Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Thought Experiments

First published Sat Dec 28, 1996; substantive revision Tue Nov 9, 2010

Thought experiments are devices of the imagination used to investigate the nature of things. Thought experimenting often takes place when the method of variation is employed in entertaining imaginative suppositions. They are used for diverse reasons in a variety of areas, including economics, history, mathematics, philosophy, and physics. Most often thought experiments are communicated in narrative form, sometimes through media like a diagram. Thought experiments should be distinguished from thinking about experiments, from merely imagining any experiments to be conducted outside the imagination, and from psychological experiments with thoughts. They should also be distinguished from counterfactual reasoning in general, as they seem to require an experimental element.

The primary philosophical challenge of thought experiments is simple: How can we learn about reality (if we can at all), just by thinking? More precisely, are there thought experiments that enable us to acquire new knowledge about the intended realm of investigation? If so, where does the new information come from if not from direct contact with the realm of investigation under consideration? Finally, how can we distinguish good from bad instances of such thought experiments? These questions seem urgent with respect to scientific thought experiments because most of us “recognize them as an occasionally potent tool for increasing man's understanding of nature.” (Kuhn, 1977, p. 241) The questions are urgent regarding philosophical thought experiments because philosophy without thought experiments seems unthinkable (see e.g., Myers, 1968).

There is widespread agreement that thought experiments play a central role both in philosophy and in the natural sciences and general acceptance of the importance and enormous influence and value of some of the well-known thought experiments in the natural sciences, like Maxwell's demon, Einstein's elevator or Schrödinger's cat. The 17th century saw some of its most brilliant practitioners in Galileo, Descartes, Newton, and Leibniz. And in our own time, the creation of quantum mechanics and relativity are almost unthinkable without the crucial role played by thought experiments. Much of ethics, philosophy of language, and philosophy of mind is based firmly on the results of thought experiments as well, including Searle's Chinese room or Putnam's twin earth. Philosophy, even more than the sciences, would be severely impoverished without thought experiments, which suggests that a unified theory of thought experiments is desirable to account for them in both the sciences and the humanities (see Cooper, 2005, pp. 329–330; Gähde, 2000).

There have been attempts to define “thought experiment”, but likely (contrary to Haggqvist, 2009) it will be better to leave the term loosely characterized, so as not to prejudice the investigation. Many of the most important concepts we deal with are like this, e.g., religion or democracy. A few more examples will circumscribe our subject matter well enough: Newton's bucket, Heisenberg's gamma-ray microscope, Parfit's people who split like an amoeba, Mary the colour scientist, and Thomson's violinist. Everyone is probably familiar with some of these.

In the following we will first highlight some of the most common features of thought experiments. A proposal follows for classifying thought experiments, before reviewing the state of the debate on thought experimenting. We conclude by highlighting some of the recent developments surrounding the “laboratory of the mind,” as some have called it.

1. Common Features of Thought Experiments

Thought experiments are conducted for diverse reasons in a variety of areas, be it in the moral, mathematical, or natural realm (see e.g., for different uses in science De Mey, 2006). We leave aside those that simply entertain. Some thought experiments fulfil a specific function within a theory (see e.g., Boorsboom et al., 2002). Others are executed because it is impossible to run the experimental scenario in the real world (see e.g., Sorensen, 1992, pp. 200–202). Sometimes thought experiments help to illustrate and clarify very abstract states of affairs, thereby accelerating the process of understanding (see e.g., Behmel, 2001). Again others serve as examples in conceptual analysis (see e.g., Cohnitz, 2006). Most attention is received by those that are taken to provide evidence in favour of or against a theory, putting them on a par with real-world experiments (see e.g., Gendler, 2004). The different ways to use thought experiments are, of course, not exclusive.

Theorizing about thought experiments usually turns on the details or the patterns of specific cases. Familiarity with a wide range of examples is crucial for commentators. One of the most beautiful early examples of thought experimenting (in Lucretius, De Rerum Natura 1.951–987; see Bailey, 1950, pp. 58–59) attempts to show that space is infinite: If there is a purported boundary to the universe, we can toss a spear at it. If the spear flies through, it isn't a boundary after all; if the spear bounces back, then there must be something beyond the supposed edge of space, a cosmic wall that stopped the spear, a wall that is itself in space. Either way, there is no edge of the universe; space is infinite.

This example nicely illustrates many of the most common features of thought experimenting: We visualize some situation; we carry out an operation; we see what happens, and we draw a conclusion. It also illustrates their fallibility. Since the time of Lucretius, we've learned how to conceptualize space so that it is both finite and unbounded. Imagine a circle, which is a one dimensional space. As we move around, there is no edge, but it is nevertheless finite. The universe might be a many-dimensional version of it.

Figure 1
Figure 1. “Welcome to the edge of the Universe”

Often a real experiment that is the analogue of a thought experiment is impossible for physical, technological, ethical, or financial reasons (see e.g., Sorensen, 1992, pp. 200–202); but this needn't be a defining condition of thought experiments. The main point is that we seem able to get a grip on nature just by thinking, and therein lies the great interest for philosophy. How is it possible to learn apparently new things about nature without new empirical data?

One possible answer is to claim that we possess a great store of “instinctive knowledge” picked up from experience. This is the solution that Ernst Mach offered (see Mach, 1897 and 1905, for a most instructive assessment of his views see Kühne, 2006, pp. 165–202; Sorensen, 1992, pp. 51–75). One of Mach's favourite examples of thought experimenting is due to Simon Stevin (see Mach, 1883, pp. 48–58). When a chain is draped over a double frictionless plane, as in Fig. 2a, how will it move? Add some links as in Fig. 2b. Now it is obvious. The initial setup must have been in static equilibrium. Otherwise, we would have a perpetual motion machine; and according to our experience-based “instinctive knowledge”, says Mach, this is impossible. We do not have to perform the experiment in the real world. The outcome seems compelling.

Figure 2a Figure 2b
Figure 2(a) and 2(b) “How will it move?”

Judith Thomson provided one of the most striking and effective thought experiments in the moral realm (see Thomson, 1971). Her example is aimed at a popular anti-abortion argument that goes something like this: The foetus is an innocent person with a right to life. Abortion results in the death of a foetus. Therefore, abortion is morally wrong. In her thought experiment we are asked to imagine a famous violinist falling into a coma. The society of music lovers determines from medical records that you and you alone can save the violinist's life by being hooked up to him for nine months. The music lovers break into your home while you are asleep and hook the unconscious (and unknowing, hence innocent) violinist to you. You may want to unhook him, but you are then faced with this argument put forward by the music lovers: The violinist is an innocent person with a right to life. Unhooking him will result in his death. Therefore, unhooking him is morally wrong.

However, the argument, even though it has the same structure as the anti-abortion argument, does not seem convincing in this case. You would be very generous to remain attached and in bed for nine months, but you are not morally obliged to do so. The parallel with the abortion case is evident. Thomson's thought experiment is effective in distinguishing two concepts that had previously been run together: “right to life” and “right to what is needed to sustain life.” The foetus and the violinist may each have the former, but it is not evident that either has the latter. The upshot is that even if the foetus has a right to life (which Thomson does not believe but allows for the sake of the argument), it may still be morally permissible to abort.

Those opposed to Thomson's view can either dismiss her thought experiment as useless fiction or provide a different version of the same scenario to challenge the conclusion. It is a very intriguing feature of thought experiments that they can be “rethought” (Bokulich, 2001). Thought experiments can evolve and undergo modifications over time. This raises the interesting question of what it is that preserves the identity of a thought experiment (see e.g., Bishop, 1999). That thought experiments can be rethought coheres with another feature of thought experiments, namely that they have “evidential significance only historically and locally, i.e. when and where premises that attribute evidential significance to it […] are endorsed.” (McAllister, 1996, p. 248) .

2. Types of Thought Experiments: A Taxonomy

The simplest taxonomy for thought experiments is to classify them according to their use. But, of course, there are many other ways of classifying thought experiments: science vs philosophy, normative (moral or epistemic) vs factual, and so on. We will present a preliminary taxonomy (see Brown, 1986, pp. 4–11). It is not only rough but also limited, because it only considers the class of those thought experiments that are taken to function in theory choice. The main division is constructive vs destructive, that is, a thought experiment might be used positively to establish a theory or it might be used negatively to undermine a theory. Each of these is subject to further divisions.

As for the type of destructive thought experiments, the following subtypes could be identified: The simplest of these is to draw out a contradiction in a theory, thereby refuting it. The first part of Galileo's famous falling bodies example does this, as it shows that in Aristotle's account, a composite body (cannon ball and musket ball attached) would have to fall both faster and slower than the cannon ball alone. A second subtype is constituted by those thought experiments that aim to show that the theory in question is in conflict with other beliefs that we hold. Schrödinger's well-known cat paradox, for instance, does not show that quantum theory (as interpreted by Bohr) is internally inconsistent (see Schrödinger 1935, p. 812; translation: Trimmer, 1980, 328): “A cat is penned up in a steel chamber, along with the following diabolical device (which must be secured against direct interference by the cat): in a Geiger counter there is a tiny bit of radioactive substance, so small, that perhaps in the course of one hour one of the atoms decays, but also, with equal probability, perhaps none; if it happens, the counter tube discharges and through a relay releases a hammer which shatters a small flask of hydrocyanic acid. If one has left this entire system to itself for an hour, one would say that the cat still lives if meanwhile no atom has decayed. The first atomic decay would have poisoned it. The q-function of the entire system would express this by having in it the living and the dead cat (pardon the expression) mixed or smeared out in equal parts.” This thought experiment shows that quantum theory (as interpreted by Bohr) is in conflict with some very powerful common sense beliefs we have about macro-sized objects such as cats -- they cannot be both dead and alive in any sense whatsoever. The bizarreness of superpositions in the atomic world is worrisome enough, says Schrödinger, but when it implies that same bizarreness at an everyday level, it is intolerable.

There is a third subtype of negative thought experiments, namely when, in effect, a central assumption or premiss of the thought experiment itself is undermined. For example, as we have seen above, Thomson showed with her thought experiment that “right to life” and “right to what is needed to sustain life” had been run together. When distinguished, the argument against abortion is negatively affected. A fourth sub-type of negative thought experiments are “counter thought experiments” (Brown, 2007a) or “thought-experiment/anti-thought-experiment pairs” (Norton, 2004, pp. 45–49). Above, we have already encountered this subtype in our discussion of Lucretius' spear-thought experiment. Here we would like to add two more examples (Brown, 2007, pp. 162–169): Mach produced a counter thought experiment against Isaac Newton, and Daniel C. Dennett produced another against Frank Jackson. In his Principia Mathematica Newton offered a pair of thought experiments as evidence for absolute space. One was the bucket with water climbing the wall, the other was a pair of spheres joined by a cord that maintained its tension in otherwise empty space. The explanation for these phenomena, said Newton, is absolute space: the bucket and the joined spheres are rotating with respect to space itself. In response, Mach claimed that, contra Newton, the two spheres would move toward one another thanks to the tension in the cord, and if we rotated a very thick, massive ring around a stationary bucket, we would see the water climb the bucket wall (see for further discussion of Mach's counter thought experiment to Newton: Kühne, 2006, pp. 191–202). In short, he described the phenomena of the thought experiments' scenarios differently, that is, he declared that different things would happen. Mach's counter thought experiment undermines our confidence in Newton's. Absolute space explained the phenomena in Newton's thought experiments, but now we're not so sure of the phenomena itself (at least, this is Mach's intent).

Figure 3
Figure 3. Stages in the bucket experiment

Figure 4
Figure 4. Two spheres held by a cord in otherwise empty space

Frank Jackson created a much discussed thought experiment that aimed to show that physicalism is false. This is the doctrine that all facts are physical facts. In the thought experiment, Mary is a brilliant scientist who, from birth, is confined to a laboratory with only black and white experiences. She learns all the physical facts about perception there. One day, she leaves the laboratory and experiences colours for the first time; she learns what it's like to experience red. Clearly, says Jackson, she learns something new. Since she already knew all the physical facts, she must have learned something non-physical when she experienced colour. Thus, physicalism must be wrong.

Dennett replied to this thought experiment with one of his own. It begins like Jackson's, but when Mary has her first experiences outside the lab, she says “Ah, colour perception is just as I thought it would be.” Like Mach, Dennett denies the phenomenon of the original thought experiment, that Mary would be learning something new. And like Mach, his counter thought experiment is effective in undermining Jackson's in so far as it seems similarly plausible.

To be effective, “counter thought experiments” needn't be very plausible at all. In a court of law, the jury will convict provided guilt is established “beyond a reasonable doubt.” A common defence strategy is to provide an alternative account of the evidence that has just enough plausibility to put the prosecution's case into some measure of doubt. That is sufficient to undermine it. A good “counter thought experiment” need only do that much to be effective.

As for the second type of thought experiments, there are many ways they could provide positive support for a theory. One of these is to provide a kind of illustration that makes a theory's claims clear and evident. In such cases thought experiments serve as a kind of heuristic aid. A result may already be well established, but the thought experiment can lead to a very satisfying sense of understanding. In his Principia Mathematica Newton provided a wonderful example showing how the moon is kept in its orbit in just the same way as an object falls to the earth (see Ducheyne, 2006, pp. 435–437). He illustrated this by means of a cannon shooting a cannon ball further and further. In the limit, the earth curves away as fast as the ball falls, with the eventual result being that the cannon ball will return to the spot where it was fired, and, if not impeded, will go around again and again. This is what the moon is doing. We could arrive at the same conclusion through calculation. But Newton's thought experiment provides that illusive understanding. It's a wonderful example of the “aha effect.”

Figure 5
Figure 5. “The shot heard around the world”

Thomson's violinist showed that abortion could be morally permissible even when the foetus has a right to life. Similarly, Einstein's elevator showed that light will bend in a gravitational field: According to the principle of equivalence, there is no difference between frames of reference; whether they are inertial or not, the laws of physics are the same in all. Suppose then, an observer is inside an elevator sealed off from the outside so that the observer cannot tell whether he is in a gravitational field or accelerating. If it were accelerating, and if a light beam were to enter one side, then, due to the elevator's motion, the beam would appear to drop or curve down as it crossed the elevator. Consequently, it would have to do the same thing if the elevator was not accelerating, but was in a gravitational field. Therefore, gravity 'bends' light. Maxwell's demon showed that entropy could be decreased: The second law of thermodynamics implies that heat won't pass from a cold body to a hot one. In classical thermodynamics this law is quite strict; but in Maxwell's kinetic theory of heat there is a probability, though extremely small, of such an event happening. Some thought this a reductio ad absurdum of Maxwell's theory. To show how it is logically possible to violate the second law Maxwell imagined a tiny creature who controls a door between two chambers. Fast molecules from the cold box are let into the hot box, and slow molecules from the hot are allowed into the cold. Thus, there will be an increase in the average speed in the hot box and a decrease in the average speed of molecules in the cold. Since, on Maxwell's theory, heat is just average speed of the molecules, there has been a flow of heat from a cold body to a hot one. Parfit's splitting persons showed that survival is a more important notion than identity when considering personhood (for a critical discussion see Gendler, 2002). We say they “showed” such and such, but, “purport to show” might be better, since some of these thought experiments are quite contentious. What they have in common is that they aim to establish something positive. Unlike destructive thought experiments, they are not trying to demolish an existing theory, though they may do that in passing. In principle: Given the fact that thought experiments can be rethought (Bokulich, 2001), and that the evidential significance is dependent on historical and local accomplishments (McAllister, 1996), it cannot be irrelevant to identify the intention of the thought experimenter, if one wants to determine the type of a thought experiment: “An imaginary experiment should be judged on its specific purpose.” (Krimsky, 1973, p. 331)

3. The Debate Over Thought Experiments

3.1 Some Historical Background

Arguably since the time of the Pre-Socratics thought experimenting has been practiced: “It is they […] who invented thought experimentation as a cognitive procedure and practiced it with great dedication and versatility.” (Rescher, 2005, p. 2; see also Diamond, 2002, pp. 229–232; Glas, 1999, Ierodiakonou, 2005; Irvine, 1991; Rescher, 1991 and 2005, pp. 61–72)). It seems that medieval science relied rather on thought experiments than real-world experiments (King, 1991). The 17th century saw some of its most brilliant practitioners in Galileo, Descartes, Newton, and Leibniz (see Brown, 1986; Ducheyne, 2006; Gendler, 1998; Koyré, 1968; Kuhn, 1964, 246–252; McAllister, 1996 and 2005; McMullin, 1985; Palmieri, 2003 and 2005; Prudovsky, 1989). And in our own time, the creation of quantum mechanics (see Kühne, 2005, pp. 280–317; Popper, 1959; Stöltzner, 2003; Van Dyck, 2003; Yourgau, 1967) and relativity (see Brown, 1987; Kassung, 2004; Kühne, 2005, pp. 227–279; Norton, 1991 and 1993) are almost unthinkable without the crucial function of thought experiments.

“Thought experiments” derived from the German “Gedankenexperimente”. It is common to claim Mach as the father of “Gedankenexperimente”. “This view is incorrect, however! […] it can be substantiated that it was used […] already in 1811.” (Witt-Hansen, 1976, p. 48; see also Buzzoni, 2008, pp. 14–15; 61–65; Cohnitz, 2008; Kühne, 2005, pp. 92–224; Moue et al., 2006, p. 63). And before thought experimentation was introduced by word, we find already in the work of the physicist and philosopher Georg Lichtenberg (1742–1799) substantial meta-philosophical reflections on Gedankenexperimente. Lichtenberg considers them as one way to do philosophy in a different way than Christian Wolff who made an impact through a text-book style philosophy in 18th century Germany. (See Schildknecht, 1990, pp. 21; 123–169).

The history of the philosophical investigation into thought experiments can be divided into four stages: In the 18th and 19th century the awareness of the importance of thought experiments in philosophy and science emerges. Special mention should be made of Georg Lichtenberg and Hans-Christian Ørsted. The topic reemerges in a more systematic manner at the beginning of the 20th century with little relation to the attempts made at the first stage. The stakeholders of the second stage were Pierre Duhem, Mach, and Alexius Meinong. (see Duhem, 1913, pp. 304–311; Mach, 1883, pp. 48–58, 1897 and 1905; Meinong, 1907) A third stage, probably due to the rediscovery of the importance of scientific practice for a proper understanding of science, followed in the first part of the second half of the 20th century. Again, the contributions of this stage bear little relation to the two previous stages. While the third period has seen a number of noteworthy contributions (Cole, 1983; Dancy, 1985; Dennett, 1985; Fodor, 1964; Helm; Gilbert, 1985; Helm et al., 1985; Krimsky, 1973; McMullin, 1985; Myers, 1986; Poser, 1984; Prudovsky, 1989; Rehder, 1980a,b; Yourgau, 1962 and 1967), the protagonists of this period were Alexandre Koyré, Thomas S. Kuhn and Karl Popper. The ongoing philosophical exploration of thought experiments began in the 1980s, and marks the fourth stage. Arguably, it has been the most prolific one of all four stages. With some very important sign-postings (Horowitz; Massey (eds.), 1991; Sorensen, 1992a, b, c; Wilkes, 1988) the ongoing discussion took off after 1991. James R. Brown and John D. Norton (see for a concise statement of each position Brown, 2004a; Norton, 2004) have carried on a debate that other find useful, especially to contrast with their own alternative accounts. “The views of Brown and Norton represent the extremes of platonic rationalism and classic empiricism, respectively.” (Moue et al., 2006, p. 69) They will be described below.

3.2 Systematic Exploration

Not all of the rapidly growing contributions address what we deem to be the primal philosophical challenge of thought experimenting. Still, an astonishing array of different types of views in response to this challenge has already become manifest. We cannot discuss here all the authors who are representative for each type of view which we have identified: the skeptical objection, the intuition based account, the argument view, conceptual constructivism, experimentalism, and the mental model account. We begin with the skeptical objection. Of course, particular thought experiments have been contested. But for the most part, thought experimenting in the sciences has been cheerfully accepted. Duhem, the great historian of physics, is almost alone in what has been understood as an outright condemnation of scientific thought experiments (see Duhem, 1913, pp. 304–311). A thought experiment is no substitute for a real experiment, he claimed, and should be forbidden in science, including science education. However, in view of the important role of actual thought experiments in the history of physics — from Galileo's falling bodies, to Newton's bucket, to Einstein's elevator — it is unlikely that anyone will feel or should feel much sympathy for Duhem's strictures.

Philosophers can be as critical as Duhem when it comes to thought experimenting in their own field (see Peijnenburg; Atkinson, 2003). Few are outright skeptics, however. Many take a rather ambiguous stance. Soren Haggqvist, for example, has developed a model for philosophical thought experiments (Haggqvist, 1996 and 2009). Surprisingly, he does not identify a single successful example of the commonly accepted philosophical thought experiments that satisfies his model. And the process of identification is only the first step in addressing what we consider to be the primal philosophical challenge of thought experiments. It gets much more messy once the worry is addressed — how reliable are they? There is some justice in worrying about the reliability of philosophical thought experiments (see. e.g., Klee, 2008) This seems true for ethics (see Dancy, 1985, Jackson, 1992), conceptual analysis (see Fodor, 1964), or philosophy of mind: “A popular strategy in philosophy is to construct a certain sort of thought experiment I call intuition pump. […] intuition pumps are often abused, though seldom deliberately.” (Dennett, 1985, p. 12) Frequently discussed is the skeptical challenge by Kathleen Wilkes. Wilkes, 1988, expresses a deep suspicion about scenarios like Derek Parfit's people splitting like an amoeba (see Parfit, 1987, Gendler 2002). She wants philosophy “to use science fact rather than science fiction or fantasy” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 1), and therefore to refrain from using thought experiments because they are “both problematic and positively misleading” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 2). She claims that thought experiments about personal identity in particular often fail to provide the background conditions against which the experiment is set (cf. Wilkes, 1988, p. 7). We do agree with Wilkes that underdetermination can be a problem. But instead of dismissing thought experiments in philosophy we should consider it a crucial factor in assessing the quality of a thought experiment. (see Rescher, 2005, pp. 9–14). The more detailed the imaginary scenario in the relevant aspects, the better the thought experiment (Brendel, 2004, 97–99; Haggqvist, 1996, p. 28).

We agree that the inferences drawn in thought experimenting are highly problematic if the hypothetical scenario “is inadequately described” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 8). But Wilkes seems to think that the lack of description is unavoidable, which supposedly amounts to a reason against philosophical thought experimenting on personal identity because persons are not natural kinds. This makes it impossible to fill in necessary information to make the thought experiment work given its unavoidable underdetermination. Wilkes thinks that “whenever we are examining the ranges of concepts that do not pick on natural kinds, the problem of deciding what is or what is not ‘relevant’ to the success of the thought experiment is yet more problematic than the same question as it arises in science; and, unlike the scientific problem, it may not even have an answer in principle.” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 15) She adds that scientific laws — especially those describing biological kinds like human beings — “are not disjoint and independent, detachable from one another […]. They are interrelated, to varying degrees of course” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 29) in many ways. This implies, for example, that “a full psychophysiological account of the processes of human perception must at some stage link up with part at least of linguistic ability; for we very typically see things under a certain description, and that description may be a very sophisticated one.” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 29) These considerations have her rule out experiments that challenge the human monopoly of personhood. No thought experiment, claims Wilkes, is well conceived if it involves non-human animals or computers as persons. But also those thought experiments can be ruled out which involve the “fission or fusion of humans” because it is not theoretically possible. “The total impact of the sum of laws that group us together as human beings (a natural kind category) precludes our splitting into two […] or fusing with someone else” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 36).

One can ascertain here all too well the inherent difficulties in thinking about personal identity and the limited benefit some thought experiments might have for what is deemed the proper metaphysics of personal identity. Nevertheless, good reasons have been given in favour of the use of thought experiments about personal identity (Beck, 2006; Kolak, 1993; Hershenov, 2008). We feel that the problems about thought experiments on personal identity reveal more about the intricate nature of the subject than about the usefulness of philosophical thought experiments. And, disregarding other shortcomings in Wilkes' skepticism (for further discussion of Wilkes' views see Beck, 1992; Brooks, 1994; Focquaert, 2003; Haggqvist, 1996, pp. 27–34), her suggestion that thought experiment's scenarios would have to satisfy current scientific knowledge about the relevant entities featured in a thought experiment is highly implausible. We learn a great deal about the world and our theories when we wonder, for instance, what would have happened after the big bang, if the law of gravity had been an inverse cube law instead of an inverse square. Would stars have failed to form? Reasoning about such a scenario is perfectly coherent and very instructive, even though it violates a law of nature.

To some extent we should share Wilkes's concern that thought experimenting seems to be constrained only by relevant logical impossibilities and what seems intuitively acceptable. This is indeed problematic because intuitions can be highly misleading and relevant logical impossibilities fairly ungrounded if they cannot be supplemented by relevant theoretical impossibilities based on current science in order to avoid the irrational jump into fantasies. But in order to dismiss thought experimenting as a useful philosophical tool one has to show that intuition cannot be a source of knowledge and that an epistemic tool should be useless because there is a serious chance it can fail. Timothy Williamson has argued that we should forget about intuition as a cushion in the philosophical armchair. (Williamson, 2004a,b, 2008, pp. 179–207, and 2009). The importance of intuitions in philosophy has been neglected in the past (see Williamson, 2004b, p. 109–110), and only recently intuition received some of the attention it deserves (see e.g., DePaul; Ramsey (eds.), 1998). Besides the traditional divide between empiricists, rationalists and skeptics, it is not only a very non-uniform use of the word “intuition” that makes it difficult to assess the progress of the last years of philosophical inquiry about intuitions. The situation has been complicated by the contributions of experimental philosophy on intuitions, adding to questioning of their reliability. Generally speaking, the reliability of intuitions has been challenged on two grounds. One stems from an evolutionary explanation of the capacity to intuit; another emerged due to experiments which supposedly show the cultural relativity of intuitions.

The current discussion of intuitions has barely made an impact on philosophical reflections about thought experiments. As far as philosophical thought experiments are concerned, this is as it should be, according to Williamson. In this respect George Bealer can be cited in support of Williamson, because for Bealer the talk about philosophical thought experiments reveals a conceptual confusion. Philosophy, he claims, is about “rational intuitions” and thought experiments can be only about “physical intuitions” (see Bealer, 1998, pp. 207–208, and 2002, p. 74). To many, this is as implausible as are some other elements of his “phenomenology of intuitions”, like the strict separation of “rational intuitions” from “physical intuitions”, or the immutability of “rational intuitions”. There are good reasons to believe that thought experiments appeal to intuitions in order to give us new insights about different realms of investigation, including philosophy. This kind of positive connection is what Williamson has in mind when addressing the role of intuitions in philosophical thought experiments like the famous Gettier cases, which overnight found acceptance by the philosophical community in their aim to refute the view that knowledge is justified true belief. While Williamson expects “armchair methods to play legitimately a more dominant role in future philosophy” (Williamson, 2009, p. 126), he thinks that “we should stop talking about intuition.” (Williamson, 2004b, p. 152). This does not impress proponents of what we call an intuition-based account of thought experiments, and probably for good reasons (see Ichikawa; Jarvis, 2009).

The intuition-based account of thought experimenting comes in a naturalistic version (Brendel, 2004; Gendler, 2007; Fehige 2009 and forthcoming), and in the form of Brown's Platonism (Brown, 1986, 1987, 1991a, 1991b, 1993, 2004a,b, 2005, 2007a,b,c). Brown holds that in a few special cases we do go well beyond the old data to acquire a priori knowledge of nature (see also Koyré, 1968). Galileo showed that all bodies fall at the same speed with a brilliant thought experiment that started by destroying the then reigning Aristotelian account. The latter holds that heavy bodies fall faster than light ones (H > L). But consider (Figure 6), in which a heavy cannon ball (H) and light musket ball (L) are attached together to form a compound object (H+L); the latter must fall faster than the cannon ball alone. Yet the compound object must also fall slower, since the light part will act as a drag on the heavy part. Now we have a contradiction. (H+L > H and H > H+L) That's the end of Aristotle's theory. But there is a bonus, since the right account is now obvious: they all fall at the same speed (H = L = H+L).

Figure 6
Figure 6. Galileo: “I don't even have to look”

This could be said to be a priori (though still fallible) knowledge of nature, since there are no new data involved, nor is the conclusion derived from old data, nor is it some sort of logical truth. This account of thought experiments can be further developed by linking the a priori epistemology to recent accounts of laws of nature that hold that laws are relations among objectively existing abstract entities. It is thus a rather Platonic view, not unlike Platonic accounts of mathematics such as that urged by Kurt Gödel.

The two most often repeated arguments against Brown's Platonism are: it does not identify criteria to tell apart good and bad thought experiments, and violates the principle of ontological parsimony. These are poor objections, and most probably find widespread acceptance because Platonism seems to be unfathomable these days, given the general popularity of various forms of naturalism. If intuitions really do the job in a thought experiment, the first objection is weak because neither rationalists nor empiricists have a theory about the reliability of intuitions. So the objection should be that intuitions probably just do not matter in human cognition. However, there are good reasons to reject the argument (see Myers, 2004).

As for the second objection, the appeal to Occam's razor is in general problematic when it is employed to rule out a theory. Whatever we eliminate by employing the principle of parsimony we can easily reintroduce by an inference to the best explanation (see Meixner, 2000). And this is exactly what a Platonist contends his or her Platonism about thought experimenting to be, while conceding that the Platonic intuition appears miraculous. But are they really more miraculous than sense perception, which seems similar in many respects to Platonic intuition? One might want to say yes, because supposedly we have no clue at all how Platonic intuition works but we do have some idea about the nature of sense perception. We know that if an object is far away it appears smaller in vision, and under certain light conditions the same object can look very differently. We wonder if it is really true that it is impossible to state similar rules to capture the nature of Platonic intuition? If you are drunk or lack attention you most probably will not be very successful in intuiting anything that makes sense.

A review of the relevant psychological literature will reveal further criteria that could be employed to identify good and bad conditions for Platonic intuition while thought experimenting. Yet, proponents of the naturalistic version of the intuition based account wonder how necessary Platonism is once this move is entertained in defence of the reliability of intuitions (see Miščević, 2004).

Norton can be cited in support of Williamson as he thinks that his approach offers sufficient reason to dismiss not only Platonism but any intuition based account altogether (Norton, 1991, 1993, 1996, 2004a,b, 2008). Norton is the most important defender of what we call the argument view about thought experiments. Surprisingly, Norton has not many more followers than Brown, even though the argument view seems to be the natural option for a debate that has many empiricists among its participants. Most empiricists find Norton's argument view too strong, only few still too weak (e.g., Bunzl, 1996).

Norton claims that any thought experiment is really a (possibly disguised) argument; it starts with premises grounded in experience and follows deductive or inductive rules of inference in arriving at its conclusion. The picturesque features of any thought experiment which give it an experimental flavour might be psychologically helpful, but are strictly redundant. Thus, says Norton, we never go beyond the empirical premises in a way to which any empiricist would object. There are three objections that might be offered against Norton. First, his notion of argument is too vague. However, this is not a good objection: arguments can be deductive (which are perfectly clear) or inductive. If the latter are unclear, the fault is with induction, not with Norton's argument view. Second, it is argued that Norton simply begs the question: every real world experiment can be rephrased as an argument, but nobody would say that they are dispensable. The account does not address the question: Where do the premises come from? A thought experiment might be an essential step in making the Norton-style reconstruction. Third, a thought experiment that is presented in argument form loses its typical force. The soft-point in Brown's Platonism is linked to the strength of Norton's account because he [Norton] claims that any other view implies a commitment to “asking the oracle.” “Imagine an oracle that claims mysterious powers but never delivers predictions that could not be learned by simple inferences from ordinary experience. We would not believe that the oracle had any mysterious powers. I propose the same verdict for thought experiments in science.” (Norton, 1996, pp. 1142–1143) Defenders of empiricist alternatives deny this dispensability thesis.

Among these empiricist alternatives is what we could call conceptual constructivism, taken up recently by Van Dyck (2003), to account for Heisenberg's ɣ-ray microscope, and by Gendler (1998, pp. 415-420), in navigating middle ground between the views of Norton and Brown. The view was first proposed by Kuhn (1964). He employs many of the concepts (but not the terminology) of his well-known structure of scientific revolutions. On his view a well-conceived thought experiment can bring on a crisis or at least create an anomaly in the reigning theory and so contribute to paradigm change. Thought experiments can teach us something new about the world, even though we have no new empirical data, by helping us to re-conceptualize the world in a better way.

Next we have what we might term experimentalism, encompassing a wide range of different approaches which all assume that thought experiments are a “limiting case” of ordinary experiments. Experimentalism was proposed first by Mach, 1897 and 1905. He defines experimenting in terms of its basic method of variation and its capacity to destroy prejudices about nature. According to Mach, experimenting is innate to higher animals, including humans. The thought experiment just happens on a higher intellectual level but is basically still an experiment. At the centre of thought experimenting is a “Gedankenerfahrung”, an experience in thought. Such an experience is possible because in thought experimenting we draw from “unwillkürliche Abbildung von Tatsachen”, uncontrollable images of facts — acquired in past experiences with the world. Thought experiments help to prepare real world experiments. Some of them are so convincing in their results that an execution seems unnecessary; others could be conducted in a real-world experiment, which is the most natural trajectory of a scientific thought experiment. In any case thought experiments can result in a revision of belief, thereby demonstrating their significance for scientific progress. Mach also appreciates the didactic value of thought experiments: they help us to realize what can be accomplished in thinking and what can not.

In the spirit of Mach, Roy A. Sorensen has offered a very aspiring version of experimentalism that accounts for thought experiments in science and philosophy, and tackles many of the central issues of the topic. Sorensen, 1992, claims thought experiments to be “a subset of unexecuted experiments” (p. 213). By their logical nature they are paradoxes that aim to test modal consequences of propositions. The origin of thought experimenting is explained in terms of Darwinian evolution (like in Genz, 1999, pp. 25–29), though the explanation has been criticized to be only “little more than a ‘just so story’ that fails on a posteriori grounds to epistemically underwrite the capacity” for thought experimenting (see Maffie, 1997).

Experimentalism does not have to take a naturalistic turn as it does in Sorensen's case. In a number of contributions (Buzzoni, 2004, 2007, 2008) Marco Buzzoni has defended a form of experimentalism that still struggles with its Kantian underpinnings (Buzzoni forthcoming). Buzzoni (2008) argues for the dialectical unity of thought experiments and real-world experiments. Thought experiments and real-world experiments are claimed to be identical on the “technological-operational” level and unproductive for scientific purposes without each other: without thought experiments there wouldn't be real-world experiments because we would not know how to put questions to nature; without real-world experiments there wouldn't be answers to these questions. Given the many scientific thought experiments that cannot be realized in the real-world, Buzzoni might be conflating thought experiments with imagined experiments to be carried out in the real-world.

This brings us to the mental model account of thought experimenting (Andreas, forthcoming; Bishop, 1998; Cooper, 2005; Gendler, 2004; Palmieri, 2003; Nersessian, 1992, 1993, 2007; McMullin, 1985; Miščević, 1992, 2007). In thought experimenting, according to champions of this view, we manipulate a mental model instead of a physical model. As the model is non-propositional, it is most often communicated by means of a polished narrative which functions as a kind of user-manual for building the model. This approach could become the most prolific because it does not seem to be much of a stretch to draw connections to the intuition based account and to relate to the bodily component of experimenting (Gooding, 1993).

Furthermore, first attempts have been made to place “literary fiction on the level of thought experiments” (Swirski, 2007, p. 6; see also Davies, 2007; Macho; Wunschel (eds.), 2004). The issue here “is not whether but how the arts function cognitively.” (Elgin, 1993, p. 14) This kind of analysis helps “to observe how the narrative aspect of thought experiments have implications for the process whereby one version of a thought experiment can spawn another” (Souder, 2003, pp. 208–209). The narrative of a thought experiment is not the thought experiment but seems to be more than just the indispensable medium of communication. The missing link could be mental modelling because “more than one instantiation or realization of a situation described in the narrative is possible. The constructed model need only be of the same kind with respect to salient dimensions of target phenomena” (Nersessian, 2007, p. 148).

4. Recent Developments

Noteworthy contributions have been made exploring the importance of thought experiments in disciplines other than mathematics, philosophy, or physics. They include history (Tetlock et al. (eds.), 2009, pp. 14–44; Rescher, 2003, pp. 238–238, and 2005, pp. 36–46; Reiss, 2009; Weber; De Mey, 2003), the social sciences (Belkin; Tetlock (eds.), 1996; Roberts, 1993; Ylikoski, 2003), and revealed theology (Fehige, 2009 and forthcoming).

Tentative steps have been undertaken to relate more general epistemological topics to the primal challenge of thought experiments. As we have seen this is true for intuitions. To name another example: Conceivability and Possibility (edited by T. S. Gendler and J. Hawthorne, Oxford: Oxford University Press) includes a number of contributions that note the relevance of the discussed topic to thought experiments. According to Bealer thought experiments seem to involve a conceivability that is too weak to provide reliable possibilities because they only exploit “physical intuitions” (p. 74). David Chalmers thinks that good thought experiments can be a guide to possibilities if the entailments of conceivability and possibility that he defends are sound (p. 153). Alan Sidelle's discussion of the metaphysical contingency of the laws of nature explicitly refers to the “importance of traditional imagining, conceiving, and thought experiment to modal inquiry” (p. 310), and can be read as a challenge to any claim that thought experiments would reveal anything more than a “necessity based in analyticity” (p. 329).

There is also an interesting, but relatively unexplored issue concerning the relative importance of thought experiments in different disciplines. Physics and philosophy use them extensively. Chemistry, by contrast, has none of note at all. Why is this the case? Perhaps it is merely an historical accident that chemists never developed a culture of doing thought experiments. Perhaps it is tied to some deep feature of the discipline itself (see Snooks, 2006). Economics and history use thought experiments, but apparently not anthropology. A good explanation would likely tell us a lot about the structure of the discipline itself.

Finally, since the interest in simulation is growing among philosophers of science, the relationship between computer simulation and thought experiments has started to attract attention: Behmel, 2001, pp. 98–108; Di Paolo et al., 2000; Lenard forthcoming; Stäudner, 1998. The issue here is whether computer simulations are thought experiments. This is rather unlikely because thought experiments and computer simulations seem to involve different kinds of simulation and have different aims. Still, their relationship is certainly of interest to anyone working on thought experiments, especially if it is true that computer simulations are the new way of doing science that is on a par with science by classical real world experiments (see Morrison, 2009).


The number of papers, anthologies, and monographs has been growing immensely since the beginning of the 1990s. Therefore, it might be useful to highlight that in existing literature Kühne, 2006, is the most substantial study on the exploration of thought experiments since Kant; Sorensen, 1992, is the most extensive philosophical study of thought experiments. More than other monographs (see Behmel, 2001; Buschlinger, 1993; Brown, 1991a; Buzzoni, 2008; Cohnitz, 2006; Haggqvist, 1996; Rescher, 2005; Swirski, 2007), both studies well exceed the author's own systematic contribution to what we consider to be the primal philosophical challenge of thought experimentation. Also, this bibliography does not include the many (we count about eight) popular books on thought experiments (like Wittgenstein's Beetle and Other Classical Thought Experiments by Martin Cohen); nor do we list fiction that is related to the subject (like “The End of Mr. Y” by Scarlett Thomas). Further, for undergraduate teaching purposes one might want to consider Doing Philosophy: An Introduction Through Thought Experiments (edited by Theodore Schick, Jr. and Lewis Vaughn, fourth edition, 2010, Boston: McGraw Hill Higher Education). Finally, it is noteworthy that a number of philosophical journals have dedicated part or all of an issue to the topic of thought experiments, including the Croatian Journal of Philosophy (19/VII), Deutsche Zeitschrift für Philosophie (1/59), Informal Logic (3/17), and Philosophica (1/72).

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Descartes, René | Galileo Galilei | intuition | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Mach, Ernst | moral psychology: empirical approaches | Platonism: in metaphysics | rationalism vs. empiricism


The editors would like to thank Gintautas Miliauskas (Vilnius University) for notifying us of a variety of typographical errors in this entry.