Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to The Problem of Evil

1. For additional critical discussion of this, see Conway (1988), p. 35, and Robert Adams (1985), pp. 225 and 240.

2. One feature of the above formulation of the argument should be noted, namely, that the predicate ‘x prevents the existence of y’ introduces an intensional context; the fact that x prevents the existence of y entails the non-existence of y. Since intensional contexts are rather puzzling from a logical point of view, one might very well prefer to avoid this. This could be done by recasting the argument so that one talks instead of preventing the existence of states of affairs of a given type. See the supplementary document An Alternative Formulation of the Argument

3. The page references for Paul Draper’s 1989 article are to the reprinting of it in Daniel Howard-Snyder (ed.), The Evidential Argument from Evil, Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1996, pp. 12-29.

4. Draper himself formulates his argument in terms of epistemic probability, which he explains as follows: “Relative to K, p is epistemically more probable than q, where K is an epistemic situation and p and q are propositions, just in case any fully rational person in K would have a higher degree of belief in p than in q.” (27) For those who hold, as I do, that the concept of logical probability is acceptable, the concept of the epistemic probability of p given q, relative to an epistemic situation K, can be defined as the logical probability of p given q and K.

5. This replacement presupposes either that one is using the notion of logical probability, or that one has not only the comparative concept of p’s being epistemically more probable than q, relative to the epistemic situation K, but also the quantitative concept of p’s having a certain epistemic probability given q, relative to K. (Compare footnote 3.)

6. In his discussion “Rowe versus Plantinga on the Argument from Evil”.

7.. Bovens, in his discussion of Rowe's argument, makes use of precisely these connections in an attempt to provide support for proposition (5).