Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Plato on Rhetoric and Poetry

1. From “On Poetry,” in his Quite Early One Morning (New York: New Directions, 1954), pp. 192-93.

2. Unless otherwise noted, I shall be using A. Bloom's translation of the Republic (New York: Basic Books, 1968). The identity of the authors Plato's Socrates is here quoting is not known, though the lines seem to be from lyric poetry and from comedy (possibly they are all from comedy). This is surprising in that one would have expected Socrates to identify well established opponents, presumably authors of the main genres of poetry he has been attacking (tragedy and epic).

3. Whether Plato is also the last major philosopher to discern a deep and comprehensive conflict between philosophy and poetry is an interesting question. Certainly Plato's best student, Aristotle, did not follow Plato in this respect. Many philosophers since then have assumed that when it comes to grasping truth, philosophy is unquestionably superior to poetry. It should be noted that some of Plato's philosophical predecessors, such as Xenophanes, Empedocles, and Heraclitus, did direct rather severe criticisms against poets (including of course Homer and Hesiod).

4. See Plato's Apology  18b-c, 19c. At 19e Socrates lists several sophists by name—Gorgias, Prodicus, Hippias (all three of whom appear in Plato's dialogues, and two of whom are named in the titles of dialogues)—and denies that he possesses the knowledge they sell. I note that some scholars capitalize “Sophist” and cognates when referring to an established profession in ancient Greece, a convention I have avoided here in order to avoid both confusion as well as giving the impression that there existed an established or well defined “school” of sophistry.

5. For further discussion of the interpretive issues, see J. Annas and C. Rowe, eds., New Perspectives on Plato, Modern and Ancient (Harvard: Harvard University Press, 2002); R. Blondell, The Play of Character in Plato's Dialogues (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002); C. Griswold, ed., Platonic Writings, Platonic Readings (New York: Routledge, Chapman, and Hall, 1988; rpt. Pennsylvania State University Press, with new Preface and Bibliography, 2002); and C. Griswold, “E Pluribus Unum? On the Platonic ‘Corpus’, Ancient Philosophy 19 (1999): 361-397 (a follow up exchange between the author and C. Kahn was published in the same journal, vol. 20.1 (2000), pp. 195-97). The bibliographies to these works offer numerous other relevant sources.

6. It is not known whether or not Ion is Plato's literary creation. The interlocutors in Plato's dialogues are sometimes historical characters (whose pronouncements are with rare exceptions assumed to be Plato's invention), sometimes not, even within the same dialogue (as possibly is in the case of the Ion; we know that a Socrates did exist). All citations from the Ion are from the P. Woodruff translation, in Plato: Complete Works, ed. J. M. Cooper and D. S. Hutchinson (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997).

7. Recall that in the Apol. Socrates recounts that to discover the meaning of the Oracle at Delphi (which had pronounced that no man is wiser than Socrates), he interrogated three types of claimants to wisdom: the politicians, the poets, and the artisans. The poets were unable to answer his questions about the meaning  of their poetry—bystanders could do that better!—from which it seemed to follow that poets do not work from wisdom so much as from inspiration (Apol. 22b-c). Naturally, the poets were angry with Socrates, and contributed to the indictment of Socrates (Apol. 23e).

8. H.-G. Gadamer asks: “Although Plato assures us to the contrary, is not his inability to do justice to the poets and to the art of poetry nevertheless an expression of the age-old rivalry between poets and philosophers?”  See his “Plato and the Poets,” in Dialogue and Dialectic, trans. P C. Smith (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1980), p. 46.

9. In book III, music is assessed and regulated, and Socrates repeatedly compares poetry to painting. This raises the question as to whether the critique of poetry is meant to extend to all of the “fine arts.”  Whatever the answer, it is clear that discursive poetry poses the greatest danger, presumably because its medium is that by which we primarily articulate and shape both soul and world.

10. It should be noted that Socrates also allows, in passing, that the guardians can imitate unworthy characters “for play” (396d3-e2); perhaps, that is, by way of making fun of them, but in any case without really identifying with them or being really affected (won over, shaped) by them. Plato himself imitates “bad” people, however, both in the Republic and elsewhere.

11. The commentator referred to is D. Clay, Platonic Questions (University Park, Pa: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2000), pp. 118, 120.

12. For a discussion of some of them, see C. Griswold, “The Ideas and the Criticism of Poetry in Plato's Republic, Book 10,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 19 (1981): 135-150. 

13. This point is made by J. A. Urmson, “Plato and the Poets,” in Plato's Republic: Critical Essays, ed. R. Kraut (Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997), p. 233. 

14. This point is made by is D. Clay, Platonic Questions, p. 146. 

15. J. Lear, “Inside and outside the Republic,” in his Open Minded (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1999), p. 240.

16. G .R. F. Ferrari helpfully notes that “poets will appeal to that in us which dwells upon the particular flavour of a human situation rather than to our capacity to minimize it; being vivid, after all, is what the medium of imitation both invites and excels at. It has an inbuilt tendency, then, to heighten the particular, to focus upon crises.” And again: “It is not the passing tremor caused by the sound or appearance of the imitation that he [Plato] considers dangerous, but the deeper fear of which it is a symptom—a fear which can hold sway over an entire life … . For if my heart swells as I watch son part from mother, or lovers lose their chance of happiness, it swells not only for the characters but for the human situation to which the performance gives me access: I weep that sons must part from mothers, that things should be so.”  In “Plato and Poetry,” in the Cambridge History of Literary Criticism, ed. G. A. Kennedy, vol. 1 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989), pp. 134, 140.

17. Tragedy is referred to six times in book X (595b4, 597e6, 598e8, 602b9, 605c11, 607a3; see also 595c1). Comedy is referred to twice (without citation of any authors of comedies), in one paragraph (606c2-9). Tragedy is plainly Socrates' chief target in his critique of poetry, but it is not his only one. Since Homer is identified as the origin of tragedy and is the most important target of the criticism, and since he wrote in epic, “tragedy” is being taken in a sense that goes beyond literary form. The “tragic vision of life” is Socrates' target.

18. Plato's refusal to carve off a real of the aesthetic from the ethical may be connected at a deep level to a refusal to treat the beautiful as though it were thinkable separately from the good. One of the underpinnings of Plato's account, that is, may be a metaphysical view.

19. Ferrari again puts it well: “The poet has a skill all his own: not understanding, but capturing the appearance, the look and feel of human life. But just as an image is, or rather should be (in Plato's view), for the sake of its original, the art of image-making is destined to be the helpmate of the art that seeks truth. Poetry cannot, so to speak, be trusted on its own, but as the ward of a philosophic guardian can put its talent to good use.”  See his “Plato and Poetry,” p. 108.

20. Symp.205b8-c2. Socrates there says “Well, you know, for example, that ’poetry‘ has a very wide range. After all, everything that is responsible for creating something out of nothing is a kind of poetry; and so all the creations of every craft and profession are themselves a kind of poetry, and everyone who practices a craft is a poet.” Trans. A. Nehamas and P. Woodruff, in Plato: Complete Works.

21. See Rep. 500e-501c (cf. 484c-d) where the philosopher-founder is compared to a painter. At 500c2-7 we are told, remarkably, that he “imitates” the Forms, likening himself to them as much as possible. 

22. See Urmson, “Plato and the Poets,” pp. 231-233, for a striking list of quotations to this effect, including the lines from Dylan Thomas quoted at the start of this essay.

23. See A. Nehamas' “Plato and the Mass Media,” in his The Virtues of Authenticity: Essays on Plato and Socrates (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1999), pp. 279-299. On p. 287 he asserts that “the greatest part of contemporary criticisms of television depends on a moral disapproval that is identical to Plato's attack on epic and tragic poetry in the fourth century B.C.”

24. For an analysis of the rhetoric and the meaning of the rhetoric of the Prot., see my “Relying on Your Own Voice: An Unsettled Rivalry of Moral Ideals in Plato's Protagoras,” Review of Metaphysics 53 (1999): 533-57. I will be quoting from the D. Zeyl translation of the Gorg. included in Plato: Collected Works, except that I have substituted “rhetoric” for “orator.”

25. For an interesting discussion, see D. Roochnik, “Stanley Fish and the Old Quarrel between Rhetoric and Philosophy,” Critical Review 5 (1991): 225-246.

26. S. Scully notes that Socrates' second speech is “the only speech in all of Plato where a speaker calls upon the Muses.”  See his Plato's Phaedrus, trans. with notes, glossary, appendices, Interpretative Essay, and Introduction (Newburyport, MA: Focus Philosophical Library, 2003), p. 15, n. 39.

27. I will be using the A. Nehamas and P. Woodruff translation of the Phaedrus, found in Plato: Complete Works.

28. By contrast: Plato concludes the Sophist with a series of distinctions intended to isolate and describe the sophist. They include the distinction between a speaker who does not know the truth but thinks he does, and a speaker who (rightly) suspects that he does not know the truth but nonetheless pretends to his audience that he does. The latter, the sophist, is an “insincere and unknowing” imitator of the truth; it is presupposed, in this discussion, that the sophist has an art (techne). 

29. In the Sophist (263e) and Theaetetus (189e) Plato defines thinking as the soul's conversation with itself.

30. For further discussion of this point, including of how the problem of self-deception is grounded in the Phaedrus “palinode” speech, see C. Griswold, Self-knowledge in Plato's Phaedrus (Yale University Press; rpt. University Park, Pa.: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1996), pp. 172-173, 199.

31. For some discussion and references to the literature, see C. Griswold, Self-knowledge in Plato's Phaedrus, ch. 6. 

32. For some discussion and references to the literature, see the works cited in footnote 5 above.