# The Role of Decoherence in Quantum Mechanics

*First published Mon Nov 3, 2003; substantive revision Thu Aug 23, 2007*

Interference phenomena are a well-known and crucial feature of quantum
mechanics, the two-slit experiment providing a standard example. There
are situations, however, in which interference effects are
(artificially or spontaneously) suppressed. We shall need to make
precise what this means, but the *theory of decoherence* is the
study of (spontaneous) interactions between a system and its
environment that lead to such suppression of interference. This study
includes detailed modelling of system-environment interactions,
derivation of equations (‘master equations’) for the
(reduced) state of the system, discussion of time-scales etc. A
discussion of the concept of suppression of interference and a
simplified survey of the theory is given in
Section 2, emphasising features that will be
relevant to the following discussion (and restricted to standard
non-relativistic particle quantum
mechanics^{.[1]}
A partially overlapping field is that of *decoherent
histories*, which proceeds from an abstract definition of loss of
interference, but which we shall not be considering in any detail.

Decoherence is relevant (or is claimed to be relevant) to a variety of questions ranging from the measurement problem to the arrow of time, and in particular to the question of whether and how the ‘classical world’ may emerge from quantum mechanics. This entry mainly deals with the role of decoherence in relation to the main problems and approaches in the foundations of quantum mechanics. Section 3 analyses the claim that decoherence solves the measurement problem, as well as the broadening of the problem through the inclusion of environmental interactions, the idea of emergence of classicality, and the motivation for discussing decoherence together with approaches to the foundations of quantum mechanics. Section 4 then reviews the relation of decoherence with some of the main foundational approaches. Finally, in Section 5 we mention suggested applications that would push the role of decoherence even further.

Suppression of interference has of course featured in many papers
since the beginning of quantum mechanics, such as Mott's (1929)
analysis of alpha-particle tracks. The modern beginnings of
decoherence as a subject in its own right are arguably the papers by
H. D. Zeh of the early 1970s (Zeh 1970; 1973). Very well known are
also the papers by W. Zurek from the early 1980s (Zurek 1981;
1982). Some of these earlier examples of decoherence (e.g., suppression
of interference between left-handed and right-handed states of a
molecule) are mathematically more accessible than more recent ones. A
concise and readable introduction to the theory is provided by Zurek
in *Physics Today* (1991). This article was followed
by publication of several letters with Zurek's replies (1993), which
highlight controversial issues. More recent surveys are Zeh 1995,
which devotes much space to the interpretation of decoherence, and
Zurek 2003. The textbook on decoherence by Giulini
*et al.* (1996) and the very recent book by Schlosshauer (2007) are also highly
recommended.^{[2]}

## 2. Basics of Decoherence

### 2.1 Interference and suppression of interference

The two-slit experiment is a paradigm example of an
*interference* experiment. One repeatedly sends electrons or
other particles through a screen with two narrow slits, the electrons
impinge upon a second screen, and we ask for the probability
distribution of detections over the surface of the screen. In order to
calculate this, one cannot just take the probabilities of passage
through the slits, multiply with the probabilities of detection at the
screen conditional on passage through either slit, and sum over the
contributions of the two
slits.^{[3]}
There is an additional so-called interference term in the correct
expression for the probability, and this term depends on *both*
wave components that pass through the slits.

Thus, the experiment shows that the correct description of the
electron in terms of quantum wave functions is indeed one in which the
wave passes through both slits. The quantum state of the electron is
not given by a wave that passes through the upper slit *or* a
wave that passes through the lower slit, not even with a probabilistic
measure of ignorance.

There are, however, situations in which this interference term is not
observed, i.e., in which the classical probability formula applies.
This happens for instance when we perform a detection at the slits,
whether or not we believe that measurements are related to a
‘true’ collapse of the wave function (i.e., that only
*one* of the components survives the measurement and proceeds
to hit the screen). The disappearence of the interference term,
however, can happen also spontaneously, even when no ‘true
collapse’ is presumed to happen, namely if some other systems
(say, sufficiently many stray cosmic particles scattering off the
electron) suitably interact with the wave between the slits and the
screen. In this case, the interference term is not observed, because
the electron has become *entangled* with the stray particles
(see the entry on
quantum entanglement and information).^{[4]}
The phase relation between the two components which is responsible
for interference is well-defined only at the level of the larger
system composed of electron and stray particles, and can produce
interference only in a suitable experiment including the larger
system. Probabilities for results of measurements are calculated
*as if* the wave function had collapsed to one or the other of
its two components, but the phase relations have merely been
distributed over a larger system.

It is this phenomenon of suppression of interference through suitable
interaction with the environment that we refer to by
‘suppression of interference’, and that is studied in the
theory of
decoherence.^{[5]}
For completeness, we mention the overlapping but distinct concept of
*decoherent* (or *consistent*) *histories*.
Decoherence in the sense of this abstract formalism is defined simply
by the condition that (quantum) probabilities for wave components at a
later time may be calculated from those for wave components at an
earlier time and the (quantum) conditional probabilities, according to
the standard classical formula, i.e., as if the wave had
collapsed. There is some controversy, which we leave aside, as to
claims surrounding the status of this formalism as a foundational
approach in its own right. Without these claims, the formalism is
interpretationally neutral and can be useful in describing situations
of suppression of interference. Indeed, the abstract definition has
the merit of bringing out two conceptual points that are crucial to
the idea of decoherence and that will be emphasised in the following:
that wave components can be reidentified over time, and that if we do
so, we can formally identify ‘trajectories’ for the
system.^{[6]}

### 2.2 Features of decoherence

The *theory of decoherence* (sometimes also referred to as
‘dynamical’ decoherence) studies concrete spontaneous
interactions that lead to suppression of interference.

Several features of interest arise in models of such interactions (although by no means are all such features common to all models):

- Suppression of interference can be an extremely fast process,
depending on the system and the environment
considered.
^{[7]} - The environment will tend to couple to and suppress interference between a preferred set of states, be it a discrete set (left- and right- handed states in models of chiral molecules) or some continuous set (‘coherent’ states of a harmonic oscillator).
- These preferred states can be characterised in terms of their
‘robustness’ or ‘stability’ with respect to
the interaction with the environment. Roughly speaking, while the
system gets entangled with the environment, the states between which
interference is suppressed are the ones that get
*least*entangled with the environment themselves under further interaction. This point leads us to various further (interconnected) aspects of decoherence. - First of all, an intuitive picture of the interaction between
system and environment can be provided by the analogy with a
measurement interaction (see the entries on
quantum mechanics
and
measurement in quantum theory):
the environment is ‘monitoring’ the system, it is
spontaneously ‘performing a measurement’ (more precisely
letting the system undergo an interaction as in a measurement) of the
preferred states. The analogy to the standard idealised quantum
measurements will be very close in the case of, say, the chiral
molecule. In the case, say, of the coherent states of the harmonic
oscillator, one should think instead of
*approximate*measurements of position (or in fact of approximate joint measurements of position and momentum, since information about the time of flight is also recorded in the environment). - Secondly, the robustness of the preferred states is related to the
fact that information about them is stored in a
*redundant*way in the environment (say, because the Schrödinger cat has interacted with so many stray particles — photons, air molecules, dust). This can later be accessed by an observer without further disturbing the system (we measure — however that may be interpreted — whether the cat is alive or dead by intercepting on our retina a small fraction of the light that has interacted with the cat). - Thirdly, one often says in this context that decoherence induces
‘effective superselection rules’. The concept of a
(strict) superselection rule is something that requires a
generalisation of the formalism of quantum mechanics, and means that
there are some observables — called ‘classical’ in
technical terminology — that
*commute*with all observables (for a review, see Wightman 1995). Intuitively, these observables are infinitely robust, since no possible interaction can disturb them (at least as long as the interaction Hamiltonian is considered to be an observable). By an effective superselection rule one means that, roughly analogously, certain observables (e.g., chirality) will not be disturbed by the interactions that actually take place. (See also the comments on the charge superselection rule in Section 5 below.) - Fourthly and perhaps most importantly, robustness has to do with
the possibility or reidentifying a component of the wave over time,
and thus talking about
*trajectories*, whether spatial or not (the component of the electron's wave that goes through the upper slit hits the screen at a particular place with a certain probability; the left-handed component of the state of a chiral molecule at some time*t*evolves into the left-handed component of the perhaps slightly altered state of the molecule at some later time*t*′). Notice that in many of the early papers on decoherence the emphasis is on the preferred states themselves, or on how the (reduced) state of the system evolves: notably on how the state of the system becomes approximately diagonal in the basis defined by the preferred states. This emphasis on (so to speak)*kinematical*aspects must not mislead one: the*dynamical*aspects of reidentification over time and trajectory formation are just as important if not the*most*important for the concept of decoherence and its understanding. - In the case of decoherence interactions of the form of approximate
joint position and momentum measurements, the preferred states are
obviously Schrödinger waves localised (narrow) in both position
and momentum (essentially the ‘coherent states’ of the
system). Indeed, they can be
*very*narrow. A speck of dust of radius*a*= 10^{-5}cm floating in the air will have interference suppressed between (position) components with a width (‘coherence length’) of 10^{-13}cm.^{[8]} - In this case, the trajectories at the level of the components (the
trajectories of the preferred states) will approximate surprisingly
well the corresponding classical (Newtonian)
trajectories. Intuitively, one can explain this by noting that if the
preferred states, which are ‘wave packets’ that are both
narrow in position and remaining narrow (because narrow in momentum),
tend to get entangled least with the environment, they will tend to
follow more or less undistrubed the Schrödinger equation. But in
fact, narrow wave packets will follow approximately Newtonian
trajectories (if the external potentials in which they move are
uniform enough along the width of the packets: results of this kind
are known as ‘Ehrenfest theorems’.) Thus, the resulting
‘histories’ will be close to Newtonian ones (on the
relevant
scales).
^{[9]}The most intuitive physical example for this are the observed trajectories of alpha particles in a bubble chamber, which are indeed extremely close to Newtonian ones, except for additional tiny ‘kinks’.^{[10]}

None of these features are claimed to obtain in all cases of
interaction with some environment. It is a matter of detailed physical
investigation to assess which systems exhibit which features, and how
general the lessons are that we might learn from studying specific
models. In particular one should beware of common overgeneralisations.
For instance, decoherence does *not* affect only and all
‘macroscopic systems’. True, middle-sized objects, say, on
the Earth's surface will be very effectively decohered by the air in
the atmosphere, and this is an excellent example of decoherence at
work. On the other hand, there are also very good examples of
decoherence-like interactions affecting microscopic systems, such as
in the interaction of alpha particles with the gas in a bubble
chamber. And further, there are arguably macroscopic systems for
which interference effects are not suppressed. For instance, it has
been shown to be possible to sufficiently shield SQUIDS (a type of
superconducting devices) from decoherence for the purpose of observing
superpositions of different macroscopic currents — contrary to
what one had expected (see e.g., Leggett 1984; and esp. 2002, Section
5.4). Anglin, Paz and Zurek (1997) examine some less well-behaved
models of decoherence and provide a useful corrective as to the limits
of decoherence.

## 3. Conceptual Appraisal

### 3.1 Solving the measurement problem?

The fact that interference is typically very well suppressed between localised states of macroscopic objects suggests that it is relevant to why macroscopic objects in fact appear to us to be in localised states. A stronger claim is that decoherence is not only relevant to this question but by itself already provides the complete answer. In the special case of measuring apparatus, it would explain why we never observe an apparatus pointing, say, to two different results, i.e., decoherence would provide a solution to the measurement problem. As pointed out by many authors, however (recently e.g., Adler 2003; Zeh 1995, pp. 14-15), this claim is not tenable.

The measurement problem, in a nutshell, runs as follows. Quantum
mechanical systems are described by wave-like mathematical objects
(vectors) of which sums (superpositions) can be formed (see the entry
on
quantum mechanics).
Time evolution (the Schrödinger equation) preserves such
sums. Thus, if a quantum mechanical system (say, an electron) is
described by a superposition of two given states, say, spin in
*x-*direction equal +1/2 and spin in *x-*direction equal
-1/2, and we let it interact with a measuring apparatus that couples
to these states, the final quantum state of the composite will be a
sum of two components, one in which the apparatus has coupled to (has
registered) *x*-spin = +1/2, and one in which the apparatus has
coupled to (has registered) *x*-spin = -1/2. The problem is
that while we may accept the idea of microscopic systems being
described by such sums, we cannot even begin to imagine what it would
mean for the (composite of electron and) apparatus to be so
described.

Now, what happens if we include decoherence in the description?
Decoherence tells us, among other things, that there are plenty of
interactions in which differently localised states of macroscopic
systems couple to different states of their environment. In
particular, the differently localised states of the macroscopic system
could be the states of the pointer of the apparatus registering the
different *x*-spin values of the electron. By the same argument
as above, the composite of electron, apparatus and environment will be
a sum of a state corresponding to the environment coupling to the
apparatus coupling in turn to the value +1/2 for the spin, and of a
state corresponding to the environment coupling to the apparatus
coupling in turn to the value -1/2 for the spin. So again we cannot
imagine what it would mean for the composite system to be described by
such a sum.

We are left with the following choice *whether or not* we
include decoherence: either the composite system is not described by
such a sum, because the Schrödinger equation actually breaks down
and needs to be modified, or it is, but then we need to understand
what that means, and this requires giving an appropriate
interpretation of quantum mechanics. Thus, decoherence as such does
not provide a solution to the measurement problem, at least not unless
it is combined with an appropriate interpretation of the wave
function. And indeed, as we shall see, some of the main workers in the
field such as Zeh (2000) and Zurek (1998) suggest that decoherence is
most naturally understood in terms of Everett-like interpretations
(see below
Section 4.3,
and the entries on
Everett's relative-state interpretation
and on the
many-worlds interpretation).

Unfortunately, naive claims of the kind above are still somewhat part of the ‘folklore’ of decoherence, and deservedly attract the wrath of physicists (e.g., Pearle 1997) and philosophers (e.g., Bub 1999, Chap. 8) alike. (To be fair, this ‘folk’ position has the merit of attempting to subject measurement interactions to further physical analysis, without assuming that measurements are a fundamental building block of the theory.)

### 3.2 Compounding the measurement problem

Decoherence is clearly neither a dynamical evolution contradicting the
Schrödinger equation, nor a new interpretation of the wave
function. As we shall discuss, however, it does both reveal important
dynamical effects *within* the Schrödinger evolution, and
may be *suggestive* of possible interpretations of the wave
function.

As such it has other things to offer to the philosophy of quantum mechanics. At first, however, it seems that discussion of environmental interactions even exacerbates the problems. Intuitively, if the environment is carrying out, without our intervention, lots of approximate position measurements, then the measurement problem ought to apply more widely, also to these spontaneously occurring measurements.

Indeed, while it is well-known that localised states of macroscopic
objects spread very slowly under the free Schrödinger evolution
(i.e., if there are no interactions), the situation turns out to be
different if they are in interaction with the environment. Although
the different components that couple to the environment will be
individually incredibly localised, collectively they can have a spread
that is many orders of magnitude larger. That is, the state of the
object and the environment could be a superposition of zillions of
very well localised terms, each with slightly different positions, and
which are collectively spread over a *macroscopic distance*,
even in the case of everyday
objects.^{[11]}

Given that everyday macroscopic objects are particularly subject to decoherence interactions, this raises the question of whether quantum mechanics can account for the appearance of the everyday world even beyond the measurement problem in the strict sense. To put it crudely: if everything is in interaction with everything else, everything is entangled with everything else, and that is a worse problem than the entanglement of measuring apparatuses with the measured probes. And indeed, discussing the measurement problem without taking decoherence (fully) into account may not be enough, as we shall illustrate by the case of some versions of the modal interpretation in Section 4.4.

### 3.3 Emergence of classicality

What suggests that decoherence may be relevant to the issue of the
classical appearance of the everyday world is that *at the level of
components* the quantum description of decoherence phenomena can
display tantalisingly classical aspects. The question is then whether,
if viewed in the context of any of the main foundational approaches to
quantum mechanics, these classical aspects can be taken to explain
corresponding classical aspects of the phenomena. The answer, perhaps
unsurprisingly, turns out to depend on the chosen approach, and in the
next section we shall discuss in turn the relation between decoherence
and several of the the main approaches to the foundations of quantum
mechanics.

Even more generally, one could ask whether the results of decoherence
could thus be used to explain the emergence of the entire
*classicality of the everyday world*, i.e., to explain both
kinematical features such as macroscopic localisation and dynamical
features such as approximately Newtonian or Brownian trajectories,
*whenever they happen to be* phenomenologically adequate
descriptions. As we have mentioned, there are cases in which a
classical description is not a good description of a phenomenon, even
if the phenomenon involves macroscopic systems. There are also cases,
notably quantum *measurements*, in which the classical aspects
of the everyday world are only kinematical (definiteness of pointer
readings), while the dynamics is highly non-classical (indeterministic
response of the apparatus). In a sense, the everyday world is the
world of classical concepts as presupposed by Bohr (see the entry on
the
Copenhagen interpretation)
in order to describe in the first place the ‘quantum
phenomena’, which *themselves* would thus become a
consequence of decoherence (Zeh 1995, p. 33; see also Bacciagaluppi
2002, Section 6.2). The question of explaining the classicality of the
everyday world becomes the question of whether one can *derive*
from within quantum mechanics the conditions necessary to *discover
and practise* quantum mechanics itself, and thus, in Shimony's
(1989) words, closing the circle.

In this generality the question is clearly too hard to answer,
depending as it does on how far the physical *programme of
decoherence* (Zeh 1995, p. 9) can be successfully developed. We
shall thus postpone the (partly speculative) discussion of how far the
programme of decoherence might go until
Section 5.

## 4. Decoherence and Approaches to Quantum Mechanics

There is a wide range of approaches to the foundations of quantum
mechanics. The term ‘approach’ here is more appropriate
than the term ‘interpretation’, because several of these
approaches are in fact *modifications* of the theory, or at
least introduce some prominent new theoretical aspects. A convenient
way of classifying these approaches is in terms of their strategies
for dealing with the measurement problem.

Some approaches, so-called collapse approaches, seek to modify the Schrödinger equation, so that superpositions of different ‘everyday’ states do not arise or are very unstable. Such approaches may have intuitively little to do with decoherence since they seek to suppress precisely those superpositions that are created by decoherence. Nevertheless their relation to decoherence is interesting. Among collapse approaches, we shall discuss (in Section 4.1) von Neumann's collapse postulate and theories of spontaneous localisation (see the entry on collapse theories).

Other approaches, known as ‘hidden variables’ approaches, seek to explain quantum phenomena as equilibrium statistical effects arising from a theory at a deeper level, rather strongly in analogy with attempts at understanding thermodynamics in terms of statistical mechanics (see the entry on philosophy of statistical mechanics). Of these, the most developed are the so-called pilot-wave theories, in particular the theory by de Broglie and Bohm (see the entry on Bohmian mechanics), whose relation to decoherence we discuss in Section 4.2.

Finally, there are approaches that seek to solve the measurement
problem strictly by providing an appropriate *interpretation*
of the theory. Slightly tongue in cheek, one can group together under
this heading approaches as diverse as Everett interpretations (see the
entries on
Everett's relative-state interpretation
and on the
many-worlds interpretation),
modal interpretations
and Bohr's
Copenhagen interpretation
(Sections
4.3,
4.4
and
4.5,
respectively).

We shall be analysing these approaches specifically in their relation to decoherence. For further details and more general assessment or criticism we direct the reader to the relevant entries.

### 4.1 Collapse approaches

#### 4.1.1 Von Neumann

It is notorious that von Neumann (1932) proposed that the observer's
consciousness is somehow related to what he called Process I,
otherwise known as the collapse postulate or the projection postulate,
which in his book is treated on a par with the Schrödinger
equation (his Process II). There is some ambiguity in how to interpret
von Neumann. He may have been advocating some sort of special access
to our own consciousness that makes it appear to us that the wave
function has collapsed, thus justifying a phenomenological reading of
Process I. Alternatively, he may have proposed that consciousness
plays some causal role in precipitating the collapse, in which case
Process I is a physical process fully on a par with Process
II.^{[12]}

In either case, von Neumann's interpretation relies on the
insensitivity of the final predictions (for what we consciously
record) to exactly where and when Process I is used in modelling the
evolution of the quantum system. This is often referred to as the
*movability of the von Neumann cut* between the subject and the
object, or some similar phrase. Collapse could occur when a particle
impinges on a screen, or when the screen blackens, or when an
automatic printout of the result is made, or in our retina, or along
the optic nerve, or when ultimately consciousness is involved. Before
and after the collapse, the Schrödinger equation would describe
the evolution of the system.

Von Neumann shows that all of these models are equivalent, as far as
the final predictions are concerned, so that he can indeed maintain
that collapse is related to consciousness, while in practice applying
the projection postulate at a much earlier (and more practical) stage
in the description. What allows von Neumann to derive this result,
however, is the assumption of *absence of interference* between
different components of the wave function. Indeed, if interference
were otherwise present, the timing of the collapse would influence the
final statistics, just as it would in the case of the two-slit
experiment (collapse behind the slits or at the screen). Thus,
although von Neumann's is (at least on some readings) a true collapse
approach, its reliance on decoherence is in fact crucial.

#### 4.1.2 Spontaneous collapse theories

The best known theory of spontaneous collapse is the so-called GRW
theory (Ghirardi Rimini & Weber 1986), in which a material
particle spontaneously undergoes *localisation* in the sense
that at random times it experiences a collapse of the form used to
describe approximate position
measurements.^{[13]}
In the original model, the collapse occurs independently for each
particle (a large number of particles thus ‘triggering’
collapse much more frequently); in later models the frequency for each
particle is weighted by its mass, and the overall frequency for
collapse is thus tied to mass
density.^{[14]}

Thus, formally, the effect of spontaneous collapse is the same as in
some of the models of decoherence, at least for one
particle.^{[15]}
Two crucial differences on the other hand are that we have
‘true’ collapse instead of suppression of interference
(see above
Section 2),
and that spontaneous collapse occurs *without* there being any
interaction between the system and anything else, while in the case of
decoherence suppression of interference obviously arises through
interaction with the environment.

Can decoherence be put to use in GRW? The situation may be a bit
complex when the decoherence interaction does not approximately
privilege position (e.g., currents in a SQUID instead), because
collapse and decoherence might actually ‘pull’ in
different
directions.^{[16]}
But in those cases in which the main decoherence interaction also
takes the form of approximate position measurements, the answer boils
down to a quantitative comparison. If collapse happens faster than
decoherence, then the superposition of components relevant to
decoherence will not have time to arise, and insofar as the collapse
theory is successful in recovering classical phenomena, decoherence
plays no role in this recovery. Instead, if decoherence takes place
faster than collapse, then (as in von Neumann's case) the collapse
mechanism can find ‘ready-made’ structures onto which to
truly collapse the wave function. This is indeed borne out by detailed
comparison (Tegmark 1993, esp. Table 2). Thus, it seems that
decoherence does play a role also in spontaneous collapse
theories.

A related point is whether decoherence has implications for the
*experimental testability* of spontaneous collapse theories.
Indeed, provided decoherence can be put to use also in no-collapse
approaches such as pilot-wave or Everett (possibilities that we
discuss in the next sub-sections), then in all cases in which
decoherence is faster than collapse, what might be interpreted as
evidence for collapse could be reinterpreted as ‘mere’
suppression of interference (think of definite measurement outcomes!),
and only cases in which the collapse theory predicts collapse but the
system is shielded from decoherence (or perhaps in which the two pull
in different directions) could be used to test collapse theories
experimentally.

One particularly bad scenario for experimental testability is related to the speculation (in the context of the ‘mass density’ version) that the cause of spontaneous collapse may be connected with gravitation. Tegmark 1993 (Table 2) quotes some admittedly uncertain estimates for the suppression of interference due to a putative quantum gravity, but they are quantitatively very close to the rate of destruction of interference due to the GRW collapse (at least outside of the microscopic domain). Similar conclusions are arrived at by Kay (1998). If there is indeed such a quantitative similarity between these possible effects, then it would become extremely difficult to distinguish between the two (with the above proviso). In the presence of gravitation, any positive effect could be interpreted as support for either collapse or decoherence. And in those cases in which the system is effectively shielded from decoherence (say, if the experiment is performed in free fall), if the collapse mechanics is indeed triggered by gravitational effects, then no collapse might be expected either. The relation between decoherence and spontaneous collapse theories is thus indeed far from straightforward.

### 4.2 Pilot-wave theories

Pilot-wave theories are no-collapse formulations of quantum mechanics that assign to the wave function the role of determining the evolution of (‘piloting’, ‘guiding’) the variables characterising the system, say particle configurations, as in de Broglie's (1928) and Bohm's (1952) theory, or fermion number density, as in Bell's (1987, Chap. 19) ‘beable’ quantum field theory, or again field confugurations, as in Valentini's proposals for pilot-wave quantum field theories (Valentini, in preparation; see also Valentini 1996).

De Broglie's idea had been to modify classical Hamiltonian mechanics
in such a way as to make it analogous to classical wave optics, by
substituting for Hamilton and Jacobi's action function the phase
*S* of a physical wave. Such a ‘wave mechanics’ of
course yields non-classical motions, but in order to understand how de
Broglie's dynamics relates to typical quantum phenomena, we must
include Bohm's (1952, Part II) analysis of the appearance of
collapse. In the case of measurements, Bohm argued that the wave
function evolves into a superposition of components that are and
remain separated in the total configuration space of measured system
and apparatus, so that the total configuration is
‘trapped’ inside a *single component* of the wave
function, which will guide its further evolution, as if the wave had
collapsed (‘effective’ wave function). This analysis
allows one to recover qualitatively the measurement collapse and by
extension typical quantum features such as the
uncertainty principle
and the perfect correlations in an __EPR experiment__ (we are
ignoring here the well developed quantitative aspects of the
theory).

A natural idea is now that this analysis should be extended from the case of measurements induced by an apparatus to that of the ‘spontaneous measurements’ performed by the environment in the theory of decoherence, thus applying the same strategy for recovering both quantum and classical phenomena. The resulting picture is one in which de Broglie-Bohm theory, in cases of decoherence, would describe the motion of particles that are trapped inside one of the extremely well localised components selected by the decoherence interaction. Thus, de Broglie-Bohm trajectories will partake of the classical motions on the level defined by decoherence (the width of the components). This use of decoherence would arguably resolve the puzzles discussed e.g., by Holland (1996) with regard to the possibility of a ‘classical limit’ of de Broglie's theory. One baffling problem is for instance that possible trajectories in de Broglie-Bohm theory differing in their initial conditions cannot cross, because the wave guides the particles by way of a first-order equation, while Newton's equations are second-order, as well-known, and possible trajectories do cross. However, the non-interfering components produced by decoherence can indeed cross, and so will the trajectories of particles trapped inside them.

The above picture is natural, but it is not obvious. De Broglie-Bohm
theory and decoherence contemplate two a priori *distinct*
mechanisms connected to apparent collapse: respectively, separation of
components in configuration space and suppression of interference.
While the former obviously implies the latter, it is equally obvious
that decoherence need not imply separation in configuration space. One
can expect, however, that decoherence interactions of the form of
approximate position measurements will.

If the main instances of decoherence are indeed coextensive with
instances of separation in configuration, de Broglie-Bohm theory can
thus *use* the results of decoherence relating to the formation
of classical structures, while providing an interpretation of quantum
mechanics that explains why these structures are indeed
observationally relevant. The question that arises for de Broglie-Bohm
theory is then the extension of the well-known question of whether all
apparent *measurement* collapses can be associated with
separation in configuration (by arguing that at some stage all
measurement results are recorded in macroscopically different
configurations) to the question of whether *all* appearance of
classicality can be associated with separation in configuration
space.^{[17]}

A discussion of the role of decoherence in pilot-wave theory in the
form suggested above is still largely outstanding. An informal
discussion is given in Bohm and Hiley (1993, Chap. 8), partial results
are given by Appleby (1999), and a different approach is suggested by
Allori (2001; see also Allori & Zanghì 2001). Appleby
discusses trajectories in a model of decoherence and obtains
approximately classical trajectories, but under a special
assumption.^{[18]}
Allori investigates in the first place the ‘short
wavelength’ limit of de Broglie-Bohm theory (suggested by the
analogy to the geometric limit in wave optics). The role of
decoherence in her analysis is crucial but limited to
*maintaining* the classical behaviour obtained under the
appropriate short wavelength conditions, because the behaviour would
otherwise break down after a certain time.

### 4.3 Everett interpretations

Everett interpretations are very diverse, and possibly only share the
core intuition that a *single* wave function of the universe
should be interpreted in terms of a *multiplicity* of
‘realities’ at some level or other. This multiplicity,
however understood, is formally associated with *components* of
the wave function in some
decomposition.^{[19]}

Various Everett interpretations, roughly speaking, differ as to how to
*identify* the relevant components of the universal wave
function, and how to *justify* such an identification (the
so-called problem of the ‘preferred basis’ —
although this may be a misnomer), and differ as to how to
*interpret* the resulting multiplicity (various
‘many-worlds’ or various ‘many-minds’
interpretations), in particular with regard to the interpretation of
the (emerging?) *probabilities* at the level of the components
(problem of the ‘meaning of probabilities’).

The last problem is perhaps the most hotly debated aspect of
Everett. Clearly, decoherence enables reidentification over time of
both observers and of results of repeated measurement and thus
definition of empirical frequencies. In recent years progress has been
made especially along the lines of interpreting the probabilities in
decision-theoretic terms for a ‘splitting’ agent (see in
particular Wallace 2003b, and its longer preprint, Wallace
2002).^{[20]}

The most useful application of decoherence to Everett, however, seems
to be in the context of the problem of the preferred basis.
Decoherence seems to yield a (maybe partial) solution to the problem,
in that it naturally identifies a class of ‘preferred’
states (not necessarily an orthonormal basis!), and even allows to
reidentify them over time, so that one can identify
‘worlds’ with the trajectories defined by decoherence (or
more abstractly with decoherent
histories).^{[21]}
If part of the aim of Everett is to interpret quantum mechanics
without introducing extra structure, in particular without
*postulating* the existence of some preferred basis, then one
will try to identify structure that is already present in the wave
function at the level of components (see e.g., Wallace, 2003a). In
this sense, decoherence is an ideal candidate for identifying the
relevant components.

A *justification* for this identification can then be variously
given by suggesting that a ‘world’ should be a
*temporally extended* structure and thus reidentification over
time will be a necessary condition for identifying worlds, or
similarly by suggesting that in order for observers to *evolve*
there must be *stable records* of past events (Saunders 1993,
and the unpublished Gell-Mann & Hartle 1994 (see the Other
Internet Resources section below), or that observers must be able to
access *robust states*, preferably through the existence of
redundant information in the environment (Zurek's ‘existential
interpretation’, 1998).

In alternative to some global notion of ‘world’, one can look at the components of the (mixed) state of a (local) system, either from the point of view that the different components defined by decoherence will separately affect (different components of the state of) another system, or from the point of view that they will separately underlie the conscious experience (if any) of the system. The former sits well with Everett's (1957) original notion of relative state, and with the relational interpretation of Everett preferred by Saunders (e.g., 1993) and, it would seem, Zurek (1998). The latter leads directly to the idea of many-minds interpretations (see the entry on Everett's relative-state interpretation and the website on ‘A Many-Minds Interpretation of Quantum Theory’ referenced in the Other Internet Resources). If one assumes that mentality can be associated only with certain decohering structures of great complexity, this might have the advantage of further reducing the remaining ambiguity about the preferred ‘basis’.

The idea of many minds was suggested early on by Zeh (2000;
also 1995, p. 24). As Zeh puts it, von Neumann's motivation for
introducing collapse was to save what he called psycho-physical
parallelism (arguably supervenience of the mental on the physical:
only one mental state is experienced, so there should be only one
corresponding component in the physical state). In a decohering
no-collapse universe one can instead introduce a *new*
psycho-physical parallelism, in which individual minds supervene on
each non-interfering component in the physical state. Zeh indeed
suggests that, given decoherence, this is the most natural
interpretation of quantum
mechanics.^{[22]}

### 4.4 Modal interpretations

Modal interpretations originated with Van Fraassen (1973, 1991) as
pure reinterpretations of quantum mechanics (other later versions
coming to resemble more hidden variables theories). Van Fraassen's
basic intuition was that the quantum state of a system should be
understood as describing a collection of possibilities, represented by
components in the (mixed) quantum state. His proposal considers only
decompositions at single instants, and is agnostic about
reidentification over time. Thus, it can directly exploit only the
fact that decoherence produces descriptions in terms of classical-like
states, which will count as possibilities in Van Fraassen's
interpretation. This ensures ‘empirical adequacy’ of the
quantum description (a crucial concept in Van Fraassen's philosophy of
science). The dynamical aspects of decoherence can be exploited
indirectly, in that single-time components will exhibit
*records* of the past, which ensure adequacy with respect to
observations, but about whose veridicity Van Fraassen remains
agnostic.

A different strand of modal interpretations is loosely associated with the (distinct) views of Kochen (1985), Healey (1989) and Dieks and Vermaas (e.g., 1998). We focus on the last of these to fix the ideas. Van Fraassen's possible decompositions are restricted to one singled out by a mathematical criterion (related to the so-called biorthogonal decomposition theorem), and a dynamical picture is explicitly sought (and was later developed). In the case of an ideal (non-approximate) quantum measurement, this special decomposition coincides with that defined by the eigenstates of the measured observable and the corresponding pointer states, and the interpretation thus appears to solve the measurement problem (in the strict sense).

At least in Dieks's original intentions, however, the approach was meant to provide an attractive interpretation of quantum mechanics also in the case of decoherence interactions, since at least in simple models of decoherence the same kind of decomposition singles out more or less also those states between which interference is suppressed (with a proviso about very degenerate states).

However, this approach fails badly when applied to other models of
decoherence, e.g., that in Joos and Zeh (1985, Section III.2). Indeed,
it appears that in general the components singled out by this version
of the modal interpretation are given by *delocalised* states,
as opposed to the components arising naturally in the theory of
decoherence (Bacciagaluppi 2000; Donald 1998). Notice that van
Fraassen's original interpretatioin is untouched by this problem, and
so are possibly some more recent modal or modal-like interpretations
by Spekkens and Sipe (2001), Bene and Dieks (2002) and Berkovitz and
Hemmo (in preparation).

Finally, some of the views espoused in the decoherent histories literature could be considered as cognate to Van Fraassen's views, identifying possibilities, however, at the level of possible courses of world history. Such ‘possible worlds’ would be those temporal sequences of (quantum) propositions that satisfy the decoherence condition and in this sense support a description in terms of a probabilistic evolution. This view would be using decoherence as an essential ingredient, and in fact may turn out to be the most fruitful way yet of implementing modal ideas; a discussion in these terms still needs to be carried out in detail, but see Hemmo (1996).

### 4.5 Bohr's Copenhagen interpretation

It appears that Bohr held more or less the following view. Everyday
concepts, in fact the concepts of classical physics, are indispensable
to the description of any physical phenomena (in a way — and
terminology — much reminiscent of Kant's transcendental
arguments). However, experimental evidence from atomic phenomena shows
that classical concepts have fundamental limitations in their
applicability: they can only give partial (complementary) pictures of
physical objects. While these limitations are quantitatively
negligible for most purposes in dealing with macroscopic objects, they
apply also at that level (as shown by Bohr's willingness to apply the
uncertainty relations to parts of the experimental apparatus in the
Einstein-Bohr debates), and they are of paramount importance
when dealing with microscopic objects. Indeed, they shape the
characteristic features of quantum phenomena, e.g., indeterminism. The
quantum state is not an ‘intuitive’ (*anschaulich*,
also translated as ‘visualisable’) representation of a
quantum object, but only a ‘symbolic’ representation, a
shorthand for the quantum phenomena constituted by applying the
various complementary classical pictures.

While it is difficult to pinpoint exactly what Bohr's views were (the
concept and even the term ‘Copenhagen interpretation’
appear to be a later construct; see Howard 2003), it is clear that
according to Bohr, classical concepts are autonomous from, and indeed
conceptually prior to, quantum theory. If we understand the theory of
decoherence as pointing to how classical concepts might in fact emerge
from quantum mechanics, this seems to undermine Bohr's basic
position. Of course it would be a mistake to say that decoherence (a
part of quantum theory) *contradicts* the Copenhagen approach
(an interpretation of quantum theory). However, decoherence does
suggest that one might want to adopt alternative interpretations, in
which it is the quantum concepts that are prior to the classical ones,
or, more precisely, the classical concepts at the everyday level
emerge from quantum mechanics (irrespectively of whether there are
even more fundamental concepts, as in pilot-wave theories). In this
sense, if the programme of decoherence is successful as sketched in
Section 3.3,
it will indeed be a blow to Bohr's *interpretation* coming
from quantum physics itself.

On the other hand, Bohr's *intuition* that quantum mechanics as
practised requires a classical domain would in fact be
*confirmed* by decoherence, if it turns out that decoherence is
indeed the basis for the phenomenology of quantum mechanics, as the
Everettian and possibly the Bohmian analysis suggest. As a matter of
fact, Zurek (2003) locates his existential interpretation half-way
between Bohr and Everett. It is perhaps a gentle irony that in the
wake of decoherence, the foundations of quantum mechanics might end up
re-evaluating this part of Bohr's thinking.

## 5. Scope of Decoherence

We have already mentioned in
Section 2.2
that some care has to be taken lest one overgeneralise conclusions
based on examining only well-behaved models of decoherence. On the
other hand, in order to assess the programme of explaining the
emergence of classicality using decoherence (together with appropriate
foundational approaches), one has to probe *how far* the
applications of decoherence can be pushed. In this final section, we
survey some of the further applications that have been proposed for
decoherence, beyond the easier examples we have seen such as chirality
or alpha-particle tracks. Whether decoherence can indeed be
successfully applied to all of these fields will be in part a matter
for further assessment, as more detailed models are proposed.

A straightforward application of the techniques allowing one to derive
Newtonian trajectories at the level of components has been employed by
Zurek and Paz (1994) to derive *chaotic trajectories* in
quantum mechanics. The problem with the quantum description of chaotic
behaviour is that *prima facie* there should be none. Chaos is
characterised roughly as extreme sensitivity in the behaviour of a
system on its initial conditions, where the distance between the
trajectories arising from different initial conditions increases
exponentially in time. Since the Schrödinger evolution is
*unitary*, it preserves all scalar products and all distances
between quantum state vectors. Thus, it would seem, close initial
conditions lead to trajectories that are uniformly close throughout
all of time, and no chaotic behaviour is possible (‘problem of
quantum chaos’). The crucial point that enables Zurek and Paz'
analysis is that the relevant trajectories in decoherence theory are
at the level of *components* of the state of the
system. Unitarity is preserved because the vectors in the environment
to which these different components are coupled, are and remain
orthogonal: how the components themselves evolve is immaterial.
Explicit modelling yields a picture of quantum chaos in which
different trajectories branch (a feature absent from classical chaos,
which is deterministic) and then indeed diverge exponentially. As with
the crossing of trajectories in de Broglie-Bohm theory
(Section 4.2),
one has behaviour at the level of components that is qualitatively
different from the behaviour derived from wave functions of an
isolated system.

The idea of effective superselection rules was mentioned in
Section 2.2.
As pointed out by Giulini, Kiefer and Zeh (1995, see also Giulini
*et al*. 1996, Section 6.4), the justification for the
(strict) superselection rule for charge in quantum field theory can
also be phrased in terms of decoherence. The idea is simple: an
electric charge is surrounded by a Coulomb field (which
electrostatically is infinitely extended; the argument can also be
carried through using the retarded field, though). States of different
electric charge of a particle are thus coupled to different,
presumably orthogonal, states of its electric field. One can consider
the far-field as an effectively uncontrollable environment that
decoheres the particle (and the near-field), so that superpositions of
different charges are indeed never observed.

Another claim about the significance of decoherence relates to time asymmetry (see e.g., the entries on time asymmetry in thermodynamics and philosophy of statistical mechanics), in particular of whether decoherence can explain the apparent time-directedness in our (classical) world. The issue is again one of time-directedness at the level of components emerging from a time-symmetric evolution at the level of the universal wave function (presumably with special initial conditions). Insofar as (apparent) collapse is indeed a time-directed process, decoherence will have direct relevance to the emergence of this ‘quantum mechanical arrow of time’ (for a spectrum of discussions, see Zeh 2001, Chap. 4; Hartle 1998, and references therein; and Bacciagaluppi 2002, Section 6.1). Whether decoherence is connected to the other familiar arrows of time is a more specific question, various discussions of which are given, e.g., by Zurek and Paz (1994), Hemmo and Shenker (2001) and the unpublished Wallace (2001) (see the Other Internet Resources Section below).

In a recent paper, Zeh (2003) argues from the notion that decoherence
can explain ‘quantum phenomena’ such as *particle
detections* that the concept of a particle in quantum field theory
is itself a consequence of decoherence. That is, only fields need to
be included in the fundamental concepts, and ‘particles’
are a derived concept, unlike what is suggested by the customary
introduction of fields through a process of ‘second
quantisation’. Thus decoherence seems to provide a further
powerful argument for the conceptual primacy of fields over particles
in the question of the interpretation of quantum field theory.

Finally, it has been suggested that decoherence could be a useful
ingredient in a theory of quantum gravity, for two reasons.
First, because a suitable generalisation of decoherence theory to a
full theory of quantum gravity should yield suppression of
interference between different classical spacetimes (Giulini *et
al*. 1996, Section 4.2). Second, it is speculated that
decoherence might solve the so-called *problem of time*, which
arises as a prominent puzzle in (the ‘canonical’ approach
to) quantum gravity. This is the problem that the candidate
fundamental equation (in this approach) — the Wheeler-DeWitt
equation — is an analogue of a time-*independent*
Schrödinger equation, and does not contain time at all. The
problem is thus simply: where does time come from? In the context of
decoherence theory, one can construct toy models in which the analogue
of the Wheeler-DeWitt wave function decomposes into non-interfering
components (for a suitable sub-system) each satisfying a
time-*dependent* Schrödinger equation, so that decoherence
appears in fact as the source of
time.^{[23]}
An accessible introduction to and philosophical discussion of these
models is given by Ridderbos (1999), with references to the original
papers.

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## Other Internet Resources

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- Wallace, D. (Oxford University), 2002, ‘Quantum Probability and Decision Theory, Revisited’, available online in the arXiv.org e-Print archive. This is a longer version of Wallace (2003b).
- The arXiv.org e-Print archive, formerly the Los Alamos archive. This is the main physics preprint archive; most of the links above are to this archive.
- The Pittsburgh Phil-Sci Archive. This is the main philosophy of science preprint archive; some of the links above are to this archive.
- A Many-Minds Interpretation Of Quantum Theory, maintained by Matthew Donald (Cavendish Lab, Physics, University of Cambridge). This page contains details of his many-minds interpretation, as well as discussions of some of the books and papers quoted above (and others of interest). Follow also the link to the ‘Frequently Asked Questions’, some of which (and the ensuing dialogue) contain useful discussion of decoherence.
- Quantum Mechanics on the Large Scale, maintained by Philip Stamp (Physics, University of British Columbia). This page has links to the available talks from the Vancouver workshop mentioned in footnote 2; see especially the papers by Tony Leggett and by Philip Stamp.
- Decoherence Website, maintained by Erich Joos. This is a site with information, references and further links to people and institutes working on decoherence, especially in Germany and the rest of Europe.

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### Acknowledgments

I wish to think many people in discussion with whom I have shaped my understanding of decoherence over the years, in particular Marcus Appleby, Matthew Donald, Beatrice Filkin, Meir Hemmo, Simon Saunders, David Wallace and Wojtek Zurek. For more recent discussions and correspondence relating to this article I wish to thank Valia Allori, Peter Holland, Martin Jones, Tony Leggett, Hans Primas, Alberto Rimini, Philip Stamp and Bill Unruh. I also gratefully acknowledge my debt to Steve Savitt and Philip Stamp for an invitation to talk at the University of British Columbia, and to Claudius Gros for an invitation to the University of the Saarland, and for the opportunities for discussion arising from these talks. Finally I wish to thank the referee of this entry, again David Wallace, for his clear and constructive commentary, my fellow subject editor John Norton, who corresponded with me extensively over a previous version of part of the material and whose suggestions I have taken to heart, my editor-in-chief Edward N. Zalta for his saintly patience, and my friend and predecessor as subject editor, the late Rob Clifton, who invited me to write on this topic in the first place.