Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Deontic Logic

Determinism and Deontic Collapse in the Classic A-K-Framework

Let's note that adding T, □pp, allows us to explore a classical issue connected with determinism and deontic notions. Given axiom T, □ is now naturally taken to encode a truth-implicating notion of necessity in systems containing it. For this reason, we can now easily augment KTd with an axiom expressing determinism:

p → □p. (Determinism)

It is obvious on a moments reflection that, along with T, Determinism (as an axiom schemata), yields a collapse of modal distinctions, since p ↔ □p, and p ↔ ◊p would then be provable. However, we can also explore, the classical question of what happens to moral distinctions if determinism holds. This question is also settled from the perspective of KTd, since the following is a derivable rule of that system:

If ⊢ (p → □p), then ⊢ (pOBp).

To prove this, assume Determinism, ⊢ (p → □p).

a) We first show ⊢ pOBp. Assume p. Then by Determinism, □p. So by NEC′, namely □pOBp, we get OBp, and thus ⊢ pOBp.

b) Next, we show ⊢ OBpp. Assume OBp and ~p for reductio. By Determinism, we have ~p → □~p. So □~p. This yields OB~p, by NEC′. But then we have OBp & OB~p, which contradicts a prior demonstrated theorem, NC. So ⊢ OBpp.

So, from the standpoint of the classic Andersonian-Kangerian reduction, where the notion of necessity is truth-implicating (and thus axiom T is intended), the addition of the most natural expression of determinism entails that truth and deontic distinctions collapse. This in turn is easily seen to imply these corollaries:

If ⊢ (p → □p), then ⊢ (pPEp)
If ⊢ (p → □p), then ⊢ (OBpPEp)
If ⊢ (p → □p), then ⊢ (~pIMp)
If ⊢ (p → □p), then ⊢ ~OPp.

For example, consider the last corollary. By definition, p is optional iff neither p nor ~p is obligatory. But given determinism, this would entail that neither p nor ~p is true, which is not possible. So nothing can be morally optional if determinism is true.

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