Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Kurt Gödel

1. Though of course Gödel disagreed with many aspects of the Hilbert program, most notably with the thought that mathematics could be formally reconstructed in a content free manner.

2. Reprinted with a facing English translation in Gödel 1986. Henceforth all references to Gödel's papers will be to those as appear in his Collected Works, Volumes I to V. In particular all page references, as well as the numbering scheme for Gödel's papers, refer to that of the Collected Works. (So for example Gödel's paper "On intuitionistic arithmetic and number theory" is referred to below as 1933e, the number of it in volume I of the Collected Works, Gödel 1986.) In relevant cases the bibliography will cite original publication data as well.

3. According to the documents, the Ministry for Domestic and Cultural Affairs recommended against granting Gödel the Dozentur, on grounds of his having a political stance they termed "doubtful." See Sigmund 2006.

4. Though according to Menger, Leibniz was an important interest of Gödel's already in the 1930s.

5. See below for a discussion of Gödel's adoption of the phenomenological world view. For the relation between phenomenology and Leibniz as Gödel saw it see van Atten and Kennedy 2003.

6. Though some credit Bolzano's "Wissenschaftslehre" (Bolzano 1992) with the first statement of the question. See the introduction by Wang to Skolem's Selected Works in (Skolem 1970).

7. For the history of this theorem see Zach 1999.

8. Skolem himself referred to the fact that set theory has countable models as the‘relativity in set theory.’

9. See von Neumann 2005. Von Neumann is referring to the meeting on Logicism, Finitism and Intuitionism which took place in Königsberg in September of 1930, at which Gödel announced his First Incompleteness Theorem during a roundtable discussion on foundations.

10. Gödel uses the word ‘recursive’ in place of primitive recursive. For a definition of the terms ‘recursive’ and ‘primitive recursive’ see Rogers 1967. The use of recursive functions apparently goes back to Grassman, see p. 147 of Wang 1957.

11. Gödel uses the notation B(x,y) for Prf(x,y).

12. Gödel uses the notation Bew(y) for Prov(y).

13. ‘Jetzt, Mengenlehre!’—and now, [on to] set theory!—Gödel is alleged to have said around that time (see p.128 of Wang 1993, as well as Dawson 1997.) Gödel's interest in set theory may have begun to develop as early as 1928 when he requested at the library the volume containing Skolem's Helsinki lecture. Dawson mentions that in 1930 Gödel requested works by Fraenkel (Einleitung in die Mengenlehre, in which Gödel will have noticed Fraenkel's skepticism about Hilbert's attempted proof of the continuum hypothesis), von Neumann, and the paper in which Hilbert had put the problem of deciding the continuum hypothesis on the agenda of twentieth century mathematics.

14. For more about this point see Gödel's correspondence with von Neumann.

15. This group would include Gödel himself, who was critical of Hilbert's introduction of the so-called ω-rule.

16. For Gödel's reaction to Cohen's result see his September 1966 letter to Church in Gödel 2003a.

17. Of course Hilbert attempted to prove the CH, not just prove its consistency with the axioms of ZF or ZFC.

18. Such as: α < β implies LαLβ

19. For a discussion of Gödel's views on the absolute consistency of the Axiom of Constructibility see Kennedy and van Atten 2004.

20. Gödel's study of Leibniz took place principally from 1943 to 1946, see below.

21. There is some difficulty in making the notion "the largeness of V" precise. This is because adding sets can either collapse cardinals or increase the continuum; so adding sets in itself may lead to self-contradictory information about the continuum. See for example Foreman 1998.

22. Gödel remarks in a footnote to this passage that the notion of provability by any means imaginable is perhaps ‘too sweeping.’ Nevertheless, this does not affect the basic distinction that Gödel wishes to make, between the formal and informal notions of provability.

23. But see Troelstra's critical remarks in his introduction to the paper in Gödel 1995, having to do with the question whether, for the intuitionist, the Dialectica interpretation represents a genuine epistemological advance over the so-called Heyting/Kolmogorov proof interpretation.

24. Gödel was to find support for this view in Husserl, who also rejected the notion that a science of concepts should be mathematical in nature, or similar to any empirical science. As Husserl remarked in Ideen, about the project of developing phenomenology, "We are at the beginning…no science can help us."

25. The question whether its truth or falsity can be verified by a person is a separate one, and in fact Gödel often expressed the thought that we have only a "partial view" of sets and their properties.

26. Gödel is very much following Husserl here. The matter is discussed in some detail in pp. 443-446 of van Atten and Kennedy 2003.

27. Gödel readily drew philosophical conclusions from the First Incompleteness Theorem. He he seems to have been slower in applying the Second Theorem.

28. Regarding the acceptability of inductive methods Gödel remarks in the Gibbs lecture, for example, that, if one is a realist about mathematical objects then inductive methods become not less but more acceptable. See p. 313 of Gödel 1995.