Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Deontic Logic

A Bit More on Chisholm's Paradox

Recall the Chisholm quartet and its most natural symbolization in SDL:

(1) It ought to be that Jones goes to assist his neighbors.
(1′) OBg.
(2) It ought to be that if Jones goes, then he tells them he is coming.
(2′) OB(gt).
(3) If Jones doesn't go, then he ought not tell them he is coming.
(3′) ~gOB~t.
(4) Jones doesn't go.
(4′) ~g.

There is a general point to be made regarding the key inferences that generate the paradox per the above symbolization. There is a sense in which the inference from (1′) and (2′) to OBt and the inference from (3′) & (4′) to OB~t involve “detachment” of an obligation from a pair of premises, one of which involves a deontic conditional in some way. Let us introduce a bit of regimentation. Let


represent a shorthand for a conditional obligation or ought statement like that in the natural language sentence, (3), above.[1] So we will read OB(q/p) as “if p, then it ought to be (or it is obligatory) that q,” in the manner of (3) above. Suppose we also assume, as almost all have[2] that monadic obligations are disguised dyadic obligations, per the following analysis:

OBp =df OB(p/⊤).

With this in mind we distinguish between two relevant types of “detachment principles”[3] that we might ascribe to these iffy-‘ought’s:

Factual Detachment (FD): p & OB(q/p) .→ OBq

Deontic Detachment (DD): OBp & OB(q/p). → OBq

Factual detachment tells us that from the fact that p, and the deontic conditional to the effect that if p then it ought to be that q, we can conclude that it ought to be that q. Deontic Detachment in contrast tells us that from the fact that it ought to be that p and that if p, then it ought to be that q, we can conclude that it ought to be that q. If we interpret a deontic conditional as a material conditional with an obligatory consequent (as in (3′) above), FD, but not DD is supported. Conversely, if we interpret deontic conditionals as obligatory material conditionals (as in (2′) above), DD, but not FD is supported.[4] Although we have shown earlier that neither of these interpretations is acceptable, the contrast reveals a general problem. Carte blanche endorsement of both types of detachment (without some restriction) is not tenable, since it leads implausibly to the conclusion that we are both obligated to tell (the neighbor we are coming) and obligated to not tell. Thus researchers tended to divide up over which principle of the two they endorsed (Loewer and Belzer 1983). The Factual Detachment camp typically endorsed the view that the conditional in (3) in the Chisholm Quartet needs to be interpreted as a non-material conditional, but otherwise things are as they seem in (3): we have a conditional obligation that is a simple composite of a non-deontic conditional and a pure unary deontic operator in the consequent:

OB(q/p) =df pOBq, for some independent conditional.[5]

Typically, the conditional was a non-classical conditional of the sort made famous by Stalnaker and Lewis.[6] It is then generally maintained that deontic detachment is flawed, since the conditional obligations like those in (2) tell us only what to do in ideal circumstances, but they do not necessarily provide “cues”[7] for action in the actual world, where things are often typically quite sub-ideal, as (4) combined with (1) indicates. Thus from the fact that Jones ought to go and he ought to tell if he goes, it doesn't follow that what he ought to actually do is tell—that would be so only if it was also a fact that he goes to their aid. At best, we can only say that he ought ideally to go.

This suggestion seems a bit more difficult when we change the conditional to something like “If Doe does kill his mother, then it is obligatory that Doe kills her gently.” The idea that my obligation to not kill my mother gently (say for an inheritance) merely expresses an “ideal” obligation, but not an actual obligation, given that I will kill her, seems hard to swallow. So this case makes matters a bit harder for those favoring a factual detachment approach for generating actual obligations. Similarly, it would seem that if it is impermissible for me to kill my mother, then it is impermissible for me to do so gently, or to do so while dancing.[8] So carte blanche factual detachment seems to allow the mere fact that I will take an action in the future (killing my mother) that is horribly wrong and completely avoidable now to render obligatory another horrible (but slightly less horrible) action in the future (killing my mother gently). The latter action must be completely avoidable if the former is, and the latter action is one that I would seem to be equally obligated to not make.

The main alternative camp represented conditional obligations via dyadic non-composite obligation operators modeled syntactically on conditional probability. They rejected the idea that OB(q/p) =df pOBq, for some independent conditional. In a sense, on this view, deontic conditionals are viewed as idioms: the meaning of the compound is not a straightforward function of the meaning of the parts. The underlying intuition regarding the Chisholm example is that even if it might be true that we will violate some obligation, that doesn't get us off the hook from obligations that derive from the original one that we will violate. If I must go help and I must inform my neighbors that I'm coming, if I do go help, then I must inform them, and the fact that I will in fact violate the primary obligation does not block the derivative obligation anymore than it does the primary one itself.

One early semantic picture for the latter camp was that a sentence of the form OB(q/p) is true at a world i iff the i-best p-worlds are all q-worlds. OBq is then true iff OB(q/⊤), and so iff all the unqualifiedly i-best worlds are q-worlds (Hansson 1969). Note that this weds preference-based semantic orderings with dyadic conditional obligations.[9] This reflects a widespread trend. Factual detachment does not work in this case, since even if our world is an I-don't-go-help-world, and the best among the I-don't-go-help-worlds are I-don't-call-worlds, it does not follow that the unqualifiedly best worlds are I-don't-call-worlds. In fact, in this example, these folks would maintain, the unqualifiedly best worlds are both I-go worlds and I-call worlds, and the fact that I won't do what I'm supposed to do won't change that.

But one is compelled to ask those in the Deontic Detachment Camp: what then is the point of such apparent conditionals if we can't ever detach them from their apparent antecedents, and how are these conditionals related to regular ones? This seems to be the central challenge for this camp. Thus they often endorse a restricted form of factual detachment, of which the following is a representative instance:

Restricted Factual Detachment: □p & OB(q/p) .→ OBq.

Here □p might mean various things, for example that p is physically unalterable or necessary as of this moment in history.[10] Only if p is settled true in some sense, can we conclude from OB(q/p) that OBq. This certainly helps, but it still leaves us with a bit of a puzzle about why this apparent composite of a conditional and a deontic operator is actually some sort of primitive idiom involving a modal notion.

So it seems like we are left with a dilemma: either (1) you allow factual detachment and get the consequences earlier noted to the effect that simply because someone will act like a louse, he is obligated to do slightly mitigating louse-like things, or (2) instead you claim that “if p, then ought q” is really an idiom, and the meaning of the whole is not a function of the meaning of its conditional and deontic parts. Each seems to be a conclusion one would otherwise prefer to avoid.

There have been many attempts to try to solve Chisholm's problem by carefully distinguishing the times of the obligations.[11] This was fueled in part by shifts in the examples, in particular to examples where the candidate “derived” obligations were clearly things to be done after the primary obligation was either fulfilled or violated (called “forward” versions of CTDs). This made the ploy of differentiating the times and doing careful bookkeeping about just which things were obligatory at which times promising. However, Chisholm's own example is most plausibly interpreted as either a case where the obligation to go help and the perhaps-derivable obligation to tell are simultaneous (called “parallel” versions), or where telling is even something to be done before you go (called “backward” versions).[12] It is easy to imagine that the way to tell the neighbors that you will help might be to phone, and that would typically take place before you left to actually help. (For younger readers: there were no cell phones back in 1964, and phones were attached to boxes in houses by yard-length coiled cords.) Concerns to coordinate aid, or to assure those stressed that aid is coming, often favor giving advanced notice.

Alternatively, it was suggested that carefully attending to the action or agential components of the example and distinguishing those from the circumstances or propositional components would dissolve the puzzle.[13] However, the phenomena invoked in the Chisholm example appear to be too general for that. Consider the following non-agential minor variant of an example (say of possible norms for a residential neighborhood) introduced in Prakken and Sergot 1996:

(1) It ought to be the case that there are no dogs.
(2) It ought to be the case that if there are no dogs, then there are no warning signs.
(3) If there are dogs, then it ought to be the case that there are warning signs.
(4) There are dogs.

Here we seem to have the same essentially puzzling phenomena present in Chisholm's original example, yet there is no apparent reference to actions above at all; instead the reference seems to be to states of affairs only. (Notice also that there is no issue of different times either for the presence/absence of dogs and the presence/absence of signs.)

Thus, it looks like tinkering with the temporal or action aspects of the Chisholm-style examples (however much time and action are important elsewhere to deontic logic) merely postpones the inevitable. So far, this problem appears to be not easy to convincingly solve.

A formal sketch of a sample system favoring factual detachment can be easily found in chapter 10 of Chellas 1980, which is widely available. A system that favors deontic detachment over factual detachment is quickly sketched here. The main source is Goble 2003 (but cf. van Fraassen 1972).

Here, we assume a classical propositional language now extended with a dyadic construction, OB( / ), taken as primitive. A monadic OB operator is then defined in the manner mentioned above:

OBp =df OB(p/⊤).

We can define an ordering relation between propositions as follows:

pq =df ~OB(~p/pq).

This says that p is ranked as at least as high as q iff it is not obligatory that ~p on the condition that either p or q.[14]

An axiom system that is a natural dyadic correlate to SDL follows:

A1: All instances of PC tautologies (TAUT)
A2: OB(pq/r) → (OB(p/r) → OB(q/r) (OB-CK)
A3: OB(p/q) → ~OB(~p/q) (OB-CNC)
A4: OB(T/T) (OB-CN)
A5: OB(q/p) → OB(q & p/p) (OB-CO&)
A6: (pq) & qr) → pr (Trans)
R1: If ⊢ p and ⊢ pq then ⊢ q (MP)
R2: If ⊢ pq then ⊢ OB(r/p) ↔ OB(r/q) (OB-CRE)
R3: If ⊢ pq then ⊢ OB(p/r) → OB(q/r) (OB-CRM)

A1-A4 and R1-R3 are conditional analogues of formulas or rules we have seen before in discussing axiomatizations of SDL itself. A5 and A6 are needed to generate a complete system relative to an ordering semantics of the following sort (merely sketched here).

Assume we have a set of worlds and a set of ordering relations, Pi, for each world, i, where jPik is to be interpreted as saying that relative to i's normative standards, j is at least as good as k. Assume also that all of the ordering relations are non-empty: for each world i, there is a world k and a world m such that kPim. Call this structure a “preference frame.” For any preference relation in a preference frame, let F(Pi) represent the field of that relation: the set of all worlds that appear in some ordered pair constituting the relation, Pi. As usual, a model on a frame is an assignment to each propositional variable of a set of worlds (those where it will be deemed true). We then define the basic dyadic operator's truth-condition as follows:

Mi OB(q/p) iff there is a j in F(Pi) such that Mj p & q and for each k such that kPij, if Mk p, then Mk q.

That is, at i, it is obligatory that q given p iff there is some world j in the field of the i's preference relation where both p and q are true, and for every world ranked at least as high j, if p is true at that world, then so is q.

Call a preference frame standard iff all the preference relations in it are connected (and thus reflexive) and transitive relative to their fields:

For each i-relative preference relation, Pi,
(1) if j and k are in F(Pi), then either jPik or kPij (connectedness).
(2) if j, k, and m are in F(Pi), then if jPik and kPim, then jPim (transitivity).

Goble 2003 shows that the axiom system for dyadic obligation above is sound and complete for the set of standard preference frames. It is also easy to derive SDL using the above dyadic axiom system and the definition given for the monadic obligation operator. Goble's paper contains a number of other such results, for both monadic and dyadic systems, including generalizations that allow for conflicting obligations.