# Truthlikeness

*First published Wed Jul 11, 2001; substantive revision Wed May 9, 2007*

*Truth* is the aim of inquiry. Nevertheless, some falsehoods
seem to realize this aim better than others. Some truths better
realize the aim than other truths. And perhaps even some falsehoods
realize the aim better than some truths do. The dichotomy of the
class of propositions into truths and falsehoods should thus be
supplemented with a more fine-grained ordering — one which
classifies propositions according to their *closeness* to the
truth, their degree of truthlikeness or verisimilitude. The logical
problem of truthlikeness is to give an adequate account of the
concept and to explore its logical properties. Of course, the logical
problem intersects with problems in both epistemology and value
theory.

In §1 we will examine the basic assumptions which generate the
logical problem of truthlikeness, which in part explain why the
problem emerged when it did. Attempted solutions to the problem
quickly proliferated, but it has become customary to gather them
together into two broad lines of attack. The first, the *content
approach* (§2), was initiated by Popper in his
ground-breaking work. However, because it treats truthlikeness as a
function of just two variables, neither Popper's original proposals,
nor subsequent attempts to elaborate them, can fully capture the
richness of the concept. The second, the *likeness approach*
(§3), takes the *likeness* in *truthlikeness*
seriously. Although it promises to catch more of the complexity of
the concept than does the content approach, it faces two serious
problems: whether the approach can be suitably generalized to complex
examples (§5), and whether it can be developed in a way that is
translation invariant (§6). This raises the question of whether
there might be a hybrid approach (§5) incorporating the best
features of the content and likeness approaches. Recent results
suggest that hybridism has special difficulties of its own.

- 1. The Logical Problem
- 2. The Content Approach
- 3. The Likeness Approach
- 4. Are There Hybrid Approaches?
- 5. Translation Invariance
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The Logical Problem

Truth, perhaps even more than beauty and goodness, has been the target
of an extraordinary amount of philosophical dissection and speculation.
This is unsurprising. After all, truth is the primary aim of all
inquiry and a necessary condition of knowledge. And yet (as the
redundancy theorists of truth have emphasized) there is something
disarmingly simple about truth. That *the number of planets is
ten* is true just in case, well, … the number of planets is
*ten*. By comparison with truth, the more complex, and much more
interesting, concept of truthlikeness has only recently become the
subject of serious investigation. The proposition *the number of
planets in our solar system is ten* may be false, but quite a bit
closer to the truth than the proposition that *the number of planets
in our solar system is ten billion*. Investigation into
truthlikeness began with a tiny trickle of activity in the early
nineteen sixties; became something of a torrent from the mid seventies
until the late eighties; and is now a steady current.

Truthlikeness is a relative latecomer to the philosophical scene
largely because it wasn't until the latter half of the twentieth
century that mainstream philosophers gave up on the Cartesian goal of
infallible knowledge. The idea that we are quite possibily, even
probably, mistaken in our most cherished beliefs, that they might
well be just *false*, was mostly considered tantamount to
capitulation to the skeptic. By the middle of the twentieth century,
however, it was clear that natural science postulated a very odd
world behind the phenomena, one rather remote from our everyday
experience, one which renders many of our commonsense beliefs, as
well as previous scientific theories, strictly speaking, false.
Further, the increasingly rapid turnover of scientific theories
suggested that, far from being established as certain, they are ever
vulnerable to refutation, and typically are eventually refuted, to be
replaced by some new theory. Taking the dismal view, the history of
inquiry is a history of theories shown to be false, replaced by other
theories awaiting their turn at the guillotine.

*Realism* affirms that the primary aim of inquiry is the truth
of some matter. Epistemic *optimism* affirms that the history
of inquiry is one of progress with respect to its primary aim. But
*fallibilism* affirms that, typically, our theories are false
or very likely to be false, and when shown to be false they are
replaced by other false theories. To combine all three ideas, we must
affirm that some false propositions better realize the goal of truth
— are closer to the truth — than others. So the
optimistic realist who has discarded infallibilism has a problem
— the logical problem of truthlikeness.

While a multitude of apparently different solutions to the problem have been proposed, it is now standard to classify them into two main approaches — the content approach and the likeness approach.

## 2. The Content Approach

Karl Popper was the first philosopher to take the logical problem of truthlikeness seriously enough to make an assay on it. This is not surprising, since Popper was also the first prominent realist to embrace a radical fallibilism about science while trumpeting the epistemic superiority of the enterprise.

According to Popper, Hume had shown not only that we can't verify any
interesting theory, we can't even render it more probable. Luckily,
there is an asymmetry between verification and falsification. While
no finite amount of data can verify or probabilify an interesting
scientific theory, they can falsify the theory. According to Popper,
it is the falsifiability of a theory which makes it scientific. In
his early work, he implied that the only kind of progress an inquiry
can make consists in falsification of theories. This is a little
depressing, to say the least. What it lacks is the idea that a
succession of falsehoods can constitute genuine cognitive progress.
Perhaps this is why, for many years after first publishing these
ideas in his 1934 *Logik der Forschung* Popper received a
pretty short shrift from the philosophers. If all we can say with
confidence is “Missed again!” and “A miss is as
good as a mile!”, and the history of inquiry is a sequence of
such misses, then epistemic pessimism follows. Popper eventually
realized that this naive falsificationism is compatible with optimism
provided we have an acceptable notion of verisimilitude (or
truthlikeness). If some false hypotheses are closer to the truth than
others, if verisimilitude admits of degrees, then the history of
inquiry may turn out to be one of steady progress towards the goal of
truth. Moreover, it may be reasonable, on the basis of the evidence,
to conjecture that our theories are indeed making such progress even
though it would be unreasonable to conjecture that they are true
simpliciter.

Popper saw very clearly that the concept of truthlikeness is easily confused with the concept of epistemic probability, and that it has often been so confused. (See Popper, 1963 for a history off the confusion). Popper's insight here was undoubtedly facilitated by his deep, and largely unjustified, antipathy to epistemic probability. His starkly falsificationist account favors bold, contentful theories. Degree of informative content varies inversely with probability — the greater the content the less likely a theory is to be true. So if you are after theories which seem, on the evidence, to be true, then you will eschew those which make bold — that is, highly improbable — predictions. On this picture, the quest for theories with high probability is simply wrongheaded. Certainly we want inquiry to yield true propositions, but not any old truths will do. A tautology is a truth, and as certain as anything can be, but it is never the answer to any interesting inquiry outside mathematics and logic. What we want are deep truths, truths which capture more rather than less, of the whole truth.

What, then, is the source of the widespread conflation of
truthlikeness with probability? Probability — at least of the
epistemic variety — measures the degree of *seeming to be
true*, while truthlikeness measures degree of *being similar
to the truth*. *Seeming* and *being similar* might
at first strike one as closely related, but of course they are rather
different. *Seeming* concerns the appearances whereas
*being similar* concerns the objective facts, facts about
similarity or likeness. Even more important, there is a difference
between being true and being the truth. The truth, of course, has the
property of being true, but not every proposition that is true is the
truth in the sense required by the aim of inquiry. The truth of a
matter at which an inquiry aims has to be the complete, true answer.
Thus there are two dimensions along which probability (seeming to be
true) and truthlikeness (being similar to the truth) differ
radically.

To see this distinction clearly, and to articulate it, was one of Popper's most significant contributions, not only to the debate about truthlikeness, but to philosophy of science and logic in general. As we will see, however, his deep antagonism to probability combined with his passionate love affair with boldness was both a blessing and a curse. The blessing: it led him to produce not only the first interesting and important account of truthlikeness, but to initiate a whole approach to the problem — the content approach (see Oddie 1986a, Zwart 2001). The curse, as is now almost universally recognized: content alone is insufficient to characterize truthlikeness.

Popper made the first assay on the problem in his famous collection
*Conjectures and Refutations*. First, let a matter for
investigation be circumscribed by a language L adequate for
discussing it. (Popper was a great admirer of Tarski's assay on the
concept of truth and strove to model his theory of truthlikeness on
Tarski's theory.) The world induces a partition of sentences of L
into those that are true and those that are false. The set of all
true sentences is thus a complete true account of the world, as far
as that investigation goes. It is aptly called the Truth, *T*.
*T* is the target of the investigation couched in L. It is the
theory that we are seeking, and, if truthlikeness is to make sense,
theories other than *T*, even false theories, come more or
less close to capturing *T*.

*T*, the Truth, is a theory only in the technical Tarskian
sense, not in the ordinary everyday sense of that term. It is a set
of sentences closed under the consequence relation: a consequence of
some sentences in the set is also a sentence in the set. *T*
may not be finitely axiomatisable, or even axiomatisable at all.
Where the language involves elementary arithmetic it follows (from
Gödel's incompleteness theorem) that *T* won't be
axiomatisable. However, it is a perfectly good set of sentences all
the same. In general we will follow the Tarski-Popper usage here and
call any set of sentences closed under consequence a theory, and we
will assume that each proposition we deal with is identified with the
theory it generates in this sense. (Note that when theories are
classes of sentences, theory *A* logically entails theory
*B* just in case *B* is a subset of *A*.)

The complement of *T*, the set of false sentences *F*,
is not a theory even in this technical sense. Since falsehoods always
entail truths, *F* is not closed under the consequence
relation. (This is part of the reason we have no complementary
expression like *the Falsth*. The set of false sentences does
not describe a possible alternative to the actual world.) But
*F* too is a perfectly good set of sentences. The consequences
of any theory *A* that can be formulated in L will thus divide
its consequences between *T* and *F*. Popper called the
intersection of *A* and *T*, the *truth content*
of *A* (*A _{T}*), and
the intersection of

*A*and

*F*, the

*falsity content*of

*A*(

*A*). Any theory

_{F}*A*is thus the union of its non-overlapping truth content and falsity content. Note that since every theory entails all logical truths, these will constitute a special set, at the center of

*T*, which will be included in every theory, whether true or false.

A false theory will cover some of *F*, but because every false
theory has true consequences, it will also overlap with some of
*T* (Diagram 1).

Diagram 1: Truth and falsity contents of false theoryA

A true theory, however, will only cover *T* (Diagram 2):

Diagram 2: True theoryAis identical to its own truth content

Amongst true theories, then, it seems that the more true sentences
entailed the closer we get to *T*, hence the more truthlike.
Set theoretically that simply means that, where *A* and
*B* are both true, *A* will be more truthlike than
*B* just in case *B* is a proper subset of *A*
(which for true theories means that *B _{T}*) is a proper subset of

*A*). Call this principle:

_{T}*the value of content for truths*.

Diagram 3: True theoryAhas more truth content than true theoryB

This essentially syntactic account of truthlikeness has some nice
features. It induces a partial ordering of truths, with the whole
Truth *T* at the top of the ordering: *T* is closer to
the Truth than any other true theory. The set of logical truths is at
the bottom: further from the Truth than any other true theory. In
between these two extremes, true theories are ordered simply by
logical strength: the more logical content, the closer to the Truth.
Since probability varies inversely with logical strength, amongst
truths the theory with the greatest truthlikeness (*T*) must
have the smallest probability, and the theory with the largest
probability (the logical truth) is the furthest from the Truth.
Popper made a bold and simple generalization of this. Just as truth
content (coverage of *T*) counts in favour of truthlikeness,
falsity content (coverage of *F*) counts against. In general
then, a theory A is closer to the truth if it has more truth content
without engendering more falsity content, or has less falsity content
without sacrificing truth content (diagram 4):

Diagram 4: False theoryAcloser to the Truth than false theoryB

The generalization of the truth content comparison also has some nice
features. It preserves the comparisons of true theories mentioned
above. The truth content *A _{T}* of a false theory

*A*(itself a theory in the Tarskian sense) will clearly be closer to the truth than

*A*(diagram 1). More generally, a true theory

*A*will be closer to the truth than a false theory

*B*provided

*A*'s truth content exceeds

*B*'s.

Despite these nice features the account suffers the following fatal
flaw: it entails that no false theory is closer to the truth than any
other. This incommensurability result was proved independently by
Pavel Tichý and David Miller (Miller 1974, and Tichý
1974). It is instructive to see why. Let us suppose that *A*
and *B* are both false, and that *A*'s truth content
exceeds *B*'s. Let *a* be a true sentence entailed by
*A* but not by *B*. Let *f* be any falsehood
entailed by A. Since *A* entails both *a* and
*f* the conjunction, *a*&*f* is a falsehood
entailed by *A*, and so part of *A*'s falsity content.
If *a*&*f* were also part of *B*'s falsity
content *B* would entail both *a* and *f*. But
then it would entail *a* contrary to the assumption. Hence
*a*&*f* is in *A*'s falsity content and not
in *B*'s. So *A*'s truth content cannot exceeds
*B*'s without *A*'s falsity content also exceeding
*B*'s. Suppose now that *B*'s falsity content exceeds
*A*'s. Let *g* be some falsehood entailed by *B*
but not by *A*, and let *f*, as before, be some
falsehood entailed by *A*. The sentence
*f* ⊃ *g* is a truth, and since it is
entailed by *g*, is in *B*'s truth content. If it were
also in *A*'s then both *f* and
*f* ⊃ *g* would be consequences of
*A* and hence so would *g*, contrary to the assumption.
Thus *A*'s truth content lacks a sentence,
*f* ⊃ *g*, which is in *B*'s. So
*B*'s falsity content cannot exceeds *A*'s without
*B*'s truth content also exceeding *A*'s. The
relationship depicted in diagram 4 simply cannot obtain.

It is tempting at this point (and Popper was so tempted) to retreat
to something like the comparison of truth contents alone. That is to
say, *A* is as to the truth as *B* if *A*
entails all of *B*'s truth content, and *A* is closer
to the truth than *B* just in case *A* is at least as
close as *B*, and *B* is not at least as close as
*A*. Call this the *Simple Truth Content account*.

This Simple Truth Content account preserves Popper's ordering of true
propositions. However, it also deems a false proposition the closer
to the truth the stonger it is. (Call this principle: *the value
of content for falsehoods*.) According to this principle, since
the false proposition that *there are seven planets, and all of
them are made of green cheese* is logically stronger than the
false proposition that *there are seven planets* the former is
closer to the truth than the latter. So, once we know a theory is
false we can be confident that tacking on any old arbitrary
proposition, no matter how misleading it is, will lead us inexorably
closer to the truth. Amongst false theories, *brute logical
strength* becomes the sole criterion of a theory's likeness to
truth. This is the *brute strength* objection.

After the proven failure of Popper's proposal a number of variations
on the content approach have been aired. A number stay within
Popper's essentially syntactic paradigm, comparing classes of true
and false sentences (e.g. Schurz and Weingarter 1987, Newton Smith
1981). Others (following a lead from the likeness approach) make the
switch to a more semantic paradigm, searching for a plausible theory
of distance between the semantic content of sentences, construing
these semantic contents as classes of possibilities. A variant of
this approach takes the class of models of a language as a surrogate
for possible states of affairs (Miller 1978a). The other utilizes a
semantics of incomplete possible states like those favored by
structuralist accounts of scientific theories (Kuipers 1987b). The
idea which these share in common is that the distance between two
propositions is measured by the *symmetric difference* of the
two sets of possibilities. Roughly speaking, the larger the symmetric
difference, the greater the distance between the two propositions.
Symmetric differences might be compared qualitatively - by means of
set-theoretic inclusion - or quantitatively, using some kind of
probability measure.

If the truth is taken to be given by a complete possible world (or
perhaps represented by a unique model) then we end up with results
very close to the truncated version of Popper's account, comparing by
truth contents alone (Oddie 1978). In particular, false propositions
are closer to the truth the stronger they are. However, if we take
the structuralist approach then we will take the relevant
possibilities to be “small” states of affairs —
small *chunks* of the world, rather than an entire world
— and then the possibility of more fine-grained distinctions
between theories opens up. A rather promising exploration of this
idea can be found in Volpe 1995.

The fundamental problem with the original content approach lies not in the way it has been articulated, but rather in the basic underlying assumption: that truthlikeness is a function of just two variables — content and truth value. This assumption has a number of rather problematic consequences.

Two things follow if truthlikeness is a function just of the logical
content of a proposition and of its truth value. Firstly, any given
proposition *A* can have only two degrees of verisimilitude:
one in case it is false and the other in case it is true. This is
obviously wrong. A theory can be false in very many different ways.
The proposition that *there are eight planets* is false
whether there are nine planets or a thousand planets, but its degree
of truthlikeness is much higher in the first case than in the latter.
As we will see below, the degree of truthlikness of a true theory may
also vary according to where the truth lies. Secondly, if we combine
the value of content for truths and the value of content for
falsehoods, then if we fix truth value, verisimilitude will vary only
according to amount of content. So, for example, two equally strong
false theories will have to have the same degree of verisimilitude.
That's pretty far-fetched. That *there are ten planets* and
that *there are ten billion planets* are (roughly) equally
strong, and both are false in fact, but the latter seems much further
from the truth than the former.

Finally, how might strength determine verisimilitude amongst false
theories? There seem to be just two plausible candidates: that
verisimilitude increases with increasing strength, or that it
decreases with increasing strength. Both proposals are at odds with
attractive judgements and principles. One does not necessarily make a
step toward the truth by reducing the content of a false proposition.
The proposition that *the moon is made of green cheese* is
logically stronger than the proposition that *either the moon is
made of green cheese or it is made of dutch gouda*, but the
latter hardly seems a step towards the truth. Nor does one
necessarily make a step toward the truth by increasing the content of
a false theory. The false proposition that *all heavenly bodies
are made of green cheese* is logically stronger than the false
proposition *all heavenly bodies orbiting the earth are made of
green cheese* but it doesn't seem to be an improvement.

## 3. The Likeness Approach

In the wake of the collapse of Popper's articulation of the content
approach two philosophers, working quite independently, suggested a
radically different approach: one which takes the *likeness* in
truthlikeness seriously (Tichý 1974, Hilpinen 1976). This shift
from content to likeness was also marked by an immediate shift from
Popper's essentially syntactic approach to a semantic approach, one
which trafficks in the semantic contents of sentences.

Traditionally the semantic contents of sentences have been taken to
be non-linguistic, or rather non-syntactic, items —
*propositions*. What propositions are is, of course, highly
contested, but most agree that a proposition carves the class of
possibilities into two sub-classes — those in which the
proposition is true and those in which it is false. Call the class of
worlds in which the proposition is true its *range*. Some have
proposed that propositions be *identified* with their ranges
(for example, David Lewis, in his 1986). This identification is
implausible since, for example, the informative content of
*7+5=12* seems distinct from the informative content of
*12=12*, which in turn seems distinct from the informative
content of Gödel's first incompleteness theorem - and yet all
three have the same range. They are all true in all possible worlds.
Clearly if semantic content is supposed to be sensitive to
informative content, classes of possible worlds will not be
discriminating enough. We need something more fine-grained for a full
theory of semantic content. Despite this, the range of a proposition
is certainly an important aspect of informative content, and it is
not clear that truthlikeness should be sensitive to differences in
the way a proposition picks out its range. So, tentatively at least,
it seems that logically equivalent propositions have the same degree
of truthlikess. The proposition that *the number of planets is
eight* for example, should have the same degree of truthlikeness
as the proposition that *the square of the number of the planets
is sixty four*.

There is also not a little controversy over the nature of possible
worlds. One view — perhaps Leibniz's and more recently David
Lewis's — is that worlds are maximal collections of possible
*things*. Another — perhaps the early Wittgenstein's
— is that possible worlds are complete possible *ways for
things to be*. On this latter state-conception, a world is a
complete distribution of properties, relations and magnitudes over
the appropriate kinds of entities. Since invoking "all" properties,
relations and so on will certainly land us in paradox, these
distributions, or possibilities, are going to have to be relativised
to some circumscribed array of properties and relations. Call the
complete collection of possibilities, given some array of features,
the *logical space*, and call the array of properties and
relations which underly that logical space, the *framework* of
the space.

Familiar logical relations and operations correspond to well-understood set-theoretic relations and operations on ranges. The range of the conjunction of two proposition is the intersection of the ranges of the two conjuncts. Entailment corresponds to the subset relation on ranges. The actual world is a single point in logical space — a complete specification of every matter of fact (with respect to the framework of features) — and a proposition is true if its range contains the actual world, false otherwise. The whole Truth is a true proposition that is also complete: it entails all true propositions. The range of the Truth is none other than the singleton of the actual world. That singleton is the target, the bullseye, the thing at which the most comprehensive inquiry is aiming.

In addition to the set-theoretic structures which underlie the familiar logical relations, the logical space might be structured by similarity or likeness. For example, worlds might be more or less like other worlds. There might be a betweeness relation amongst worlds, or even a fully-fledged distance metric. If that's the case we can start to see how one proposition might be closer to the Truth — the proposition whose range singles out the actual worl — than another. Suppose, for example, that worlds are arranged in similarity spheres nested around the actual world, familiar from the Stalnaker-Lewis approach to counterfactuals. Consider Diagram 5:

Diagram 5: Verisimilitude by similarity circles

The bullseye is the actual world and the small sphere which includes
it is *T*, the Truth. The nested spheres represent likeness to
the actual world. A world is less like the actual world the larger
the first sphere of which it is a member. Propositions *A* and
*B* are false, *C* and *D* are true. A carves
out a class of worlds which are rather close to the actual world
— all within spheres two to four — whereas *B*
carves out a class rather far from the actual world — all
within spheres five to seven. Intuitively *A* is closer to the
bullseye than is *B*.

The largest sphere which does not overlap at all with a proposition
is plausibly a measure of how close the proposition is to being true.
Call that the *truth factor*. A proposition *X* is
closer to being true than *Y* if the truth factor of
*X* is included in the truth factor of *Y*. The truth
factor of *A*, for example, is the smallest non-empty sphere,
*T* itself, whereas the truth factor of *B* is the
fourth sphere, of which *T* is a proper subset.

If a proposition includes the bullseye then of course it is true
simpliciter, it has the maximal truth factor (the empty set). So all
true propositions are equally close to being true. But truthlikeness
is not just a matter of being close to being true. The tautology,
*D*, *C* and the Truth itself are equally true, but in
that order they increase in their closeness to the whole truth.

Taking a leaf out of Popper's book, Hilpinen argued that closeness to the whole truth is in part a matter of degree of informativeness of a proposition. In the case of the true propositions, this correlates roughly with the smallest sphere which totally includes the proposition. The further out the outermost sphere, the less informative the proposition is, because the larger the area of the logical space which it covers. So, in a way which echoes Popper's account, we could take truthlikeness to be a combination of a truth factor (given by the likeness of that world in the range of a proposition that is closest to the actual world) and a content factor (given by the likeness of that world in the range of a proposition that is furthest from the actual world):

Ais closer to the truth thanBif and only ifAdoes as well asBon both truth factor and content factor, and better on at least one of those.

Applying Hilpinen's definition we capture two more particular
judgements, in addition to those already mentioned, that seem
intuitively acceptable: that *C* is closer to the truth than
*A*, and that *D* is closer than *B*. (Note,
however, that we have here a partial ordering: *A* and
*D*, for example, are not ranked.) We can derive from this
various apparently desirable features of the relation *closer to
the truth*: for example, that the relation is transitive,
asymmetric and irreflexive; that the Truth is closer to the Truth
than any other theory; that the tautology is at least as far from the
Truth as any other truth; that one cannot make a true theory worse by
strengthening it by a truth; that a falsehood is not necessarily
improved by adding another falsehood, or even by adding another
truth.

But there are also some worrying features here. Hilpinen's account entails that no falsehood is closer to the truth than any truth. So, for example, Newton's theory is deeemed to be no more truthlike, no closer to the whole truth, than the tautology. That's bad.

Characterising Hilpinen's account as a combination of a truth factor
and an information factor seems to mask its quite radical departure
from Popper's account. The incorporation of similarity spheres
signals a fundamental break with the pure content approach, and opens
up a range of possible new accounts: what such accounts have in
common is that the truthlikeness of a proposition is a
*non-trivial function of the likeness to the actual world of
worlds in the range of the proposition*.

There are three main problems for any concrete proposal within the likeness approach. The first concerns an account of likeness between states of affairs - in what does this consist and how can it be analyzed or defined? The second concerns the dependence of the truthlikeness of a proposition on the likeness of worlds in its range to the actual world: what is the correct function? And finally, there is the famous problem of "translation variance" of judgements of likeness and of truthlikeness. This last problem will be taken up in section 5.

### 3.1 Likeness of worlds in a (ridiculously) simple logical space

One objection to Hilpinen's proposal (like Lewis's proposal for counterfactuals) is that it assumes the similarity relation on worlds as a primitive, there for the taking. At the end of his 1974 paper Tichý not only suggested the use of similarity rankings on worlds, but also provided a ranking in propositional spaces and indicated how to generalize this to more complex cases.

Examples and counterexamples in Tichý 1974 are exceedingly
simple, utilizing a propositional framework with three primitives
— *h* (for the state *hot*), *r* (for
*rainy*) and *w* (for *windy*). This framework
generates a small logical space of eight possibilities. The sentences
of the associated propositional language are taken to express
propositions over this logical space.

Tichý took judgements of truthlikeness like the following to
be self-evident: Suppose that in fact it is hot, rainy and windy.
Then the proposition that it is cold, dry and still (expressed by the
sentence ~*h*&~*r*&~*w*) is further from
the truth than the proposition that it is cold, rainy and windy
(expressed by the sentence
~*h*&*r*&*w*). And the proposition that
it is cold, dry and windy (expressed by the sentence
~*h*&~*r*&*w*) is somewhere between the
two. These kinds of judgements are taken to be core intuitions which
any adequate account of truthlikeness would have to deliver, and
which Popper's theory patently can not handle. Unlike Popper,
Tichý is not trying to find the missing theoretical bridge to
epistemic optimism in a fallibilist philosophy of science. Rather, he
takes the intuitive concept of truthlikeness to be as much a standard
component of the intellectual armory of the folk as is the concept of
truth. Doubtless, like the concept of truth, it needs tidying up and
trimming down, but he assumes that it is basically sound, and that
the job of the philosopher is to explicate it: that is to say, to
give a precise, logically perspicuous, consistent account which
captures the core intuitions and excludes core counterintuitions. In
the grey areas, where our intuitions are not clear, it is a case of
“spoils to the victor” — the best account of the
core intuitions can legislate where the intuitions are fuzzy or
contradictory.

Corresponding to the eight-members of the logical space generated by distributions of truth values through the three basic conditions, there are eight maximal conjunctions (or constituents):

w1 h&r&ww2 h&r&~ww3 h&~r&ww4 h&~r&~ww5 ~ h&r&ww6 ~ h&r&~ww7 ~ h&~r&ww8 ~ h&~r&~w

Worlds differ in the distributions of these traits, and a natural, albeit simple, suggestion is to measure the likeness between two worlds by the number of agreements on traits. (This is tantamount to taking distance to be measured by the size of the symmetric difference of generating states. As is well known, this will generate a genuine metric, in particular satisfying the triangular inequality.) If w1 is the actual world this immediately induces a system of nested spheres, but one in which the spheres come with numbers attached:

Diagram 6: Similarity circles for the weather space

Those worlds orbiting on the sphere *n* are of distance
*n* from the actual world.

### 3.2 The likeness of a proposition to the truth

Now that we have numbers for distances between worlds, numerical
measures of propositional distance can be defined as some function of
distances, from the actual world, of worlds in the range of a
proposition. But which measure is the right one? Following Hilpinen, we
might take the average, or weighted average, of the closest and
furthest worlds from the actual world. But now that we have distances
associated with all worlds, why take only the extreme worlds into
account? Why shouldn't every world in a proposition count towards its
degree of likeness to the actual world? One possibility is to take the
straight average (or perhaps weighted average) of all distances of
worlds from the actual world. This is tantamount to measuring the
distance from actuality of the “center of gravity” of the
proposition. Another is to take the *sum* of all the distances
of worlds in the range of the proposition. As it happens, these
different proposals have been evaluated rather haphazardly, by
comparing their consequences with particular intuitive judgements.

For example, the straight averaging proposal delivers all of the particular judgements we used above to motivate Hilpinen's proposal, but in conjunction with the simple metric on worlds it delivers the following ordering of propositions:

Truth ValuePropositionDistancetrue h&r&w0 true h&r0.5 false h&r&~w1.0 true h1.3 false h&~r1.5 false ~ h1.7 false ~ h&~r&w2.0 false ~ h&~r2.5 false ~ h&~r&~w3.0

**Table 1**: Distances of propositions from truth using straight average

So far these results look quite pleasing. Propositions are closer to
the truth the more they get the basic weather traits right, further
away the more mistakes they make. A false proposition may be made
either worse or better by strengthening (~*w* is the same
distance from the Truth as ~*h*;
*h*&*r*&~*w* is better than ~*w*
while ~*h*&~*r*&~*w* is worse). A false
proposition (like *h*&*r*&~*w*) can be
closer to the truth than some true propositions (like *h*).

Compare this to the results we get by summing distances:

Truth ValuePropositionDistancetrue h&r&w0 true h&r1 false h&r&~w1 true h4 false h&~r3 false ~ h5 false ~ h&~r&w2 false ~ h&~r5 false ~ h&~r&~w3

**Table 2**: distances of propositions from truth using straight sum

The results of summing distances look rather strange by comparison with the results of averaging distances. These judgments may be sufficient to show that averaging is superior to summing, but they are clearly not sufficient to show that averaging is the right procedure. What we need are some straightforward and compelling general desiderata which jointly yield a single correct function. In the absence of such a proof, we can only resort to case by case comparisons. And the average function has not found universal favor on the score of particular judgments either. Notably, there are pairs of true propositions such that the average measure deems the stronger of the two to be the further from the truth. The tautology, for example, is not the true proposition furthest from the truth. Averaging thus violates the Popperian principle of the value of content for truths (Popper 1976).

Truth ValuePropositionDistancetrue h∨ ~r∨w1.4 true h∨ ~r1.5 true h∨ ~h1.5

**Table 3**: averaging violates the value of content for truths

In deciding how to proceed here we confront a methodological problem. The methodology exemplified by Tichý is very much bottom-up. For the purposes of deciding between rival accounts it takes the intuitive data very seriously. Popper (along with Popperians like Miller) take a far more top-down approach. They are deeply suspicious of folk intuitions, and sometimes appear to be in the business of constructing a new concept rather than explicating an existing one. They place enormous weight on certain plausible general principles, largely those that fit in with other principles of their overall theory of science: for example, the principle that strength is a virtue and that the stronger of two true theories (and maybe even of two false theories) is the closer to the truth. A third approach, one which lies between these two extremes, is that of reflective equilibrium. This recognizes the claims of both intuitive judgements on low-level cases, and plausible high-level principles, and enjoins us to bring principle and judgement into equilibrium, possibly by tinkering with both. Neither intuitive low-level judgements nor plausible high-level principles are given advance priority. The protagonist in the truthlikeness debate who has argued most consistently for this approach is Niiniluoto.

How does this impact on the current dispute? Consider a different space of possibilities, generated by a single magnitude like the number of the planets (N). For the sake of the argument let's forget about the recent demotion of Pluto to less than full planetary status, and agree that N is in fact 9 and that the further n is from 9, the further the proposition that N=n from the Truth. Consider three sets of propositions. In the left-hand column we have a sequence of false propositions which, intuitively, decrease in truthlikeness while increasing in strength. In the middle column we have a sequence of corresponding true propositions, in each case the strongest true consequence of its false counterpart on the left (Popper's “truth content”). Again members of this sequence steadily increase in strength. Finally on the right we have another column of falsehoods. These are also steadily increasing in strength, and like the left-hand falsehoods, seem also to be decreasing in truthlikeness.

Falsehood (1)Strongest True ConsequenceFalsehood (2)11 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=9 or 11 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=10 or 11 ≤ N ≤ 20 12 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=9 or 12 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=10 or 12 ≤ N ≤ 20 …… …… …… 19 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=9 or 19 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=10 or 19 ≤ N ≤ 20 N = 20 N=9 or N = 20 N=10 or N = 20

**Table 4**

Judgements about the closeness of the true propositions to the truth may be less clear than are intuitions about their left-hand counterparts. However, it would seem highly incongruous to judge the truths in table 4 to be steadily increasing in truthlikeness, while the falsehoods on the right, minimally different in content, steadily decrease in truthlikeness. So both the bottom-up approach and reflective equilibrium suggest that all three are sequences of steadily increasing strength combined with steadily decreasing truthlikeness. And if that were right, it might be enough to overturn Popper's claim that amongst true theories strength and truthlikeness covary. This removes an objection to averaging distances, but does not settle the issue in its favor, for there may still be other more plausible counterexamples to averaging that we have not considered.

### 3.3 Generalizing likeness to more complex spaces

Simple propositional examples are all very nice for the purposes of
illustration, but what we want is some indication that this
simplicity is not crucial to the likeness approach. Can essentially
the same idea be extended to arbitrarily complex frameworks? One
fruitful way of generalizing the simple idea to complex frameworks
involves cutting the associated spaces down into finite chunks. This
can be done in various ways, but one promising idea (Tichý,
1974, Niiniluoto 1976) is to make use of a certain kind of normal
form — Hintikka's *distributive normal forms* (Hintikka
1963). Constituents correspond to propositional maximal conjunctions.
Hintikka defined what he called constituents, which, like maximal
conjunctions, are jointly exhaustive and mutually exclusive.
Constituents lay out, in a very perspicuous manner, all the different
ways individuals can be related — relative, of course, to some
framework of attributes. For example, Every sentence in a first-order
language comes with a certain *depth —* the number of
embedded quantifiers required to formulate it. So, for example, (1)
is a depth-1 sentence; (2) is depth-2; and (3) is depth-3.

(1) Everyone loves himself.

(2) Everyone loves another.

(3) Everyone who loves another loves the other's lovers.

We could call a proposition *depth-d* if the shallowest depth
at which it can be expressed is *d*. What Hintikka showed is
that every depth-*d* proposition can be expressed by a
disjunction of depth-*d* constituents. Constituents can be
represented as finite tree-structures, the nodes of which are like
straightforward conjunctions of atomic states. Consequently, if we
can measure distance between such trees we will be well down the path
of measuring the truthlikeness of depth-d propositions: it will be
some function of the distance of constituents in its normal form from
the true depth-d constituent.

This program has proved flexible and fruitful, delivering a wide range of intuitively appealing results in simple first-order cases. Further, the general idea can be extended in a number of different directions: to higher-order languages and to spaces based on functions rather than properties.

## 4. Are There Hybrid Approaches?

Hilpinen's proposal is typically located within the likeness
approach. Interestingly, Hilpinen himself thought of his proposal as
a refined and improved articulation of Popper's content approach.
Popper's *truth factor* Hilpinen identified with that world,
in the range of a proposition, closest to the actual world. Popper's
*content* or *information factor* he identified with
that world, in the range of a propostion, furthest from the actual
world. An improvement in truhtlikeness involves an improvement in
either the truth factor or the information factor. His proposal
clearly departs from Popper's in as much as it incorporates likeness
into both of the determining factors but Hilpinen was also attempting
to capture, in some way or other, Popper's penchant for content as
well as truth. And his account achieves a good deal of that. In
particular his proposal delivers a weak version of the value of
content for truths: namely, that of two truths the logically stronger
cannot be further from the truth than the logically weaker. It fails,
however, to deliver the stonger Popperian content principle for
truths: that the logically stronger of two truths is closer to the
truth.

At this point it may be worth trying to characterize content and
likeness approaches more precisely. Zwart (2001) does just that, and
Zwart and Franssen (2007) use a formal characterization of content
and likeness approaches to determine whether the best of both
approaches might be combined in some kind of happy compromise. That
is to say, can any account satisfy both constraints, or is there some
kind of radical incompatibility. Their characterization of the
content approach is essentially that it encompass the Simple Truth
Content account: *viz* that *A* is as closee to the
truth as *B* if *A* entails all of *A*'s truth
content, and *A* is closer to the truth than *B* just
in case *A* is at least as close as *B*, and *B*
is not at least as close as *A*. Their characterization of the
likeness approach is basically that it encompass Hilpinen's proposal.
They then go on to show that Arrow's famous theorem in social choice
theory can be applied to obtain a surprising general result about
truthlikeness orderings: that there is a precise sense in which there
can be no compromise between the content and likeness approaches,
that any apparent compromise effectively capitulates to one paradigm
or the other. (Obviously, Hilpinen's apparent compromise capitulates
to the likeness approach - given the characterization.)

This theorem represents an interesting new development in the truthlikeness debate. As already noted, much of the debate has been conducted on the battlefield of intuition, with protagonists from different camps firing off cases which appear to refute their opponent's definition while confirming their own. The Zwart-Franssen-Arrow theorem is not only an interesting result in itself, but it represents an innovative and welcome development in the debate, since most of the theorizing has lacked this kind of theoretical generality.

One problem with the Zwart-Franssen-Arrow theorem lies in their characterization of the two approaches. If the Simple Truth Content account is stipulated to be a necessary condition for any content account then while the symmetric difference accounts of Miller and Kuipers are ruled in, Popper's original account is ruled out as an articulation of the content approach. Further, if Hilpinen's condition is stipulated to be a necessary condition for any likeness account then Tichý's averaging account is ruled out. So the characterizations seem to be too narrow. These two characterizations thus rule out what are perhaps the central paradigms of the two approaches.

A more inclusive, and perhaps more accurate, account of the content
approach would count in any proposal that delivers the value of
content for truths: that, at least, was Popper's litmus test for
acceptability and what motivated his original proposal. A more
inclusive account of the likeness approach would count in any
proposal that makes truthlikeness depend, non-trivially, on a measure
or ordering of likeness on worlds. So on this broader
characterization, Popper's account would be a content account but not
a likeness account; Tichý's account would be a likeness
account and not a content account (it violates the value of content
for truths); and Hilpinen's account would almost squeak in as
*both* a content account and a likeness account.
(*Almost* because it does not quite deliver the full value of
content for truths: it entails that a stronger truth cannot be
further from the truth, but not that it must be closer.) Hilpinen's
account is thus (almost) a hybrid. Are there others?

As we have seen, one shortcoming which Hilpinen's proposal shares
with Popper's original proposal is that no falsehood is deemed closer
to the truth than any truth. In the case of Hilpinen's proposal, this
defect can be remedied by assuming quantitative distances between
worlds, and letting *A*'s distance from the truth be some
weighted average of the distance of the closest world in *A*
from the actual world, and the distance of the furthest world in
*A* from the actual world. This quantitative version (call it
*min-max-average*) of Hilpinen's account renders all
propositions comparable for truthlikeness, and some falsehoods it
deems more truthlike than some truths. But while this version of
Hilpinen's proposal falls within the scope of likeness approaches as
defined, it is not totally satisfactory from either content or
likeness perspectives. Let *A* be a true proposition with a
number of worlds tightly clustered around the actual world
*a*. Let *Z* be a false proposition with a number of
worlds tightly clustered around a world *z* maximally distant
from actuality. *A* is highly truthlike, and *Z* highly
untruthlike and *min-max-average* agrees. But now let
*Z*+ be *Z* plus *a*, and let *A*+ be
*A* plus *z*. Considerations of both continuity and
likeness suggest that *A*+ should be much more truthlike than
*Z*+, but they are deemed equally truthlike by
*min-max-average*. Further, *min-max-average* deems
both *A*+ and *Z*+ equal in truthlikeness to the
tautology, violating the principle of the value of content for
truths.

Part of the problem, from the content perspective, is that the
furthest world in a proposition is, as noted above, a very crude
estimator of overall content. Niiniluoto suggests a different content
measure: the (normalized) *sum* of the distances of worlds in
*A* from the actual world. As we have seen, *sum* is
not itself a good measure of distance of a proposition from the
truth. However formally, *sum* is a probability measure, and
hence a measure of a kind of logical weakness. But *sum* is
also a content-likeness hybrid, rendering a proposition more
contentful the closer its worlds are to actuality. Being genuinely
sensitive to size, *sum* is clearly a better measure of
logical weakness than the world furthest from actuality. Hence
Niiniluoto proposes a weighted average of the closest world (the
truth factor) and *sum* (the information factor). and so
*min-sum-average* ranks the tautology, *Z*+ and
*A*+ in that order. *min-sum-average* delivers the
value of content for truths: if *A* is true and is logically
stronger than *B* then both have the same truth factor (0),
but since the range of *B* contains more worlds, its
*sum* will be greater, making it further from the truth. So
*min-sum-average* falls within the content approach on my
characterization. On the other hand, *min-sum-average* seems
to fall within the likeness camp, since it deems truthlikeness to be
a non-trivial function of the likenesses of worlds, in the range of a
proposition, to the actual world.

According to *min-sum-average*: all propositions are
commensurable for truthlikeness; the full principle of the value of
content for truths holds provided the content factor gets non-zero
weight; the Truth has greater truthlikeness than any other
proposition provided all non-actual worlds are some distance from the
actual world; some false propositions are closer to the truth than
others; the principle of the value of content for falsehoods is
appropriatly repudiated, provided the truth factor gets some weight;
if *A* is false, the truth content of *A* is more
truthlike than *A* itself, again provided the truth factor
gets some weight. *min-sum-average* thus seems like a
consistent and somewhat appealing compromise between content and
likeness approaches.

This compatibility result may be too swift for the following reason. We have laid down a rather stringent condition on content-based measures (namely, the value of content for truths) but we have stipulated a really rather lax condition for likeness-based measures (namely, that the likeness of a proposition to the truth be some function or other of the likeness of the worlds in the proposition to the actual world). But this latter condition allows any old non-trivial function of likeness to count. For example, summing the distances of worlds from the actual world is a non-trivial function of likeness, but it hardly satisfies basic intuitive constraints on the likeness of a proposition to the truth. So it is quite likely that there are more stringent but plausible contraints on the likeness approach, and those conditions may block the compatibility of likeness and content. So it is still an interesting open question whether there are simple and compelling principles which can narrow down, or even single out, the correct function underlying the notion of the overall likeness of propositions to the truth.

## 5. Translation Invariance

The single most influential argument against any proposal that utilizes likeness is the charge that it is not translation invariant (Miller 1974a, 1975 a, 1976, and most recently defended, vigorously as usual, in his 2006). Early formulations of the approach (Tichý 1974, 1976) proceeded in terms of syntactic surrogates for their semantic correlates — sentences for propositions, predicates for properties, distributive normal forms for partitions of the logical space, and the like. The question naturally arises, then, whether we obtain the same measures if all the syntactic items are translated into an essentially equivalent language — one capable of expressing the same propositions and properties with a different set of primitive predicates.

Take our simple weather-framework above. This trafficks in three
primitives — *hot*, *rainy*, and *windy*
Suppose, however, that we define the following two new weather
conditions:

minnesotan=_{df}hotif and only ifrainy

arizonan=_{df}hotif and only ifwindy

Now it appears as though we can describe the same sets of weather
states in an *h*-*m*-*a*-ese based on these
conditions.

h-r-w-eseh-m-a-eseTh&r&wh&m&aA~ h&r&w~ h&~m&~aB~ h&~r&w~ h&m&~aC~ h&~r&~w~ h&m&a

If *T* is the truth about the weather then theory *A*,
in *h*-*r*-*w*-ese, seems to make just one error
concerning the original weather states, while *B* makes two
and *C* makes three. However, if we express these two theories
in *h*-*m*-*a*-ese however, then this is
reversed: *A* appears to make three errors and *B*
still makes two and *C* makes only one error. But that means
the account makes truthlikeness, unlike truth, radically
language-relative.

There are two live responses to this criticism. But before detailing
them, note a dead one: the similarity theorist cannot object that
*h*-*m*-*a* is somehow logically inferior to
*h*-*r*-*w*, on the grounds that the primitives
of the latter are essentially "biconditional" whereas the primitives
of the former are not. This is because there is a perfect symmetry
between the two sets of primitives. Starting within
*h*-*m*-*a*-ese we can arrive at the original
primitives by exactly analogous definitions:

rainy=_{df}hotif and only ifminnesotan

windy=_{df}hotif and only ifarizonan

Thus if we are going to object to
*h*-*m*-*a*-ese it will have to be on other than
purely logical grounds.

Firstly, then, the similarity theorist could maintain that certain predicates (presumably “hot”, “rainy” and “windy”) are primitive in some absolute, realist, sense. Such predicates “carve reality at the joints” whereas others (like “minnesotan” and “arizonan”) are gerrymandered affairs. With the demise of predicate nominalism as a viable account of properties and relations this approach is not as unattractive as it might have seemed in the middle of the last century. Realism about universals is certainly on the rise. While this version of realism presupposes a sparse theory of properties — that is to say, it is not the case that to every definable predicate there corresponds a genuine universal — such theories have been championed both by those doing traditional a priori metaphysics of properties (e.g. Bealer 1982) as well as those who favor or more empiricist, scientifically informed approach (e.g. Armstrong 1978, Tooley 1977). According to Armstrong, for example, which predicates pick out genuine universals is a matter for developed science. The primitive predicates of our best fundamental physical theory will give us our best guess at what the genuine universals in nature are. They might be predicates like electron or mass, or more likely something even more abstruse and remote from the phenomena — like the primitives of String Theory.

One apparently cogent objection to this realist solution is that it would render the task of empirically estimating degree of truthlikeness completely hopeless. If we know a priori which primitives should be used in the computation of distances between theories it will be difficult to estimate truthlikeness, but not impossible. For example, we might compute the distance of a theory from the various possibilities for the truth, and then make a weighted average, weighting each possible true theory by its probability on the evidence. That would be the credence-mean estimate of truthlikeness. However, if we don't even know which features should count towards the computation of similarities and distances then it appears that we cannot get off first base.

To see this consider our simple weather frameworks. Suppose that all
I learn is that it is rainy. Do I thereby have some grounds for
thinking *A* is closer to the truth than *B*? I would
if I also knew that *h*-*r*-*w*-ese is the
language for calculating distances. For then, whatever the truth is,
*A* makes one fewer mistake than *B* makes. *A*
gets it right on the rain factor, while *B* doesn't, and they
must score the same on the other two factors whatever the truth of
the matter. But if we switch to *h*-*m*-*a*-ese
then *A*'s epistemic superiority is no longer guaranteed. If,
for example, *T* is the truth then *B* will be closer
to the truth than *A*. That's because in the
*h*-*m*-*a* framework raininess as such doesn't
count in favor or against the truthlikeness of a proposition.

However, this objection fails if there can be empirical indicators
not just of which atomic states obtain, but also which are the
genuine ones, the ones that really do carve reality at the joints.
Obviously the framework would have to contain more than just
*h*, *m* and *a*. It would have to contain
resources for describing the states that indicate whether these were
genuine universals. Maybe whether they enter into genuine causal
relations will be crucial, for example. Once we can distribute
probabilities over the candidates for the real universals, then we
can use those probabilities to weight the various possible distances
which a hypothesis might be from any given theory.

The second live response is both more modest and more radical. It is
more modest in that it is not hostage to the objective priority of a
particular conceptual scheme, whether that priority is accessed a
priori or a posteriori. It is more radical in that it denies a
premise of the invariance argument that at first blush is apparently
obvious. It denies the equivalence of the two conceptual schemes. It
denies that *h*&*r*&*w*, for example,
expresses the very same proposition as
*h*&*m*&*a* expresses. If we deny
translatability then we can grant the invariance principle, and grant
the judgements of distance in both cases, but remain untroubled.
There is no contradiction. (Tichý 1978, Oddie 1986a).

At first blush this seems somewhat desperate. Haven't the respective
conditions been *defined* in such a way that they are simple
equivalents by fiat? That would, of course, be the case if *m*
and *a* had been introduced as defined terms into
*h*-*r*-*w*. But if that were the intention then
the similarity theorist could retort that the calculation of
distances should proceed in terms of the primitives, not the
introduced terms. However that is not the only way the argument can
be read. We are asked to contemplate two partially overlapping
sequences of conditions, and two spaces of possibilities generated by
those two sequences. We can thus think of each possibility as a point
in a simple three dimensional space. These points are ordered triples
of 0s and 1s, the *n*th entry being a if the *n*th
condition is satisfied and 1 if it isn't. Thinking of possibilities
in this way, we already have rudimentary geometrical features
generated simply by the selection of generating conditions. Points
are adjacent if they differ on only one dimension. A path is a
sequence of adjacent points. A point *q* is between two points
*p* and *r* if *q* lies on a shortest path from
*p* to *r*. A region of possibility space is convex if
it is closed under the betweeness relation — anything between
two points in the region is also in the region.

Evidently we have two spaces of possibilities, S1 and S2, and the
question now arises whether a sentence interpreted over one of these
spaces expresses the very same thing as any sentence interpreted over
the other. Does *h*&*r*&*w* express the
same thing as *h*&*m*&*a*?
*h*&*r*&*w* expresses (the singleton of)
u1 (which is the entity <1,1,1> in S1 or
<1,1,1>_{S1}) and
*h*&*m*&*a* expresses v1 (the entity
<1,1,1>_{S2}).
~*h*&*r*&*w* expresses u2
(<0,1,1>_{S1}), a point adjacent to that expressed by
*h*&*r*&*w*. However
~*h*&~*m*&~*a* expresses v8
(<0,0,0>_{S2}), which is not adjacent to v1
(<1,1,1>_{S2}). So now we can construct a simple proof
that the two sentences do not express the same thing.

u1 is adjacent to u2v1 is not adjacent to v8

*therefore*

either u1 is not identical to v1 or u2 is not identical v8.

*therefore*

Eitherh&r&wandh&m&ado not express the same thing, or~

h&r&wand ~h&~m&~ado not express the same thing.

Thus at least one of the two required intertranslatability claims
fails, and *h*-*r*-*w*-ese is not
intertranslatable with *h*-*m*-*a*-ese. The
important point here is that a space of possibilities already comes
with a structure and the points in such a space cannot be
individuated without reference to rest of the space and its
structure. The identity of a possibility is bound up with its
geometrical relations to other possibilities. Different relations,
different possibilities.

This idea meshes well with recent work on conceptual spaces in
Gärdenfors [2000]. Gärdenfors is concerned both with the
semantics and the nature of genuine properties, and his bold and
simple hypothesis is that properties carve out convex regions of an
*n*-dimensional quality space. He supports this hypothesis
with an impressive array of logical, linguistic and empirical data.
(Looking back at our little spaces above it is not hard to see that
the convex regions are those that correspond to the generating (or
atomic) conditions and conjunctions of those. See Oddie 1987a and
Burger and Heidema 1994.) While Gärdenfors is dealing with
properties it is not hard to see that similar considerations apply to
propositions, since propositions can be regarded as 0-ary properties.

Ultimately, however, this response may seem less than entirely
satisfactory by itself. If the choice of a conceptual space is merely
a matter of taste then we may be forced to embrace a radical kind of
incommensurability. Those who talk
*h*-*r*-*w*-ese and conjecture
~*h*&*r*&*w* on the basis of the
available evidence will be close to the truth. Those who talk
*h*-*m*-*a*-ese while exposed to the
“same” circumstances would presumably conjecture
~*h*&~*m*&~*a* on the basis of the
“same” evidence (or the corresponding evidence that they
gather). If in fact *h*&*r*&*w* is the
truth (in *h*-*r*-*w*-ese) then the
*h*-*r*-*w* weather researchers will be close to
the truth. But the *h*-*m*-*a* researchers will
be very far from the truth. This may not be an explicit
contradiction, but it should be worrying. Realists started out with
the ambition of defending a concept of truthlikeness which would
enable them to embrace both fallibilism and optimism. But what they
seem to have ended up with here is something that suggests a rather
unpalatable incommensurability of competing conceptual frameworks. So
it seems that the realist will probably need to affirm that some
conceptual schemes really are better than others. Some do
“carve reality at the joints” and others don't. But is
that something the realist should be reluctant to affirm?

## Bibliography

- Aronson, J., Harre, R., and Way, E.C., 1995,
*Realism Rescued: How Scientific Progress is Possible*, Chicago: Open Court. - Aronson, J., 1997, "Truth, Verisimilitude, and Natural Kinds",
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