has just cause to doubt such conclusions, and that the possession of certain knowledge [scientiam] will not be possible until it has come to know the author of its being. (Prin. 1.13, AT 8a:9–10)

How can we overcome this lingering hyperbolic doubt? At the close of the fourth paragraph of the Third Meditation, Descartes lays out an ambitious plan: “in order to remove even this slight reason for doubt, as soon as the opportunity arises I must examine whether there is a God, and, if there is, whether he can be a deceiver” (Med. 3, AT 7:36).

The broader argument that unfolds has seemed to many readers to be viciously circular — the so-called Cartesian Circle. Descartes first argues from clearly and distinctly perceived premises to the conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists; he then argues from the premise that a non-deceiving God exists to the conclusion that what is clearly and distinctly perceived is true. The worry is that he presupposes the C&D Rule in the effort to prove the C&D Rule. In what follows, I first clarify the key steps in the broader argument for the divine guarantee of the C&D Rule. I then turn to the Cartesian Circle.

6.1 Establishing the Divine Guarantee of the C&D Rule

Descartes' broader argument unfolds in two main steps. The first main step has him making arguments in the Third Meditation for the existence of an all-perfect God. From these arguments Descartes concludes:

I recognize that it would be impossible for me to exist with the kind of nature I have — that is, having within me the idea of God — were it not the case that God really existed. By ‘God’ I mean the very being the idea of whom is within me, that is, the possessor of all the perfections which I cannot grasp, but can somehow reach in my thought, who is subject to no defects whatsoever. It is clear enough from this that he cannot be a deceiver, since it is manifest by the natural light that all fraud and deception depend on some defect. (Med. 3, AT 7:51f)

There is much of interest to say about Descartes' arguments for an all-perfect God. (The Fifth Meditation advances a further such argument.) In the interests of space, and of focusing on epistemological concerns, however, these arguments will not be considered here. (For an overview of Descartes' proofs, see Nolan and Nelson (2006).)

Descartes' second main step is to argue from the premise (now established) that an all-perfect God exists, to the general veracity of the C&D Rule — whereby, whatever is clearly and distinctly perceived is true. As Descartes tells us: “In the Fourth Meditation it is proved that everything that we clearly and distinctly perceive is true” (Synopsis, AT 7:15). It is this second main step of the broader argument that I want to develop here.

It is tempting to suppose that this second main step is unneeded. That is, one might have thought that the C&D Rule is a straightforward consequence of the existence of a God who is no deceiver. But this is is too fast. Why should only the C&D Rule be a straightforward consequence, but not also a more general infallibility of all our judgments? Essentially this point is made in the First Meditation, at the introduction of the Evil Genius Doubt. The meditator observes that what seems to follow from the standard view — whereby God “is said to be supremely good,” rather than a deceiver — is that God would not allow us ever to be mistaken in our judgments:

But if it were inconsistent with his goodness to have created me such that I am deceived all the time, it would seem equally foreign to his goodness to allow me to be deceived even occasionally; yet this last assertion cannot be made. (Med. 1, AT 7:21)

In short, the “rule for truth” that would seem to be the most straightforward consequence of an all-perfect creator is this perfectly general rule: If I form a judgment, then it is true. Yet quite clearly, this rule for truth doesn't hold. But then, this fact — the very existence of error — calls into question whether there is an all-perfect creator. In this First Meditation passage Descartes is raising the traditional problem of evil, but here applied to the case of judgment error. As the passage reasons:

  1. There is judgment error.
  2. Judgment error is incompatible with the hypothesis that I am the creature of a non-deceiving God.
  3. Therefore, I am not the creature of a non-deceiving God.

These First Meditation remarks set the stage for the discussion that will come in the Fourth Meditation. Descartes will need a theodicy for error. (A theodicy is an effort to explain how God is compatible with evil.) The theodicy needs to show that the existence of God is compatible with some forms of judgment error, but not others. The Fourth Meditation thus begins by revisiting the problem of error. But in context, the meditator has just proven the existence of an all-perfect God — a scenario generating cognitive dissonance:

To begin with, I recognize that it is impossible that God should ever deceive me. … I know by experience that there is in me a faculty of judgement which, like everything else which is in me, I certainly received from God. And since God does not wish to deceive me, he surely did not give me the kind of faculty which would ever enable me to go wrong while using it correctly.

There would be no further doubt on this issue were it not that what I have just said appears to imply that I am incapable of ever going wrong. For if everything that is in me comes from God, and he did not endow me with a faculty for making mistakes, it appears that I can never go wrong. (Med. 4, AT 7:53–54)

In an effort to resolve the problem, the meditator begins an investigation into the causes of error. In the course of the discussion, Descartes puts forward his theory of judgment. Judgment arises from the cooperation of the intellect and the will. The investigation concludes that the cause of error is an improper use of the will: error arises when the will gives assent to propositions of which the intellect lacks a clear and distinct understanding. It is therefore within our power to avoid judgment error. Error is our fault:

[If] I simply refrain from making a judgement in cases where I do not perceive the truth with sufficient clarity and distinctness, then it is clear that I am behaving correctly and avoiding error. But if in such cases I either affirm or deny, then I am not using my free will correctly. (Med. 4, AT 7:59–60)

The theodicy that emerges is a version of the freewill defense. Accordingly, we should thank God for giving us freewill, but the cost of having freewill is the possibility of misusing it. Since error is the result of misusing our freewill, we should not blame God.

Not only is the theodicy used to explain the kinds of error God can allow, it serves to clarify the kinds of error God cannot allow. From the latter arises a proof of the C&D Rule. God can allow errors that are my fault, though not errors that would be God's fault. When my perception is clear and distinct, giving assent is not a voluntary option — thus not explainable by the freewill defense. In such cases, assent is a necessary consequence of my cognitive nature — a point made in many passages: “our mind is of such a nature that it cannot help assenting to what it clearly understands” (AT 3:64); “the nature of my mind is such that I cannot but assent to these things, at least so long as I clearly perceive them” (Med. 5, AT 7:65). Since, on occasions of clarity and distinctness, my assent arises from the cognitive nature that God gave me, God would be blamable if those judgments resulted in error. Therefore, they are not in error; indeed they could not be. That an evil genius might have created me casts doubt on my clear and distinct judgments. That, instead, an all-perfect God created me guarantees that these judgments are true. A clever strategy of argument thus unfolds — effectively inverting the usual reasoning in the problem of evil:

  1. There is a non-deceiving God.
  2. A non-deceiving God is incompatible with the hypothesis that I am in error about what I clearly and distinctly perceive.
  3. Therefore, I am not in error about what I clearly and distinctly perceive.

The first premise was argued in the Third Meditation. The second premise arises out of the discussion of the Fourth Meditation. The result is a divine guarantee of the C&D Rule.

By the end of the Fourth Meditation, important pieces of Descartes' broader argument are in place. Whether further important pieces arise in the Fifth Meditation is a matter of interpretive dispute. In any case, the Fifth Meditation comes to a close with Descartes asserting that indefeasible Knowledge has finally been achieved:

I have perceived that God exists, and at the same time I have understood that everything else depends on him, and that he is no deceiver; and I have drawn the conclusion that everything which I clearly and distinctly perceive is of necessity true. … what objections can now be raised? That the way I am made makes me prone to frequent error? But I now know that I am incapable of error in those cases where my understanding is transparently clear. … And now it is possible for me to achieve full and certain knowledge of countless matters, both concerning God himself and other things whose nature is intellectual, and also concerning the whole of that corporeal nature which is the subject-matter of pure mathematics. (Med. 5, AT 7:70-71)

6.2 Circularity and the Broader Argument

Students of philosophy can expect to be taught a longstanding interpretation according to which Descartes' broader argument is viciously circular. Despite its prima facie plausibility, Descartes commentators generally resist the vicious circularity interpretation.

Consider first what every plausible interpretation must concede: that the two main steps of the broader argument unfold in a manner suggestive of a circle — I'll indeed refer to them as ‘arcs’. The Third Meditation arguments for God define one arc:

Arc 1: The conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists is derived from premises that are clearly and distinctly perceived.

The Fourth Meditation argument defines a second arc:

Arc 2: The general veracity of propositions that are clearly and distinctly perceived (i.e., the C&D Rule) is derived from the conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists.

That the broader argument unfolds in accord with these two steps is uncontroversial. The question of interest concerns whether, strictly speaking, these arcs form a circle. The statement of Arc 1 admits of considerable ambiguity. How one resolves this ambiguity determines whether vicious circularity is the result. Let's begin by clarifying what Arc 1 would have to mean to generate vicious circularity. We'll then consider the main alternative interpretations of that arc by which commentators avoid a vicious circle.

Vicious Circularity interpretation:

Arc 1: The conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists is derived from premises that are clearly and distinctly perceived — i.e., premises that are accepted because of first accepting the general veracity of propositions that are clearly and distinctly perceived.

Arc 2: The general veracity of propositions that are clearly and distinctly perceived is derived from the conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists.

Thus rendered, Descartes' broader argument is viciously circular. The italicized segment of Arc 1 marks an addition to the original statement of it, thereby clarifying the circularity reading. Interpreted in this way, Descartes begins his Third Meditation proofs of God by presupposing the general veracity of clear and distinct perception. That is, he starts by assuming the C&D Rule and then uses the rule in the course of demonstrating it. Evidently, this way of reading Descartes' argument has pedagogical appeal, for it is ubiquitously taught (outside of Descartes scholarship) despite the absence of any textual merit. If there is one point of general agreement in the secondary literature, it is that the texts do not sustain this interpretation.

How then should Arc 1 be understood? There are countless interpretations that avoid vicious circularity, along with numerous schemes for cataloguing them. For present purposes, I'll catalogue the various accounts according to two main kinds of non-circular strategies that commentators attribute to Descartes. (The secondary literature offers multiple variations of each these main kinds of interpretations, though I won't here explore the variations.)

Unbounded Doubt interpretations:

Arc 1: The conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists is derived from premises that are clearly and distinctly perceived — i.e., premises that are accepted, despite being defeasible, because our cognitive nature compels us to assent to clearly and distinctly perceived propositions.

Arc 2: The general veracity of propositions that are clearly and distinctly perceived is derived from the conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists.

Again, the italicized segment marks an addition to the original statement of Arc 1. I call this an ‘Unbounded Doubt’ interpretation, because this kind of interpretation construes hyperbolic doubt as unbounded. More precisely, the Evil Genius Doubt is (on this reading) unbounded in the sense that it undermines all manner of judgments — even the cogito, even the premises of the Third Meditation proofs of God. It is the unboundedness of hyperbolic doubt that underwrites the No Atheistic Knowledge Thesis.

Importantly, if doubt is thus unbounded then there is no circularity. For, on this reading of it, Arc 1 does not presuppose the general veracity of the C&D Rule. Hyperbolic doubt is in play throughout Arc 1.

A question immediately arises for such unbounded doubt interpretations. Given that hyperbolic doubt is unbounded, why then are the Arc 1 arguments for God accepted? Why does the meditator assent to the premises of those arguments, if indeed hyperbolic doubt undermines them? The answer lies in our earlier discussion of the indirect manner in which hyperbolic doubt operates (Section 5.1). Recall that while I am clearly and distinctly attending to a proposition, it compels my assent: “my nature is such that so long as I perceive something very clearly and distinctly I cannot but believe it to be true” (Med. 5, AT 7:69; cf. 3:64, 7:36, 7:65, 8a:9). Descartes holds that while we are attending to the steps of the Third Meditation arguments for God, we have no choice but to accept those arguments. Of course, from the fact that those arguments compel our assent while attending to them, it does not (yet) follow that we have Knowledge of their conclusions. At present, our focus is on the issue of circularity, not the issue of how hyperbolic doubt is finally overcome.

The other main kind of interpretation avoids circularity in a different manner. Let's consider that alternative.

Bounded Doubt interpretations:

Arc 1: The conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists is derived from premises that are clearly and distinctly perceived — indeed, premises belonging to a special class of truths immune to doubt.

Arc 2: The general veracity of propositions that are clearly and distinctly perceived is derived from the conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists.

Once again, the italicized segment marks an addition to the original statement of Arc 1. I call this a ‘Bounded Doubt’ interpretation, because this kind of interpretation construes hyperbolic doubt as bounded. More precisely, the Evil Genius Doubt is (on this reading) bounded in the sense that its sceptical potency does not extend to all judgments: a special class of truths is outside the bounds of doubt. Exemplary of this special class are the cogito and, importantly, the premises of the Third Meditation proofs of God. Propositions in this special class can be indefeasibly Known even by atheists. Since the truths in this special class are Knowable independently of a divine guarantee of the C&D Rule, there is no vicious circularity in the broader argument. Throughout the arguments of Arcs 1 and 2, the premises employed count as indefeasibly Known prior to the Knowledge of the C&D Rule they help establish.

Proponents of this interpretation are apt to cite Third Meditation texts referring to truths said to be revealed by the natural light. The interpretation has it that these natural light propositions are in no way subject to doubt, unlike ordinary clearly and distinctly perceivable truths. In order to extend indefeasible Knowledge to all such truths, it is necessary to establish the general veracity of the C&D Rule. Thus, the need (on this interpretation) for Arc 2 in the broader project.

Though bounded and unbounded doubt interpretations both avoid vicious circularity, each confronts further difficulties, both textual and philosophical. Avoiding the charge of vicious circularity marks the beginning of the interpreter's work, not the end. Bounded doubt interpreters must explain why, in the first place, the Evil Genius Doubt's potency does not extend to propositions in the special class. Unbounded doubt interpreters must explain why, in the final analysis, the Evil Genius Doubt eventually loses it undermining potency. Let's consider each of these further problems.

Granting a bounded doubt interpretation, why — in the first place — does the Evil Genius Doubt's potency not extend to propositions in the special class? How is it that the doubt does undermine the proposition “that two and three added together make five,” but not the proposition “that there must be at least as much [reality] in the efficient and total cause as in the effect of that cause”? The first proposition is included in the list of examples that are undermined by the Evil Genius Doubt (see fourth paragraph of Med. 3). The second proposition is a premise in a Third Meditation argument for God — a proposition immune to doubt, according to bounded doubt interpretations. What is supposed to be the relevant difference between these propositions? Given the indirect manner in which hyperbolic doubt operates, there seems no clear explanation of why the doubt succeeds in undermining the first proposition but is somehow resisted by the second. Even more awkward for this interpretation is that the cogito is included in the list of examples that that same fourth paragraph passage implies is vulnerable to doubt.

Granting an unbounded doubt interpretation, why — in the final analysis — does the Evil Genius Doubt eventually lose its undermining potency? Putting the point ironically: Why doesn't the Evil Genius Doubt undermine the very arguments intended to refute the Evil Genius Doubt, as soon as the mind is no longer attending to those premises? Consider Descartes' own explanation of how hyperbolic doubt undermines the conclusions of arguments once their premises are no longer in the mind's view:

There are other truths which are perceived very clearly by our intellect so long as we attend to the arguments on which our knowledge of them depends; and we are therefore incapable of doubting them during this time. But we may forget the arguments in question and later remember simply the conclusions which were deduced from them. The question will now arise as to whether we possess the same firm and immutable conviction concerning these conclusions, when we simply recollect that they were previously deduced from quite evident principles (our ability to call them ‘conclusions’ presupposes such a recollection). (Replies 2, AT 7:146)

So, when we're no longer clearly and distinctly perceiving the steps of an argument, we do not “possess the same firm and immutable conviction” of its conclusion. But precisely such moments are when hyperbolic doubt does its undermining work. This means that upon diverting attention from the premises of Arcs 1 and 2, it is then possible to run the Evil Genius Doubt on their conclusions. It would thus seem that unbounded doubt interpretations leave us in a Sisyphus-like predicament. According to the myth, each time Sisyphus pushes his boulder near to the top of the hill, the boulder somehow slips away, rolling to the very bottom, and the whole process must start all over. By carefully constructing the arguments of Arcs 1 and 2, the meditator gains anti-sceptical momentum, pushing his project near to the goal of Knowledge. But each time, upon diverting his attention from the premises, he finds himself back at the bottom of the hill, wondering about the credibility of those proofs that seemed so evident: “perhaps some God could have given me a nature such that I was deceived even in matters which seemed most evident” (Med. 3, AT 7:36).

Again, the hard question for this interpretation: Why, in the final analysis, does the Evil Genius Doubt eventually lose it undermining potency? Because I hold an unbounded doubt interpretation, this is the hard problem I must confront. Elsewhere (1999), Alan Nelson and I have proposed a solution. Though space doesn't permit a full recounting of our proposal, I'll try to summarize the account.

Various themes about innate truths are introduced in the Fifth Meditation. Among them concerns the effects of repeated meditation: truths initially noticed only by means of inference might come to be apprehended self-evidently. In the build-up to the passage claiming that the Evil Genius Doubt is finally and fully overcome, Descartes has his meditator say:

But as regards God, if I were not overwhelmed by preconceived opinions, and if the images of things perceived by the senses did not besiege my thought on every side, I would certainly acknowledge him sooner and more easily than anything else. For what is more self-evident [ex se est apertius] than the fact that the supreme being exists, or that God, to whose essence alone existence belongs, exists?

Although it needed close attention for me to perceive this, I am now just as certain of it as I am of everything else which appears most certain. And what is more, I see that the certainty of all other things depends on this, so that without it nothing can ever be perfectly known. (Med. 5, AT 7:69)

Descartes reiterates this same theme in the Second Replies:

I ask my readers to spend a great deal of time and effort on contemplating the nature of the supremely perfect being. Above all they should reflect on the fact that the ideas of all other natures contain possible existence, whereas the idea of God contains not only possible but wholly necessary existence. This alone, without a formal argument, will make them realize that God exists; and this will eventually be just as self-evident [per se notum] to them as the fact that the number two is even or that three is odd, and so on. For there are certain truths which some people find self-evident, while others come to understand them only by means of a formal argument. (Replies 2, AT 7:163 64)

Let's build on these texts. Let's assume that Descartes holds that the needed conclusion comes to be self-evident — namely, the conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists who guarantees the C&D Rule. Indeed, let's assume that this truth comes to have a kind of cogito-like status, in the following sense: whenever I try to doubt whether God exists, or is a deceiver, or the like, the effort at doubt ends up being self-stultifying. When I try to doubt my own existence, I immediately apprehend that I must exist in order to be attempting the doubt. Similarly (on this interpretation), when I try to doubt God's existence, or benevolence, or the like, I immediately apprehend, as Descartes writes, that any such sceptical conception of God “implies a conceptual contradiction — that is, it cannot be conceived” (May 1643 letter, AT 8b:60). In that case, the hard problem for an unbounded doubt interpretation has dissolved. I can no longer doubt the Arc 1 conclusions about God, or the Arc 2 conclusions about the divine guarantee, because those conclusions have become self-evident. The mechanism for doubting inferential truths — that of attending to a conclusion without also attending to the premises on which it rests — is now impotent. No longer resting on premises, those truths are recognized as true whenever I attend to them. This interpretation explains why Descartes holds, in the final analysis, that the Evil Genius Doubt eventually loses it undermining potency.

Further reading: For Descartes' response to the charges of circularity: see the Fourth Replies. For texts concerning his final solution to hyperbolic doubt: see Fifth Meditation; Second Replies; letter to Regius (24 May 1640). For a treatment of the Fourth Meditation proof of the C&D Rule, see Newman (1999). For examples of unbounded doubt interpretations, see Carriero (2009), Curley (1978 and 1993), DeRose (1992), Loeb (1992), Newman and Nelson (1999), Sosa (1997a and 1997b), and Van Cleve (1979). For examples of bounded doubt interpretations, see Broughton (2002), Doney (1955), Della Rocca (2005), Kenny (1968), Morris (1973), Rickless (2005), and Wilson (1978). For an anthology devoted largely to the Cartesian Circle, see Doney (1987).

7. Proving the Existence of the External Material World

The opening line of the Sixth Meditation makes clear its principal objective: “It remains for me to examine whether material things exist” (AT 7:71). At this juncture, the meditator Knows of his own existence and of God's. It follows that there's an external world with at least one object, God. The existence of an external material world remains in doubt. Establishing the existence of bodies is not a straightforward matter of perceiving them, because, as we have seen, “bodies are not strictly perceived by the senses” (see Section 5.2 above).

Descartes' strategy for proving an external material world has two main parts: first, he argues for the externality of the causes of sensation; second, he argues for the materiality of these external causes. (I will refer to these putative sensations as sensations, though, strictly speaking, we cannot yet be using the term in a way that presupposes being caused by external sense organs.) From these two steps it follows that there exists an external material world. Let's consider each phase of the argument.

7.1 The Case for the Externality of the Causes of Sensation

Descartes builds on a familiar argument in the history of philosophy, an argument that appeals to the involuntariness of sensations. The familiar argument is first articulated in the Third Meditation. Speaking of his apparently adventitious ideas (sensations), the meditator remarks:

I know by experience that these ideas do not depend on my will, and hence that they do not depend simply on me. Frequently I notice them even when I do not want to: now, for example, I feel the heat whether I want to or not, and this is why I think that this sensation or idea of heat comes to me from something other than myself, namely the heat of the fire by which I am sitting. (Med. 3, AT 7:38)

The familiar involuntariness argument amounts to the following — and recall that the me is a thinking thing, a mind:

  1. Sensations come to me involuntarily (I'm unaware of causing them with my will).
  2. Therefore, sensations are caused by something external to me.
  3. Therefore, there exists something external to me — an external world.

(Note: in context, when this argument is first considered by the meditator, he hasn't yet argued for the existence of God; he has yet to establish any manner of an external world.)

Though some such involuntariness argument has convinced many philosophers, the inference from 1 to 2 does not hold up to methodic doubt, as the meditator explains:

Then again, although these [apparently adventitious] ideas do not depend on my will, it does not follow that they must come from things located outside me. Just as the impulses which I was speaking of a moment ago seem opposed to my will even though they are within me, so there may be some other faculty [of my mind] not yet fully known to me, which produces these ideas without any assistance from external things; this is, after all, just how I have always thought ideas are produced in me when I am dreaming. (Med. 3, AT 7:39)

We first looked at this passage in connection with the Always Dreaming Doubt. Methodic doubt raises the problem of the existence of external things. For all I Know, my “waking” experiences are produced not by external things, but by processes similar to those producing my dreams. This sceptical hypothesis explains why the familiar involuntariness argument fails: the inference from 1 to 2 presupposes exactly what is at issue — namely, that involuntarily sensory ideas are produced by external things, rather than by a subconscious faculty of my mind.

Many philosophers have assumed that we lack the epistemic resources to solve this sceptical problem. For example, Hume writes:

By what argument can it be proved, that the perceptions of the mind must be caused by external objects … and could not arise either from the energy of the mind itself … or from some other cause still more unknown to us? It is acknowledged, that, in fact, many of these perceptions arise not from anything external, as in dreams, madness, and other diseases. … It is a question of fact, whether the perceptions of the senses be produced by external objects … But here experience is, and must be entirely silent. (Enquiry Sec. 12)

Interestingly, Descartes would agree that experiential resources cannot solve the problem. By the Sixth Meditation, however, Descartes purports to have the innate resources he needs to solve it — notably, innate ideas of mind and body. Among the metaphysical theses he develops is that mind and body have wholly distinct essences: the essence of thinking substance is pure thought; the essence of body is pure extension. In a remarkable maneuver, Descartes invokes this distinction to refute the sceptical worry that sensations are produced by a subconscious faculty of the mind: “nothing can be in me, that is to say, in my mind, of which I am not aware,” and this “follows from the fact that the soul is distinct from the body and that its essence is to think” (1640 letter, AT 3:273). This result allows Descartes to supplement the involuntariness argument, thereby strengthening the inference from line 1 to line 2. For from the additional premise that nothing can be in my mind of which I am unaware, it follows that if sensations were being produced by some activity in my mind, then I'd be aware of that activity on the occasion of its operation. Since I'm not thus aware, it follows that the sensation I'm having is produced by a cause external to my mind. As Descartes writes, this cause

cannot be in me, since clearly it presupposes no intellectual act [of awareness] on my part, and the ideas in question are produced without my cooperation and often even against my will. So the only alternative is that it is in another substance distinct from me … (Med. 6, AT 7:79)

It follows that my sensations are caused by external world objects. It remains to be shown that these external causes are material objects.

7.2. The Case for the Materiality of the Causes of Sensation

On Descartes' analysis, there are three possible options for the kind of external thing causing sensations:

  1. God
  2. material/corporeal substance
  3. some other created substance

That is, the cause is either infinite substance (God), or finite substance; and if finite, then either corporeal, or something else. Descartes eliminates options (a) and (c) by appeal to God being no deceiver:

But since God is not a deceiver, it is quite clear that he does not transmit the ideas to me either directly from himself, or indirectly, via some creature [other than corporeal substance] … For God has given me no faculty at all for recognizing any such source for these ideas; on the contrary, he has given me a great propensity to believe that they are produced by corporeal things. It follows that corporeal things exist. (Med. 6, AT 7:79–80, italics added)

This is a highly problematic passage. The “great propensity” here referred to is not the irresistible compulsion of clear and distinct perception. (If it were, the conclusion that sensation is caused by material objects would follow straightaway from this clear and distinct perception, via the C&D Rule.) But unless each step of the argument is clearly and distinctly perceived, Descartes should not be making the argument. Adding to the difficulties of the passage, he expressly cites the conclusion as following from the fact that “God is not a deceiver,” implying that he thinks this inference is supported by a divine guarantee. What is going on in this passage?

On one kind of interpretation, Descartes relaxes his epistemic standards in the Sixth Meditation. He no longer insists on indefeasible Knowledge, now settling for probabilistic arguments. Though there are no decisive texts indicating that this is Descartes' intent, the interpretation does find some support. For instance, in the Synopsis Descartes writes of his Sixth Meditation arguments:

The great benefit of these arguments is not, in my view, that they prove what they establish … The point is that in considering these arguments we come to realize that they are not as solid or as transparent as the arguments which lead us to knowledge of our own minds and of God … (AT 7:15–16)

The remark can be read as a concession that the Sixth Meditation arguments are weaker than the earlier arguments about minds and God — that these later arguments do not “prove what they establish.” Of course, one need not read the remark this way. And other texts are unfavorable to this interpretation. For example, in the opening paragraphs of the Sixth Meditation Descartes considers a probabilistic argument for the existence of external bodies. Though he accepts the proposed account as offering the best explanation, he nonetheless dismisses it for the express reason that it grounds “only a probability” — it does not provide the “basis for a necessary inference that some body exists” (Med. 6, AT 7:73). This is a puzzling dismissal, assuming Descartes has relaxed his standards to probable inference.

The relaxed standards interpretation falls short for another reason. It provides no explanation of why Descartes cites a divine guarantee for the conclusion that sensations are caused by material objects.

On another kind of interpretation, the troubling passage appealing to a “great propensity” does not mark a relaxing of epistemic standards. Instead, Descartes is extending the implications of his discussion of theodicy in the Fourth Meditation. I earlier argued (Section 6.1) that Descartes thinks he demonstrates the divine guarantee of the C&D Rule by showing that an all-perfect God cannot allow us to be in error about what we clearly and distinctly perceive. What if Descartes holds that there are other perceptual circumstances under which an all-perfect God could not allow us to be in error? And suppose these other circumstances are cases like those occurring in the highly problematic passage. Under these assumptions, the resulting rule for truth would look something like the following:

I am not in error in cases in which (i) I have a great propensity to believe, and (ii) God provided me no faculty by which to correct a false such belief.

This rule is more expansive than the C&D Rule, in that it licenses more kinds of judgments. (Elsewhere (1999), I have called this the ‘Inclination Without Correction Rule’.) Clauses (i) and (ii) are tailored to the problematic passage wherein, as we've seen, Descartes invokes two conditions: “God has given me no faculty at all for recognizing any such source for these ideas; on the contrary, he has given me a great propensity to believe that they are produced by corporeal things.” If indeed we're on the right interpretive track, then Descartes needs some way to prove this rule. Assuming a proof similar in structure to the proof of the C&D Rule, it would run as follows:

  1. There is a non-deceiving God.
  2. A non-deceiving God cannot allow me to be in error in cases in which (i) I have a great propensity to believe, and (ii) God provided me no faculty by which to correct a false such belief.
  3. Therefore, I am not in error in cases in which (i) I have a great propensity to believe, and (ii) God provided me no faculty by which to correct a false such belief.

Assuming Descartes could establish premise 2, he would be entitled to this more powerful rule, and without having relaxed his standards of indefeasibility.

Elsewhere (1999), I argue that premise 2 follows from Descartes's Fourth Meditation discussion. Prima facie, this may seem ad hoc. But even without detailing the argument, a number of texts make clear that he holds some version of premise 2. In the relevant Sixth Meditation passage, Descartes adds that from “the very fact that God is not a deceiver” there is a “consequent impossibility of there being any falsity in my opinions which cannot be corrected by some other faculty supplied by God” (Med. 6, AT 7:80). In another passage he writes that we would be “doing God an injustice” if we implied “that God had endowed us with such an imperfect nature that even the proper use of our powers of reasoning allowed us to go wrong” (Prin. 4:43, AT 8a:99). In the Second Replies he addresses the case of judgments that “could not be corrected by any clearer judgements or by means of any other natural faculty,” adding: “in such cases I simply assert that it is impossible for us to be deceived” (Replies 2, AT 7:143f). These passages strongly suggest that Descartes thinks that God's benevolent nature entails a more expansive rule of truth than the C&D Rule. Assuming this interpretation is correct, the inferential moves in the problematic passage are not ad hoc. And as will emerge, Descartes looks again to call on this same more expansive rule in his effort to prove that he is not dreaming.

A final observation. It is often unnoticed that the conclusion of Descartes' argument for the existence of an external material world leaves significant scepticism in place. Granting the success of the argument, my sensations are caused by an external material world. But for all the argument shows — for all the broader argument of the Meditations shows, up to this point — my mind might be joined to a brain in a vat, rather than a full human body. This isn't an oversight on Descartes' part. It's all he thinks the argument can prove. For even at this late stage of the Meditations, the meditator does not yet Know himself to be awake.

Further reading: For a variation of the Sixth Meditation argument for the existence of the external material world, see Descartes' Prin. 2.1. See also Friedman (1997), Garber (1992), and Newman (1994). On the respects in which the Sixth Meditation inference draws on Fourth Meditation work, see Newman (1999). For an interpretation of the Sixth Meditation argument that's consistent with a direct realist interpretation, see Carriero (2009, 146ff).

8. Proving that One is Not Dreaming

By design, the constructive arguments of the Meditations unfold though the meditator remains in doubt about being awake. This of course reinforces the ongoing theme that Knowledge does not properly include judgments of external sense. In the closing paragraph of the Sixth Meditation, Descartes revisits the issue of dreaming. He claims to show how, in principle — even if not easily in practice — it is possible to achieve Knowledge that one is awake.

A casual reading of that final paragraph might suggest that Descartes offers a naturalistic solution to the problem (viz., a non-theistic solution), in the form of a continuity test: since continuity with past experiences holds only of waking but not dreaming, checking for the requisite continuity is the test for ascertaining that one is awake. The following remarks can be read in this way:

I now notice that there is a vast difference between the two [“being asleep and being awake”], in that dreams are never linked by memory with all the other actions of life as waking experiences are. … But when I distinctly see where things come from and where and when they come to me, and when I can connect my perceptions of them with the whole of the rest of my life without a break, then I am quite certain that when I encounter these things I am not asleep but awake. (Med. 6, AT 7:89–90)

This naturalistic “solution” prompts two obvious criticisms, both raised by Hobbes in the Third Objections. First, the solution runs contrary to Descartes' No Atheistic Knowledge Thesis: since the continuity test (on the naturalistic reading of it) does not invoke God, it thus appears, as Hobbes notes, “that someone can know he is awake without knowledge of the true God” (AT 7:196). Second, as Hobbes adds, it seems one could dream the requisite continuity: one could “dream that his dream fits in with his ideas of a long series of past events,” thus undermining the credibility of the continuity test (AT 7:195).

Mirroring our discussion in Section 7.2, one kind of interpretation has Descartes relaxing his epistemic standards. He's aware that the naturalistic solution does not stand up to methodic doubt, but he's not attempting to overcome the Now Dream Doubt with indefeasible Knowledge. A problem for this interpretation is that it doesn't square with the reply Descartes makes to Hobbes' first objection: “an atheist can infer that he is awake on the basis of memory of his past life” (via the continuity test); but “he cannot know that this criterion is sufficient to give him the certainty that he is not mistaken, if he does not know that he was created by a non-deceiving God” (Replies 3, AT 7:196). Evidently, Descartes' solution is not supposed to be available to the atheist. Taken at face value, this reply rules out a relaxed standards reading; it indeed rules out any interpretation involving a naturalistic solution to the problem of dreaming.

On closer inspection, the Sixth Meditation passage puts forward not a naturalistic solution, but a theistic one. The meditator finally concludes that he's awake because, as the passage explicitly reads, “God is not a deceiver” (AT 7:90).

How does his argument go? Recall, in the proof of the external material world (Section 7.2), that Descartes mysteriously invokes the following (divinely guaranteed) truth rule:

I am not in error in cases in which (i) I have a great propensity to believe, and (ii) God provided me no faculty by which to correct a false such belief.

I suggest that in the dreaming passage Descartes is again invoking this rule. The passage opens with the meditator observing the following:

I can almost always make use of more than one sense to investigate the same thing; and in addition, I can use both my memory, which connects present experiences with preceding ones, and my intellect, which has by now examined all the causes of error. Accordingly, I should not have any further fears about the falsity of what my senses tell me every day; on the contrary, the exaggerated doubts of the last few days should be dismissed as laughable. This applies especially to … my inability to distinguish between being asleep and being awake. (Med. 6, AT 7:89)

Referring to the worry that he's dreaming as exaggerated suggests that condition (i) is met — i.e., suggests that the present circumstance includes a “great propensity” to believe he's awake. As such, he needs only to establish condition (ii), and he'll have a divine guarantee of being awake. Notice that an important theme of the above passage concerns the meditator's faculties for correcting sensory error — suggesting condition (ii). I propose that, in context, Descartes' appeal to the continuity test is best understood in conjunction with condition (ii). As the meditator says (speaking of his apparently waking experience):

[W]hen I distinctly see where things come from and where and when they come to me, and when I can connect my perceptions of them with the whole of the rest of my life without a break, then I am quite certain that when I encounter these things I am not asleep but awake. And I ought not to have even the slightest doubt of their reality if, after calling upon all the senses as well as my memory and my intellect in order to check them, I receive no conflicting reports from any of these sources. For from the fact that God is not a deceiver it follows that in cases like these I am completely free from error. (Med. 6, AT 7:90; italics added)

Central to the inference is the meditator's effort to check the correctness of his belief, by means of his various faculties. The cases like these to which Descartes refers look to be those where conditions (i) and (ii) are both satisfied. Recall what Descartes writes in conjunction with the proof of the external material world: from “the very fact that God is not a deceiver” there is a “consequent impossibility of there being any falsity in my opinions which cannot be corrected by some other faculty supplied by God” (Med. 6, AT 7:80). On the reading that I am proposing, Descartes' theistic solution to the Now Dreaming Doubt employs the same rule that he employs in his proof for the external material world.

What about Hobbes' second objection — in effect, that one could dream both (i) and (ii)? Descartes' response: “A dreamer cannot really connect his dreams with the ideas of past events, though he may dream that he does. For everyone admits that a man may be deceived in his sleep.” (AT 7:196) Perhaps Descartes thinks the situation parallels that of waking life. Those who are sufficiently tired, or otherwise perceptually inattentive, “cannot really” perceive truths clearly and distinctly, though it may seem to them that they do. Whether in waking or dreaming, the Fourth Meditation theodicy has God allowing us to make judgment errors, provided that they are correctable. Relevant, therefore, is that Descartes seems to hold that the mistake of dreaming that we're awake is correctable: “to be aware that we are dreaming we need only the intellect” (Replies 5, AT 7:359).

Importantly, Descartes does not say we can easily correct the mistake of dreaming that we're awake. To the contrary, the Sixth Meditation treatment of the Now Dreaming Doubt closes with a concession that his solution is more theoretical than practical:

But since the pressure of things to be done does not always allow us to stop and make such a meticulous check, it must be admitted that in this human life we are often liable to make mistakes about particular things, and we must acknowledge the weakness of our nature. (Med. 6, AT 7:90)

Thus the importance of Descartes' First Meditation remark that “no danger or error will result” from the program of methodic doubt, “because the task now in hand does not involve action” (Med. 1, AT 7:22). Methodic doubt should not be applied to practical matters. Prudence dictates that when making practical decisions I should assume I'm awake, even if I don't Know that I'm awake. Judgment errors made while mistakenly assuming I'm awake won't have any actual practical consequences, but those made while mistakenly assuming I'm dreaming might.

Further reading: See Newman (1999), Williams (1978), and Wilson (1978).


Primary Sources

Abbreviations Used:

Rules = Rules for the Direction of our Native Intelligence
Discourse = Discourse on Method
Synopsis = Synopsis of the Meditations
Meditations = Meditations on First Philosophy
Med. = any one of the six Meditations
Objs./Replies = any of the seven sets of objections/replies that Descartes published along with the Meditations
Prin. = Principles of Philosophy
Passions = The Passions of the Soul
Search = The Search for Truth
AT = Oeuvres de Descartes, Adam, Charles, and Paul Tannery, (eds.) 1904. Paris: J. Vrin. (References are to volume number and page.)
CSM = The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Cottingham, John, and Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch. (eds.) 1984. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Dates in parentheses indicate a reference to Descartes' correspondance. All quoted texts are from CSM. For full bibliographic information on Descartes' writings, see the entry on Descartes.

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

a priori justification and knowledge | certainty | Descartes, René | Descartes, René: modal metaphysics | Descartes, René: theory of ideas | Gassendi, Pierre | idealism | idealism: British | ideas | innateness: historical controversies | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | knowledge: analysis of | moral particularism | original position | perception: epistemological problems of | primary and secondary qualities | rationalism vs. empiricism | realism | reasoning: defeasible | sense-data | skepticism | truth


Thanks to Robert Audi, Alan Nelson, Ram Neta, and Shaun Nichols, for helpful discussions about the ideas in this essay.